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Logical Form

Some inferences are impeccable. Consider:
(1) John danced if Mary sang, and Mary sang; so John danced.
(2) Every politician is deceitful, and every senator is a politician; so every senator is deceitful.
(3) The tallest man is in the garden; so someone is in the garden.
Such reasoning cannot lead from true premises to false conclusions. The premises may be false. But a thinker takes no epistemic risk by endorsing the conditional claim: if the premises are true, then the conclusion is true. Given the premises, the conclusion follows immediately--without any further assumptions that might turn out to be false. By contrast, it would be very risky to infer that John danced, given only the assumption that Mary sang. More interesting examples include:
(4) John danced if Mary sang, and John danced; so Mary sang.
(5) Every hairless biped is a bird, Tweety is a hairless biped; so Tweety can fly.
(6) Every human born before 1850 has died; so every human will die.
Inference (4) is not secure. Suppose John dances whenever Mary sings, and he sometimes dances when Mary doesn't sing. Similarly, (5) relies on unstated assumptions--e.g., that Tweety is not a penguin. Even (6) falls short of the demonstrative character exhibited by (1-3). While laws of nature may preclude immortality, it is conceivable that someone will escape the grim reaper; and the conclusion of (6) goes beyond its premise, even if it is (in some sense) foolish to resist the inference.

Appeals to logical form arose in the context of attempts to say more about this intuitive distinction between impeccable inferences, which invite metaphors of security and immediacy, and inferences that involve a risk of slipping from truth to falsity. The motivations for saying more are both practical and theoretical. Experience teaches us that an inference can initially seem more secure than it is; and if we knew which inferences are risk-free, we might be more alert to the points at which we risk error. (Such alertness might be valuable, even if the risks are tolerable.) Claims about inference are also connected, in various ways, with claims about thought and its relation to language. So we would like to know in virtue of what, if anything, an inference is impeccable. The most common suggestion has been that certain inferences are absolutely secure by virtue of their (logical) form; although conceptions of form have evolved in tandem with conceptions of logic and language.

1. Patterns of Reason

An ancient thought is that impeccable inferences exhibit patterns that can be characterized schematically by abstracting away from the specific contents of particular premises and conclusions, thereby revealing a general form common to many other impeccable inferences. Such forms, along with the inferences that exemplify them, are said to be valid. With regard to (1), it seems that the conclusion is part of the first premise, and the second premise is another part of the first. We can express this point by saying that (1) is an inference of the form: B if A, and A; so B. And many other inferences, like (7), share this form:
(7) Chris swam if Pat was asleep, and Pat was asleep; so Chris swam.
The Stoics discussed such inferences, all of which are equally secure, using numbers (instead of letters) to reflect the abstract form: if the first then the second, and the first; so the second. In addition to this variant of ‘B if A, and A; so B’, the Stoics formulated other valid schemata:
If the first then the second, but not the second; so not the first.

Either the first or the second, but not the second; so the first.

Not both the first and the second, but the first; so not the second.

Schematic formulations like these require variables. And let us introduce ‘proposition’ as a term of art for whatever the variables above (represented in bold) range over. Propositions are thus the sorts of things that can be true or false; for they are potential premises/conclusions--things that can figure in valid inferences. (This leaves it open what propositions are: sentences, states of affairs, or whatever.)

We can now draw an important distinction. In speaking of an inference, one might be talking about (i) a mental process in which a thinker draws a conclusion from some premises, or (ii) the propositions a thinker would accept (perhaps tentatively or hypothetically) if she accepted the premises and conclusion, with one proposition designated as an alleged consequence of the others. The latter notion seems to be primary with respect to what makes an inference risk-free. For a risky thought process is one in which a thinker who accepts certain propositions comes to accept, without further evidence, a proposition that does not follow from the initial assumptions. So let us focus on premises and conclusions, as opposed to episodes of reasoning; and let us assume that propositions themselves have forms. Then the inference

(1) John danced if Mary sang, and Mary sang; so John danced.
is secure, in part because its first premise has the form ‘B if A’. If the proposition lacked this form, one could not explain the impeccability of (1) by saying that ‘B if A, and A; so B’ is a form of valid inference.

