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Jacques Maritain

Jacques Maritain (1882-1973), French philosopher and political thinker, was one of the principal exponents of Thomism in the twentieth century and an influential interpreter of the thought of St Thomas Aquinas.


Jacques Maritain was born on November 18, 1882 in Paris. The son of Paul Maritain, a prominent lawyer, and Geneviève Favre, daughter of the French statesman, Jules Favre, Jacques Maritain studied at the Lycée Henri IV (1898-99) and at the Sorbonne, where he prepared a licence in philosophy (1900-1901) and in the natural sciences (1901-1902). He was initially attracted to the philosophy of Spinoza. Largely at the suggestion of his friend, the poet (and, later, religious thinker) Charles Péguy, he attended lectures by Henri Bergson at the Collège de France (1903-1904) and was briefly influenced by Bergson's work.

In 1901, Maritain met Raïssa Oumansoff, a fellow student at the Sorbonne and the daughter of Russian Jewish immigrants. Both were struck by the spiritual aridity of French intellectual life and made a vow to commit suicide within a year should they not find some answer to the apparent meaninglessness of life. Bergson's challenges to the then-dominant positivism sufficed to lead them to give up their thoughts of suicide, and Jacques and Raïssa married in 1904. Soon thereafter, through the influence of the writer Léon Bloy, both Maritains sought baptism in the Roman Catholic Church (1906).

Maritain received his agrégation in philosophy in 1905 and, late in 1906, Jacques and Raïssa left for Heidelberg, where Jacques continued his studies in the natural sciences. They returned to France in the summer of 1908, and it was at this time that the Maritains explicitly abandoned bergsonisme and Jacques began an intensive study of the writings of Thomas Aquinas.

In 1912, Maritain became professor of philosophy at the Lycée Stanislaus, though he undertook to give lectures at the Institut Catholique de Paris. He was named Assistant Professor at the Institut Catholique (attached to the Chair of the History of Modern Philosophy) in 1914. (He became full Professor in 1921 and, in 1928, was appointed to the Chair of Logic and Cosmology, which he held until 1939.)

In his early philosophical work (e.g., "La science moderne et la raison," 1910, and La philosophie bergsonienne, 1913), Maritain sought to defend Thomistic philosophy from its Bergsonian and secular opponents. Following brief service in the first world war, Maritain returned to teaching and research. The focus of his philosophical work continued to be the defense of Catholicism and Catholic thought (e.g., Antimoderne [1922], Trois réformateurs — Luther, Descartes, Rousseau [1925], and Clairvoyance de Rome par les auteurs du ‘Pourquoi Rome a parlé’ (J. Maritain et D. Lallement) [1929]), but Maritain also prepared some introductory philosophical texts (e.g., Éléments de philosophie [2 volumes, 1921-23]) and his interests expanded to include aesthetics (e.g., Art et scholastique, 1921; 2nd ed. 1927).

By the late 1920s, Maritain's attention began to turn to social issues. Although he had some contact with the Catholic social action movement, Action Française, he abandoned it in 1926 when it was condemned by the Catholic Church for its nationalistic and anti-democratic tendencies. Still, encouraged through his friendships with the Russian philosopher Nicholas Berdiaev (beginning in 1924) and Emmanuel Mounier (from 1928), Maritain began to develop the principles of a liberal Christian humanism and defense of natural rights.

Maritain's philosophical work during this time was eclectic, with the publication of books on Thomas Aquinas (1930), on religion and culture (1930), on Christian philosophy (1933), on Descartes (1932), on the philosophy of science and epistemology (Distinguer pour unir ou les degrés du savoir, 1932; 8th ed., 1963) and, perhaps most importantly, on political philosophy. Beginning in 1936, he produced a number of texts, including Humanisme intégral (1936), De la justice politique (1940), Les droits de l'homme et la loi naturelle (1942), Christianisme et démocratie (1943), Principes d'une politique humaniste (1944), La personne et le bien commun (1947), Man and the State (written in 1949, but published in 1951), and the posthumously published La loi naturelle ou loi non-écrite (lectures delivered in August 1950).

Maritain's ideas were especially influential in Latin America and, largely as a result of the ‘liberal’ character of his political philosophy, he increasingly came under attack from both the left and the right, in France and abroad. Lectures in Latin America in 1936 led to him being named as a corresponding member of the Brazilian Academy of Letters, but also to being the object of a campaign of vilification.

By the early 1930s Maritain was an established figure in Catholic thought. He was already a frequent visitor to North America and, since 1932, had come annually to the Institute of Mediaeval Studies in Toronto (Canada) to give courses of lectures. With the outbreak of war at the end of 1939, Maritain decided not to return to France. Following his lectures in Toronto at the beginning of 1940, he moved to the United States, teaching at Princeton University (1941-42) and Columbia (1941-44).

Maritain remained in the United States during the war, where he was active in the war effort (recording broadcasts destined for occupied France and contributing to the Voice of America). He also continued to lecture and publish on a wide range of subjects — not only in political philosophy, but in aesthetics (e.g., Art and Poetry, 1943), philosophy of education, and metaphysics (De Bergson à St Thomas d'Aquin, 1944). Following the liberation of France in the summer of 1944, he was named French ambassador to the Vatican, serving until 1948, but was also actively involved in drafting the United Nations Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948).

In the spring of 1948, Maritain returned to Princeton as Professor Emeritus, though he also lectured at a number of American universities (particularly at the University of Notre Dame and the University of Chicago), and frequently returned to France to give short courses in philosophy — notably at ‘L'Eau vive,’ in the town of Soisy, near Paris. During this time, in addition to his work in political philosophy (cf. above, as well as Le philosophe dans la cité, 1960), Maritain published on aesthetics (Creative Intuition in Art and Poetry, 1953), religion (Approches de Dieu, 1953), moral philosophy (Neuf leçons sur les notions premières de la philosophie morale, 1951; La philosophie morale, 1960), and the philosophy of history (On the Philosophy of History, 1957).

In 1960, Maritain and his wife returned to France. Following Raïssa's death later that year, Maritain moved to Toulouse, where he decided to live with a religious order, the Little Brothers of Jesus. During this time he wrote a number of books, the best-known of which was Le paysan de la Garonne (a work sharply critical of post-Vatican Council reforms), published in 1967. In 1970, he petitioned to join the order, and died in Toulouse on April 28, 1973. He is buried alongside Raïssa in Kolbsheim (Alsace) France.

General Background

Maritain saw himself as working in continuity with the thought of Thomas Aquinas, and his writings frequently contain quotations from and references to Thomas' texts. While his turn to Catholicism and his intellectual itinerary were largely due to personal reasons and to the influence of friends, his defense of Catholic thought and Thomistic philosophy were undoubtedly affected by events involving his adopted church.

One such event was the attack on (principally Catholic) religious organisations by secular and humanist forces within the French state, culminating in a number of laws affecting the taxation and ownership of church property and the place of religion in public affairs. At about the same time, there were tensions within Catholicism — particularly in France — in reaction to theological modernism. The writings of George Tyrell in England and Ernest Renan and Alfred Loisy in France were condemned for such ‘errors’ as claiming that conscience is the primary source of religious truth and that all knowledge — including dogma — has a historical and contingent character, and challenging the authoritative character of magisterial pronouncements. French philosophy itself was seen as incompatible with Catholic theology. The dominant views were the spiritualism or intuitionism of Bergson (which held that the emphasis in metaphysics on ‘being’ should be replaced by one on durée or pure change), the idealism of Léon Brunschvicg, the spiritualism of André Lalande, and the materialism of Edmond Goblot — and each challenged claims that were seen as essential to Catholicism. The Catholic Church in France was, not surprisingly, in some turmoil, and a defense of religious orthodoxy was called for from several quarters.

Maritain's early writings, then, sought to address some of the concerns arising out of these events. Having been attracted initially to Spinoza's idealism and, later, to Bergson's vitalist intuitionism, he was able to come to the defense of Catholic thought with a knowledge of its critics that surpassed many of his contemporaries. Maritain rejected ‘modernity’ — Cartesian and post-Cartesian thought — for what he saw as its emphasis on epistemology over metaphysics, and sought to return to the ‘pre-modern’ views of Aquinas. Nevertheless, he saw that philosophy had to do more than merely repeat Thomas' views, and he took it upon himself to develop some aspects of Thomistic philosophy to address the problems of the contemporary world. Thus, though the most profound inspiration of many of Maritain's ideas was the work of St Thomas Aquinas, his epistemology and aesthetics show the influence of Christian mysticism, particularly that of St John of the Cross, and his social and political philosophy clearly reflects many of the ideals of European liberalism.

Principal Contributions


Maritain's primary work in epistemology is Distinguer pour unir: ou, les degrès du savoir [Distinguish to Unite: or, The Degrees of Knowledge] (1932), though one finds a number of important essays on the topic in Raison et raisons, essais détachés [The Range of Reason] (1948) and in Quatre essais sur l'esprit (1939). He largely follows the realist view of St Thomas Aquinas — though he was also influenced by St John of the Cross and St Augustine, and the structure of Les degrès du savoir appears to reflect the procedure traced in the Itinerarium mentis in Deum [The Journey of the Mind to God] of St Bonaventure.

Against ‘modern philosophy’, Maritain insisted on the priority of metaphysics over epistemology — in fact, he held that "the critique of knowledge is part of metaphysics" [The Range of Reason, p. 25] — and also maintained that the structure and method of the various sciences were determined by the nature of the object to be known.

Maritain called his view critical realism, and argued particularly against the then-dominant rationalist and empiricist accounts of knowledge. He maintained that, despite the differences among them, Kantianism, idealism, pragmatism, and positivism all reflect the influence of nominalism — that universal notions are creations of the human mind and have no foundation in reality. Maritain's critical realism holds that what the mind knows is identical with what exists. To know a thing is for its ‘essence’ to exist immaterially in the mind. This is not to say that the mind mirrors or copies that which it knows, but that, in virtue of the properties apprehended, it ‘becomes’ the things it knows. Maritain held that our knowledge of reality was through the ‘concept’ — the esse intentionale — which was immaterial and universal, though the concept itself was something known only by reflection. Thus, when it comes to knowledge of sensible objects, for example, the mind has both a passive role (receiving sense impressions) and an active one (constructing knowledge from these impressions).