It is not obvious that all impeccable inferences are instances of some valid form, and thus inferences whose impeccability is due to the forms of the relevant propositions. But this thought has served as an ideal for the study of inference, at least since Aristotle's treatment of examples like

(2) Every politician is deceitful, and every senator is a politician; so every senator is deceitful.
The first premise in (2) seems to have several parts, each of which is a part of the second premise or the conclusion; and the inference is presumably valid because these proposition-parts exhibit the right pattern. Aristotle (who predated the Stoics) captured this idea by noting that conditional claims of the following form are sure to be true: if every P is D and every S is a P, then every S is D. Correspondingly, the following inference schema is valid:
Every P is D, and every S is a P; so every S is D.
Aristotle discussed a range of such inferences, called syllogisms, involving quantificational propositions---indicated by words like ‘every’ (or ‘all’) and ‘some’. Two other syllogistic forms are expressed below as valid schemata, although Aristotle typically presented his syllogisms as conditional claims:
Every P is D, and some S is a P; so some S is D

Some S is not D, every S is a P; so some P is not D.

These (italicized) variables are intended to range over certain parts of propositions. There is a sense in which common nouns like ‘politician’ and adjectives like ‘deceitful’ are general, since they can apply to many individuals; and just so, it seems, propositions contain correspondingly general elements. For example, the proposition that every senator is deceitful contains two such elements, both of which are relevant to the validity of inferences involving this proposition.

Propositions thus seem to have structure that bears on the (im)peccability of inferences, even ignoring premises/conclusions with propositional parts. That is, even ‘simple’ propositions have logical form. As Aristotle noted, pairs of such propositions can be related in interesting ways. If every P is D (and there is at least one P), then some P is D. If no P is D, then some P is not D. It is certain that either every P is D or some P is not D; and whichever of these propositions is true, the other is false. Similarly, the following propositions cannot both be true: every P is D; and no P is D. But it is not certain that either every P is D or no P is D. (Perhaps some P is D and some P is not D.) This network of logical relations strongly suggests that the propositions in question contain a quantificational element; two general elements; and sometimes, an element of negation. This raises the question of whether other propositions have a similar structure.

2. Propositions and Traditional Grammar

Consider the proposition that Venus is bright, which can figure in inferences like
(8) Every planet is bright, and Venus is a planet; so Venus is bright.
Aristotle said little about such inferences. But others formulated the schema ‘every P is D, and n is a P; so n is D’, where the new variable is intended to range over proposition-parts of the sort indicated by names. (On some views, discussed below, the proposition that Venus is bright contains a quantifier and two elements of generality; though unsurprisingly, such views are tendentious.) In any case, Aristotle knew about propositions like the conclusion of (8). Indeed, he thought such propositions exemplify a subject-predicate structure shared by all propositions--and the sentences that indicate (or express) them.

The sentence ‘every politican is deceitful’ intuitively divides into two major parts, as shown by the slash: ‘every politician / is deceitful’. Similarly for ‘Venus / is bright’, ‘some politician / swam’, and ‘the brightest planet / rises early in the evening’. Until fairly recently, it was held that every declarative sentence can be divided into subject and predicate in this way, and that propositions were like sentences in this respect. Aristotle would have said that in ‘Venus is bright’, (the property of being) bright is predicated of Venus; in ‘every P is D’, D is predicated of every P. Thus, ‘Venus’ and ‘every politician’ can both indicate subjects; and the word ‘is’ introduces a predicate. Using slightly different terminology, other theorists treated all elements of generality as predicates, and propositions with the following structure were said to have categorical form: subject-copula-predicate; where a copula, indicated by words like ‘is’ or ‘was’, links a subject (which can consist of a quantifier and predicate) to a predicate.

In this context, it is relevant that sentences like ‘Every man swam’ can---with some awkwardness---be paraphrased by sentences like ‘Every man was a swimmer’. So perhaps both sentences indicate the same proposition, while the second better reflects the true categorical form of the proposition. Maybe ‘swim’ is an abbreviation for ‘was a swimmer’, in the way that ‘bachelor’ is arguably short for ‘unmarried man’. (One would violate English grammar by saying ‘Every man was swimmer’; the article ‘a’ is needed. But let us assume that this feature of English, not found in all languages, is not reflected in propositions.)