Maritain's epistemology sought to explain not just the nature of knowledge found in science and philosophy, but religious faith and mysticism, and one of his aims was to show the different ‘kinds’ of knowledge and their relations to one another. He argued that there were different ‘orders’ of knowledge and, within them, different ‘degrees’ determined by the nature of the object to be known and the ‘degree of abstraction’ involved.

First, in the order of rational knowledge, one can speak of the knowledge of sensible nature (i.e., of the objects of experimental science), which is different from the knowledge of mathematics or of ‘physico-mathematical’ objects (which is limited because its objects do not have a direct relation to the actual), which is, in turn, distinct from the knowledge of trans-sensible or metaphysical nature.

These ‘degrees of knowledge’ are not, however, independent of one another, and they have in common the requirement that to know something is to know why it is — "the mind is not satisfied when it merely attains a thing […], but only when it grasps that upon which that datum is founded in being and intelligibility" (Degrees of Knowledge, p. 23). For example, natural science, which is based on sense perception, aims at formulating laws which reflect certain features of the objects perceived. The scientist, then, is primarily concerned with looking for regularities in nature and in pursuing the empiriological method of engaging in observation, articulating a hypothesis, and then engaging in further testing; this Maritain calls perinoetical knowledge.

But for natural science to achieve the status of a science, it must presuppose natural philosophy — that is, our capacity to know things apart from their particular individuating characteristics (though not apart from the existence of matter). Natural philosophy ‘gets behind’ phenomena in order to discover essential connections and causes. Thus, from that which is presented in sense perception, the mind constructs an object which is universal. (This is possible because, Maritain maintains, there are essences or natures of things.) This process of ‘thinking through’ to the nature of the thing is called by Maritain dianoetical knowledge. While natural science and natural philosophy both focus on the physical, the natural philosopher — unlike the scientist — is concerned with the essence of the object and its definition (or, at the very least, an account of its various properties). This, then, is knowledge at the level of the first ‘degree of abstraction.’

Physico-mathematical objects (e.g., quantity, number, and extension) stand at a second level of abstraction. While they cannot exist without the existence of material things, once known, they can be conceived of without any reference to such objects. Metaphysical or speculative knowledge deals with objects existing at a third level of abstraction (i.e., independently of matter), such as substance, quality, goodness, and the divine. Because of the nature of the objects of metaphysics, this latter kind of knowledge does not involve logical inference as much as reasoning by analogy or what Maritain calls ananoetic knowledge. Such knowledge (e.g., of the divine) is not through any direct apprehension, but indirectly, through creatures.

There is a hierarchy among these ‘degrees of knowledge.’ Those objects which are highest in intelligibility, immateriality, and potential to be known are the objects of the highest degree of knowledge. Maritain writes, "[t]he metaphysician considers an object of knowing of a specifically higher nature and intelligibility, and from it he acquires a proper knowledge, a scientific knowledge, by means that absolutely transcend those of the physicist or the mathematician" (Degrees of Knowledge, p. 37). Nevertheless, one should not conclude that there are different ‘knowledges.’

Maritain points out that philosophical demonstration is different from natural scientific or mathematical demonstrations: "philosophy is concerned with an objectively distinct field of knowledge and constitutes a really autonomous discipline, possessing its own adequate means of explaining this field of knowledge" (Range of Reason, p. 5). Specifically, Maritain writes, natural philosophy penetrates to the nature of its object. Metaphysics — which is also a kind of philosophic knowing — is concerned with purely intelligible being. Science, however, is at best ‘empiriological’ — it does not lead us to being itself, but only to the observable and measurable. Thus, to employ a method of scientific demonstration to establish, or to criticize, claims about the object of metaphysical knowledge is, to use Ryle's classic term, a category mistake. And it is precisely because he holds that empiricist and Enlightenment epistemology do this that Maritain takes issue with them.

Just as there is an order of rational knowledge, with its ‘degrees,’ there are degrees of suprarational knowledge — of a higher wisdom — that is beyond ‘natural knowledge.’ These are, on the one hand, ‘the science of revealed mysteries’ or ‘theological wisdom’ and, on the other, ‘mystical theology.’ Here, Maritain's debt to Augustine and John of the Cross is particularly evident. According to Maritain, in theological wisdom, the divine is known by drawing not just on reason but on faith. (This is distinct from metaphysical knowledge which, so to speak, approaches the divine from the ‘outside.’) Mystical knowledge stands one level higher still — where there is no mediation by concepts — and "consists in knowing […] Deity as such — according to a mode that is suprahuman and supernatural" (The Degrees of Knowledge, p. 253). This is a knowledge by connaturality, but also a knowledge that can be pursued through the practical discipline of ‘mystical contemplation.’ In this way, human beings acquire a kind of knowledge that makes them more loving and more spiritual.

A number of questions have been raised concerning Maritain's epistemology, particularly concerning his characterization of philosophical knowledge. For example, while Maritain suggests that there is a difference in method between the sciences and philosophy, it is not clear what exactly that difference is. For example, Maritain would follow Aquinas in holding that metaphysics uses demonstratio quia — demonstration from effects. But it would seem that science also sometimes uses such a method of demonstration. Indeed, it is not clear what it is in the method (as distinct from the content of the premises) that differentiates a metaphysical proof (e.g., of God's existence) from a scientific argument establishing the existence of a cause of a natural object.

Second, Maritain holds that scientific knowledge is distinguished from philosophical knowledge in terms of their different methods and different objects. But if scientific knowledge and philosophical knowledge are, as it were, incommensurable, it is not clear how philosophy can judge, or be corrective of, the sciences.

Finally, it would seem that the model of demonstration that Maritain employs is foundationalist and, thus, has to answer to those criticisms that modern anti-foundationalism draws attention to — e.g., that a foundationalist theory sets a standard for knowledge that is not only without justification, but is a standard that it cannot itself satisfy. Some recent defences of Thomistic epistemology (e.g., Henry Veatch in Thomistic Papers, Volume IV, 1990) suggest ways in which such concerns might be addressed.

Natural Theology and Philosophy of Religion

Like St Thomas Aquinas, Maritain held that there was no conflict between faith and true reason, that religious belief was open to rational discussion, and that the existence of God and certain fundamental religious beliefs could be philosophically demonstrated. Religious belief, then, was not an attitude or a matter of private opinion — an option that could be embraced or not according to one's private preferences; it was a matter of ‘truth’. For Maritain, one must choose between "the true God or radical irrationality" (Introduction to Philosophy, p. 259).

Maritain held that philosophy was an ancilla theologiae, and that philosophy, under the rubric of metaphysical knowledge, allows for the demonstration of a number of basic religious beliefs. And, like Aquinas, Maritain accepted the classical foundationalist position that these beliefs could be established by rational deduction from self-evident principles and constituted genuine knowledge. Specifically, he held that, by the use of natural reason, one can come to know certain truths about God, and that the ‘five ways’ of Thomas Aquinas provided sure knowledge of God's existence. But Maritain also argued that there could be other ‘proofs’ of the existence of the divine and, in Approches de Dieu, he developed what he called a "sixth way."

There is, Maritain writes, an intuition that is awakened in persons when they are engaged in thought — that is, that it seems impossible that they, as thinking beings, should at some time have not been. As a thinking being, one seems to be free from the vicissitudes of time and space; there is no coming to be or ceasing to be — I cannot think what it is not to be. Nevertheless, we all know very well that we were born — we came into existence. We are confronted, then, with a contradiction — not a logical contradiction, but a lived contradiction. The only solution to this is that one has always existed, but not through oneself, but within "a Being of transcendent personality" and from whom "the self which is thinking now proceeded into temporal existence" (Approches de Dieu, in Oeuvres complètes, p. 64). This being "must contain all things in itself in an eminent mode and be itself — in an absolutely transcendent way — being, thought and personality. This implies that the first existence is the infinite plenitude of being, separate by essence from all diversity of existents." (p. 66).

Maritain also acknowledges the possibility of a natural, pre-philosophical, but still rational knowledge of God (see Approches de Dieu, pp. 13-22). This is, Maritain claims, a ‘knowledge’ that is necessary to — and, in fact leads to — a philosophical demonstration of God's existence. (In this way, then, one can know that some religious beliefs are true, even without being able to demonstrate them.) Maritain's argument, which resembles the Thomistic argument from contingent being, is that, in one's intuition of being, one is aware, first, of a reality separate from oneself, second, of oneself as finite and limited, and, third, of the necessity that there is something "completely free from nothingness and death" (Approches de Dieu, p. 15). This is concurrent with a "spontaneous reasoning" that follows the same course to the conclusion that there is "another Whole […] another Being, transcendent and self-sufficient and unknown in itself and activating all beings […] that is, self-subsisting Being, Being existing through itself" (Approches de Dieu, p. 16). This ‘knowledge’ of God, Maritain admits, is not demonstrative but is, nevertheless, "rich in certitude" (Approches de Dieu, p. 19) and is both presupposed by, and is the underlying force for, philosophical demonstrations of God's existence.

The difference between the pre-philosophical and the philosophical ‘knowledge’ of God is that the latter is one which is based on a "scientific demonstration" (Approches de Dieu, p. 19) — on empirical facts — and involving analogy, from which we have terms that can be properly predicated of the divine. On the other hand, ‘pre-philosophical’ knowledge is "intuition" — an approach to knowledge, though not a "way," (Approches de Dieu, p. 20) a proof or a demonstration. This knowledge is based on a natural reasoning which cannot be expressed in words. Yet, it is important also to realize that while Maritain allows that certain ‘truths’ "are grasped by the common sense before being the object of philosophical concern" (Approches de Dieu, p. 24), philosophical proofs of the existence of God "are not only established and justified philosophically at the level of philosophy itself, but are already valid and efficacious at the level of this incohative and spontaneous philosophy," (Approches de Dieu, p. 24) and that what one arrives at by means of such an ‘approach’ is (as it is in philosophical demonstrations) knowledge of the truth of a proposition.