The proposition that every man is tall if Venus is bright seems to be a ‘molecular’ compound of categorical propositions; the same complex proposition is presumably indicated by ‘if Venus is bright then every man is tall’. The proposition that not only every man is tall apparently extends a categorical proposition, via the elements indicated by ‘not’ and ‘only’. Such reflections suggest the possibility, explored with great ingenuity by medieval logicians, that all propositions are composed of categorical propositions and a small number of logical (or so-called syncategorematic) elements. This is not to say that all propositions were, or could be, analyzed in this manner. But by formulating various Aristotelian inference schemata, in ways that complemented proposed analyses of complex propositions, many impeccable infererences were revealed as instances of valid syllogistic forms.

Medieval logicians also discussed the relation of logic to grammar. Many viewed their project, in part, as an attempt to uncover principles of a mental language common to all thinkers. (Aristotle had said that spoken sounds symbolize ‘affections of the soul’.) From this perspective, one expects a few differences between the logical forms of propositions, and overt features of sentences. Spoken languages must mask certain aspects of logical structure, if the proposition that every man swam has categorical form3and thus contains a copula. Ockham held that a mental language would have no need for Latin's declensions, and that logicians could ignore such aspects of spoken language. The ancient Greeks were aware of sophisms like: that dog is a father, and that dog is yours; so that dog is your father. This bad inference cannot share its form with the superficially parallel (but impeccable) variant: that dog is a mutt, and that mutt is yours; so that dog is your mutt. So the superficial features of sentences are not infallible guides to the logical forms of propositions. But the divergence was held to be relatively minor. Spoken sentences have structure; they are composed, in systematic ways, of words. And the assumption was that sentences reflect the major aspects of logical form, including subject-predicate structure. There is a distinction between logic and the task of describing the sentences used in spoken languages. But the connection between logic and grammar was thought to run deep, making it tempting to say that the logical form of a proposition is the grammatical form of some (perhaps mental) sentence.

3. Motivations for Revision

Towards the end of the eighteenth century, Kant could say (without much exaggeration) that logic had followed a single path since its inception, and that ‘since Aristotle it has not had to retrace a single step’. He also said that syllogistic logic was ‘to all appearance complete and perfect’; but this was exuberance. There were too few schemata, yet there were also too many.

Some valid schemata are reducible to others, in that any inference of the reducible form can be revealed as valid (with a little work) given other schemata. And this turns out to be important. Consider

(9) If Al ran then either Al did not run or Bob did not swim, and Al ran; so Bob did not swim.
And assume that ‘Al did not run’ negates ‘Al ran’, while ‘Bob did not swim’ negates ‘Bob swam’. Then (9) is an instance of ‘if A then either not-A or not-B, and A; so not-B’. But we can treat this as a derived form, reducible to other valid schemata, like ‘if the first then the second, and the first; so the second’. Given the premises of (9), it follows that either not-A or not-B; so given A, it follows that not-B, in accordance with the schema ‘either not the first or not the second, and the first; so not the second’. Similarly, as Aristotelian logicians recognized, the following schema can be treated as a derived form:
(10) Some P is not D, and every S is D; so not every P is an S.
We have already seen that if some P is not D, then not every P is D; and every P is D, if both every S is D and every P is an S. So it cannot be that both of these conditions obtain, given the first premise of (10); and if every S is D, as stated in the second premise, then it follows that not every P is an S.

This invites the thought that further reduction is possible, especially given another respect in which there are more syllogistic schemata than one would like. Consider the contribution indicated by ‘every’ to propositions of the form: every P is D; not every P is D; every P is not D, etc. Ideally, one would specify this contribution--the logical role of the universal quantifer--with a single schema that reveals a common contribution to all propositions containing a universal quantifier. Similarly, one would like to characterize the common contribution of negation to propositions of diverse forms: not A; not every P is D; some P is not D; not both A and B; etc. But syllogistic logic is not ideal in this respect.

Correspondingly, one might suspect that there are relatively few basic inferential patterns. Some inferences may reflect inherently compelling transitions in thought. Perhaps ‘B if A, and A; so B’ is so obvious that logicians are entitled to take this rule of inference as axiomatic. But how many rules are plausibly regarded as fundamental in this sense? Theoretical elegance and explanatory depth favor theories with fewer irreducible assumptions. Indeed, Euclid's geometry had long provided a model for how to present a body of knowledge as a network of propositions that follow from a few basic axioms; and for several reasons, foundational questions played an important role in nineteenth century logic and mathematics. The work of Boole and others showed that progress in this regard was possible with respect to the logic of inferences involving propositional variables. But the syllogisms remained disunified and incomplete, for reasons related to another failing of traditional logic/grammar.