It has been argued, however, that there are some difficulties with Maritain's position here. For example, even if it is true that people may ‘naturally’ affirm the proposition that there is a God, it is not obvious how they can claim that they know it. In other words, even if the proposition is true, it is not clear how we can say that we know or believe it to be true. What Maritain seems to give us here is an explanation of how one arrives at a certain proposition and of one's certainty, but nothing more. But, since the state of certainty of an individual is not the same as the assertion that that person knows something to be true, it is not clear that the pre-philosophical approach provides one with an adequate basis to say that a religious belief is true, only that one is convinced of it. And, one might argue, parallel conclusions can be drawn if one examines the other ways that Maritain suggests will lead to a putative ‘knowledge’ of God.

(Interestingly, Maritain was a critic of a number of arguments proposed in defence of religious belief. He argued that such defenses fail because they do not recognise that there are different types of knowledge, that these different types are hierarchically arranged, and that the methods they employ are, by definition, unsuited to demonstrate certain things. Thus, Maritain holds that while ‘reason,’ as ‘intelligence moving in a progressive way towards its term, the real’, can attain knowledge of God by means of demonstration, if we take ‘reason’ to be a purely discursive method — one which Maritain identifies with the "physical-mathematical sciences" and which he also calls "the ‘reason’ of rationalism" (Antimoderne, p. 64) — it can know or say nothing at all about God. Because reason must be ordered to its object, reason (in this second sense) can neither demonstrate nor even encounter revealed truths.)

In addition to the possibility of the demonstration of the existence of God and of the coherence of the divine attributes, Maritain allows that there are a number of other ways in which one might come to ‘know’ religious beliefs to be true. Besides knowing God ‘naturally,’ there is a ‘non-conscious knowledge of God’ in the first act of human freedom (see Range of Reason, pp. 69-71), ‘connatural knowledge’ (which is typical of mystical experience), ‘abstract intuition’ (by which one knows ‘primary principles’ such as the laws of identity and of non-contradiction and the principle of causality), the "ways of the practical intellect" (Approches de Dieu, ch. IV) (i.e., through moral or aesthetic experience — though these do not provide a strict demonstration) and, of course, divine revelation.

Nevertheless, Maritain also held that it was reasonable to believe even in the absence of such arguments or evidence. (To say that one can attain, by reason, some knowledge of God is not to say that everyone can do this.) Moreover, Maritain argues that even if one holds that a belief is capable of a rational demonstration, it does not follow that one must be able to provide it. For a religious belief to be ‘reasonable,’ it must not contradict the results of ‘true reason’ but, for one's knowledge of ‘revealed truths’ to be reasonable, Maritain (like Aquinas) would never claim that one must be able to produce a philosophical demonstration of them. In fact, Maritain allows that theology can "reject as false any philosophic affirmation which contradicts a theological truth" (Introduction to Philosophy, p. 126).

Maritain writes that there can also be knowledge of the divine attributes. As with all natural knowledge of the divine, this is basically analogical, and it follows a via negativa. Thus, he insists that we can say that we know some things about God. We can know that God is (quia est), though not what God is in himself (quid est) (Degrees of Knowledge, Appendix III, p. 423). In fact, against Sertillanges and Etienne Gilson, Maritain maintains that we can have affirmative knowledge about God — know in a more or less imperfect but, nevertheless, true way what God is. Besides, Maritain holds, knowledge through negation presupposes positive knowledge. Mary Daly notes, however, that Maritain is not clear about the extent to which our affirmative knowledge of God is arrived at by means of philosophical argument (Daly, p. 53). Nevertheless, Maritain acknowledges that the knowledge of God that philosophy provides us with is incomplete and imperfect. The analogical knowledge that we have of God falls short of a complete description of what God is.

It is not clear, however, that Maritain avoids many of the concerns expressed by critics of ‘analogical knowledge.’ For example, if the term ‘cause’ is used analogously when applied to God, then when one utters the proposition ‘God is the cause of the universe’ after examining Aquinas's ‘second way,’ it would seem that one has to be using this term in exactly the same sense as it has been used throughout the preceding argument. If it is not being used in exactly the same sense, then how can one claim that Aquinas has demonstrated this conclusion? The problem is not whether analogical predication is possible but, first, whether one can understand the analogical predicate and, second, whether one can employ such a predicate in a demonstration without committing the fallacy of equivocation.

Given Maritain's account of faith and of suprarational knowledge, it would seem that he would see religious beliefs as ‘trusts’ and, hence, as having more than a purely cognitive character. He would, no doubt, follow Aquinas who spoke of religion as a ‘disposition.’ A disposition or habitus is, of course, not merely the product of action, but itself is ordered to action. Thus, to say that religious beliefs are propositional in form is not to say that their function is only descriptive. Nevertheless, Maritain's account of religious belief and its relation to argument and proof is not complete. Moreover, given that he does employ ‘foundationalism’ as a standard of sufficient evidence for claiming that some propositions expressing religious belief are true, it is not clear that it can directly address the challenges of recent critics — particularly those raised by some ‘postmodern’ philosophers concerning the epistemology underlying his view.

Moral and Political Philosophy and Philosophy of Law

Maritain's moral and political philosophy lies within what may be called the Aristotelian-Thomistic natural law tradition. Maritain held, however, that Aristotelian ethics, by itself, was inadequate because it lacked knowledge of humanity's ultimate end. The Thomistic view — that there is a law in human nature that is derivative of (though knowable separately from) a divine or eternal law and that humanity's ‘end’ goes beyond anything attainable in this life — was, Maritain thought, a significant advance on what Aristotle had provided.

Following Aquinas, Maritain maintained that there is a natural law that is ‘unwritten’ but immanent in nature. Specifically, given that nature has a teleological character, one can know what a thing ‘should’ do or how it ‘should’ be used by examining its ‘end’ and the ‘normality of its functioning.’ Maritain therefore defines ‘natural law’ as "an order or a disposition that the human reason may discover and according to which the human will must act to accord itself with the necessary ends of the human being" (La loi naturelle, p. 21; see Man and the State, p. 86). This law "prescribes our most fundamental duties" (Man and the State, p. 95) and is coextensive with morality.

There is, Maritain holds, a single natural law governing all beings with a human nature. The first principles of this law are known connaturally, not rationally or through concepts — by an activity that Maritain, following Aquinas, called ‘synderesis.’ Thus, ‘natural ‘law’ is ‘natural’ because it not only reflects human nature, but is known naturally. Maritain acknowledges, however, that knowledge of the natural law varies throughout humanity and according to individuals’ capacities and abilities, and he speaks of growth in an individual's or a collectivity's moral awareness. This allows him to reply to the challenge that there cannot be any universal, natural law because no such law is known or respected universally. Again, though this law is progressively known, it is never known completely, and so the natural law is never exhausted in any particular articulation of it. This recognition of the historical element in human consciousness did not, however, prevent Maritain from holding that this law is objective and binding. (Critics have argued, however, that to speak of ‘connatural knowledge’ is obscure; it is quite unlike what we ordinarily call ‘knowledge’ and is, therefore, inadequate as a basis for knowledge of law.)

A key notion in Maritain's moral philosophy is that of human freedom. He says that the ‘end’ of humanity is to be free but, by ‘freedom,’ he does not mean license or pure rational autonomy, but the realisation of the human person in accord with his or her nature — specifically, the achievement of moral and spiritual perfection. Maritain's moral philosophy, then, cannot be considered independently of his analysis of human nature. Maritain distinguishes between the human being as an individual and as a person. Human beings are ‘individuals’ who are related to a common, social order of which they are parts. But they are also persons. The person is a ‘whole’, is an object of dignity, "must be treated as an end" (Les droits de l'homme, p. 84) and has a transcendent destiny. In both the material and the spiritual order, however, human beings participate in a ‘common good.’ Thus, one is an individual in virtue of being a material being; one is a person so far as one is capable of intellectual activity and freedom. Still, while distinct, both elements are equally necessary to being a human being. It is in virtue of their individuality that human beings have obligations to the social order, but it is in virtue of their personality that they cannot be subordinated to that order. Maritain's emphasis on the value of the human person has been described as a form of personalism, which he saw as a via media between individualism and socialism.

Maritain's political philosophy and his philosophy of law are clearly related to his moral philosophy. The position that he defended was described by him in one of his earliest political works as ‘integral Christian Humanism’ — ‘integral’, because it considers the human Being, an entity that has both material and spiritual dimensions, as a unified whole and because it sees human beings in society as participants in a common good. The object of Maritain's political philosophy was to outline the conditions necessary to making the individual more fully human in all respects. His integral humanism, then, seeks to bring the different dimensions of the human person together, without ignoring or diminishing the value of either. While one's private good as an individual is subordinate to the (temporal) common good of the community, as a person with a supernatural end, one's ‘spiritual good’ is superior to society — and this is something that all political communities should recognize.

For Maritain, the best political order is one which recognizes the sovereignty of God. He rejects, therefore, not only fascism and communism, but all secular humanisms. He objects that such views — particularly fascism and communism — are not only secular religions, but dehumanizing and, while he was a defender of American-style democracy, he is clearly not interested in combining his attachment to Christianity with capitalism. A theocentric humanism, Maritain would argue, has its philosophical foundation in the recognition of the nature of the human person as a spiritual and material being — a being that has a relation to God — and morality and social and political institutions must therefore reflect this.

Maritain envisages a political society under the rule of law — and he distinguishes four types of law: the eternal, the natural, the ‘common law of civilisation’ (droit des gens or jus gentium), and the positive (droit positif).

The natural law is "universal and invariable" and deals with "the rights and duties which follow [necessarily] from the first principle" (see Man and the State, pp. 97-98) or precept of law — that good is to be done and evil avoided. Nevertheless, while the natural law is "self-evident" (see Man and the State, p. 90) and consistent with and confirmed by experience — something which many critics have challenged — Maritain holds that it is not founded on human nature. It is rooted in divine reason and in a transcendent order (i.e., in the eternal law), and is ‘written into’ human nature by God. At times, Maritain appears to hold that natural law acquires its obligatory character only because of its relation to the eternal law; he writes that "natural law is law only because it is participation in Eternal Law" (see Man and the State, p. 96). (Some have concluded, then, that such a theory must be ultimately theological.)

The droit des gens or ‘common law of civilisation’ is an extension of the natural law to the circumstances of life in society, and thus it is concerned with human beings as social beings (e.g., as citizens or as members of families). The ‘positive law’ is the system of rules and regulations involved in assuring general order within a particular society. It varies according to the stage of social or economic development within that community and according to the specific activities of individuals within it. Neither the positive law nor the droit des gens is, however, deducible from the natural law alone. Neither is known connaturally and, therefore, is not part of the natural law. Nevertheless, it is in virtue of their relation to natural law that they "have the force of law and impose themselves on conscience" (Les droits de l'homme, pp. 90-91). When a positive law acts against the natural law, it is, strictly speaking, not a law. Thus, Maritain clearly rejects legal positivism.

The term ‘natural law’ and its relations both to ‘eternal law’ and to positive law have, however, been the focus of much controversy. Maritain's account of natural law both presupposes a metaphysical view of the nature of human beings and a realistic epistemology, and has a number of tensions or inconsistencies internal to it. Some of the principal criticisms of this account are i) that it is inconsistent because it sets forth a naturalistic theory of what is good and bad and yet claims that only a supernatural sanction will serve to explain moral obligation, ii) that connatural knowledge is not only inadequate for what we normally count as knowledge, but it is, in fact, also incapable of establishing that something is a natural moral law, iii) that the first principle of moral law is vacuous, and iv) that Maritain glosses over the fact/value distinction.

Maritain held that natural law theory entailed an account of human rights. Since the natural end of each person is to achieve moral and spiritual perfection, it is necessary to have the means to do so, i.e., to have rights which, since they serve to realise his or her nature, are called ‘natural’. This respects the Aristotelian-Thomistic principle of justice, that we should distribute to each ‘what is truly his or hers’. Maritain replies to the criticism that there are no such rights, since they are not universally recognised, by reminding his readers that, just as the natural law comes to be recognised gradually and over time, so also is there a gradual recognition of rights. Indeed, Maritain held that certain basic natural rights can be recognised by all, without there having to be agreement on their foundation and, as an illustration of this, he pointed to the general agreement on those rights found in the 1948 United Nations Declaration of Human Rights.

Maritain held that natural rights are fundamental and inalienable, and antecedent in nature, and superior, to society. Still, they should not be understood as ‘antecedent’ in a temporal sense and do not form the basis of the state or of the civil law. Rights are grounded in the natural law, and specifically in relation to the common good. It is this good, and not individual rights, that is the basis of the state, and it is because of this that Maritain held that there can be a hierarchical ordering of these rights (Man and the State, p. 106-107).

One consequence of his natural law and natural rights theory is that Maritain favoured a democratic and liberal view of the state, and argued for a political society that is both personalist, pluralist, and Christianly-inspired. He held that the authority to rule derives from the people — for people have a natural right to govern themselves. Still, this is consistent with a commitment to Christianity, Maritain thought, because the ideals of democracy are themselves inspired by a belief in God's rule, and that the primary source of all authority is God (Man and the State, p, 127).

Maritain also favoured a number of liberal ideals, and the list of rights that he recognises extends significantly beyond that found in many liberal theories, and includes the rights of workers as well as those of the human and the civic person.

Furthermore, the ideal of freedom or liberty to be found in the state is close to that which is now generally called ‘positive freedom’ — i.e., one that reflects a view of the person as sharing in a common good. As a polity that attempts to provide the conditions for the realisation of the human person as an individual who is, thereby, a member of a temporal community, it recognises that the use of goods by individuals must serve the good of all (Integral Humanism, p. 184), and that individuals can be required to serve the community. Moreover, in such a state political leaders would be more than just spokespersons for the people (Man and the State, p. 140), and Maritain recognises that they can represent the ‘hidden will’ of the people. Their aim — and the aim of the state as a whole — is, however, always the common good. Since minorities may themselves reflect this ‘hidden will,’ Maritain also recognised the important role to be played by dissenting minorities.

(Maritain does not discuss in any detail how his model ‘Christian’ polity might be realised, but suggests that it is the only one that takes account of each person's spiritual worth and that recognises the importance of providing the means to foster one's growth as a person. It recognises differences of religious conscience and is, in this way, fundamentally pluralistic.)

In such an ideal polity, Maritain imagines that a leadership role would be played by a multiplicity of ‘civic fraternities,’ founded on freedom, inspired by the virtues of Christianity, reflecting a moral and spiritual discipline, and which are fundamentally democratic. While such groups would not necessarily exercise political power, the society as a whole would reflect Christian values — not just because these values are part of a privileged religion or faith (a matter that Maritain would be wary of), but because these are necessary to the temporal community. In such a polity one would, of course, find a church and a state, though Maritain would see them as cooperative entities, with the state occupying itself with those matters that, while focusing on temporal concerns, addressed the needs of the whole of the human person, and with the church focussing on spiritual matters.

It is, perhaps, evident that such a polity could not survive within a single nation state that existed among a plurality of states with different ideals, and so Maritain supported the ideal of a world federation of political societies. While the realisation of such an ideal was something that lay in a distant future, Maritain nevertheless thought that such a federation was possible, providing that the individual states retained a fair degree of autonomy and that persons could be found from each state who would voluntarily distance themselves from the particular interests of their home country.

General Assessment

At the time of his death, Maritain was arguably the best known Catholic philosopher in the world. The breadth of his philosophical work, his influence in the social philosophy of the Catholic Church, and his ardent defenses of human rights made him one of the central figures of his times.

Maritain's philosophical work has been translated into some twenty languages. As is evident from the preceding remarks, it covers a wide range of areas — though much of it was written for a general, rather than a professional academic, audience. Still, some of Maritain's writings are polemical and, because much of his concern (especially in the history of philosophy) was to address very specific philosophical and theological issues of his time, they often have a rather dated character.

Maritain's most enduring legacy is undoubtedly his moral and political philosophy, and the influence of his work on human rights can be seen, not only in the United Nations Declaration of 1948 but, it has been claimed, in a number of national declarations, such as the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms and the preamble to the Constitution of the Fourth French Republic (1946) — this last was likely a reflection of Maritain's lengthy correspondence with the French war hero and, later, President, General Charles DeGaulle. Maritain's Christian humanism and personalism have also had a significant influence in the social encyclicals of Pope Paul VI and in the thought of Pope John Paul II. Interestingly, since the end of the Cold War, there has been a revival of Maritain's political ideas in Central and Eastern Europe.

Two other areas in which Maritain's thought has been influential are his aesthetics and his philosophy of education. Although no longer as strong as they once were, they were particularly significant in Latin America and French-speaking Africa from the 1930s until recent years. Maritain's work in epistemology, though clearly essential to his political and religious thought and to his aesthetics, has not, however, had the reception Maritain would have held it deserved.

It is, in short, not easy to place Maritain's work within the history of philosophy in the 20th century. Clearly, his influence was strongest in those countries where Thomistic philosophy had pride of place. While his political philosophy led him, at least in his time, to be considered a liberal and even a social democrat, he eschewed socialism and, in Le paysan de la Garonne, was an early critic of many of the religious reforms that followed the Second Vatican Council. One can say, then, that he would be considered by present-day liberals as too conservative, and by many conservatives as too liberal. Again, though generally considered to be a Thomist, the extent to which he was is a matter of some debate. Indeed, according to Etienne Gilson, Maritain's ‘Thomism’ was really an epistemology and, hence, not a real Thomism at all. There is, not surprisingly, no generally shared view of the precise character of Maritain's philosophy.

Maritain's work nevertheless remains influential. Since 1958 there has been a Jacques Maritain Center at the University of Notre Dame in the United States, there are journals devoted to his work, such as Études maritainiennes / Maritain Studies, Notes et documents, and the Cahiers Jacques et Raïssa Maritain, and there are currently some twenty national associations which meet regularly, in addition to the Institut International Jacques Maritain. The continuity of interest in his thought in the English-speaking world has recently led the University of Notre Dame Press to undertake the publication of a Collected Works of the English-language editions of Maritain's writings.

Maritain's Principal Works

A French-language edition of the works of Maritain is available under the title Oeuvres complètes de Jacques et Raïssa Maritain, 15 vols., Fribourg (Switzerland): Éditions universitaires, 1982-. The publication of a 20 volume set, in English, of The Collected Works of Jacques Maritain (under the general editorship of Ralph McInerny) is currently underway under auspices of the University of Notre Dame Press.

Maritain's principal works are listed below in chronological order: (Except where indicated otherwise, place of publication is Paris. English-language editions are noted as well.)


The most comprehensive list of studies of Maritain's work is found in Jean-Louis Allard and Pierre Germain, Répertoire bibliographique sur la vie et l'oeuvre de Jacques et Raïssa Maritain. Ottawa, 1994, 232 p.

Major Sources


Additional studies of Maritain's work are available in such journals as Études maritainiennes-Maritain Studies, Cahiers Jacques et Raïssa Maritain, and Notes et documents: pour une recherche personnaliste.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | divine, concepts of the | liberalism | religion: philosophy of

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William Sweet

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