Propositions involving relations--e.g., the proposition that Juliet kissed Romeo--are evidently not categorical. One might suggest ‘Juliet was a kisser of Romeo’ as an overtly categorical paraphrase. But the predicate ‘kisser of Romeo’ differs, in ways that matter to inference, from predicates like ‘woman’. If some kisser of Romeo died, it follows that someone was kissed; whereas the proposition that some woman died has no comparable consequence (stated in the passive voice). Correlatively, if Juliet kissed Romeo, then Juliet kissed someone. This last proposition is of interest, even if we express it by saying ‘Juliet was a kisser of Romeo’; for such a proposition involves a quantifier (outside the subject) as part of a complex predicate. And traditional logic does not provide the resources needed for capturing the validity of inferences whose validity depends on quantifiers within predicates, as in:

(11) Some patient respects some doctor, and every doctor is a sailor; so some patient respects some sailor.
If ‘respects some doctor’ and ‘respects some sailor’ are nonrelational, like ‘is tall’, (11) has the following form:
Some P is T, and every D is an S; so some P is O.
(Replacing ‘T’ with ‘a respecter of some doctor’ and ‘O’ with ‘a respecter of some sailor’.) But this schema, which fails to reflect any quantificational structure in the predicates, is not valid. Its instances include the bad inference: some patient is tall, and every doctor is a sailor; so some patient is omniscient. This dramatizes the point that ‘respects some doctor’ and ‘respects some sailor’ are logically related, in ways that ‘is tall’ and ‘is omniscient’ are not.

One can introduce a variable ‘R’, intended to range over relations, and formulate the following schema:
some P R some D, and every D is an S; so some P R some S. But the problem remains. Quantifiers can still appear in the predicates, as in the following (complex, but still impeccable) inference:

(12) Every patient who met every doctor is tall, and some patient who met every doctor respects every senator; so some patient who respects every senator is tall.
If ‘patient who met every doctor’ and ‘patient who respects every senator’ are nonrelational, then (12) has the form: every P is T, and some P R every S; so some O is T. And this is not a valid form. Consider: every politician is tall, and some politician respects every senator; so some obstetrician is tall. Again, one might abstract a valid schema that covers (12), letting parentheses indicate a relative clause:
Every P(R1 every D) is T, and some P(R1 every D) R2 every S; so some P(R2 every S) is T.
But there can be still further quantificational structure in these predicates; and so on. This suggests that it really is important--if impeccability is to be revealed as a matter of form--to find a general characterization of how quantifiers contribute to propositions in which quantifiers can appear.

4. Frege and Formal Language

Frege showed how to resolve these difficulties in one fell swoop. His system of logic, published in 1879 (and still in use, with notational modifications), was the single greatest contribution to the subject. So it is significant that on Frege's view, propositions do not have the subject-predicate form of sentences. Frege's achievement required a substantial distinction between logical form and grammatical form (as traditionally conceived). It is hard to overemphasize the impact of this point on subsequent discussions of thought and its relation to language.

Frege's leading idea was that propositions have ‘function-argument’ structure. The intended analogy to mathematical functions, developed by Frege in later work, intimates his view. The successor function maps every integer onto its successor; it maps the number 1 onto the number 2, 2 onto 3, etc. We can represent this function, using a variable that ranges over integers, as follows: S(x) = x + 1. As this notation makes clear, the function takes integers as arguments; and given an argument, the value of the function is the successor of that argument. The division function, representable as ‘Q(y, z) = y/z’, maps ordered pairs of numbers onto quotients; the pair (8, 4) onto 2; (9, 3) onto 3; etc. Mappings can also be conditional, as with the function that maps every even integer onto itself and odd integer onto its successor: F(x) = x if x is even, and x + 1 otherwise. By itself, however, no function has a value. Frege says that functions are saturated by arguments. The metaphor, encouraged by his claim that we can indicate functions with expressions like ‘S( ) = ( ) + 1’, is that a function has ‘holes’ that can be ‘filled’ by arguments (of the right sort). Variable letters, such as the ‘y’ and ‘z’ in as ‘Q(y, z) = y/z’, are convenient for representing functions that take more than one argument. But we could also express the division function by indexing the argument places as follows:

Q( [_]i , [_]j ) = [_]i / [_]j
Similarly, propositions are said to contain unsaturated elements in combination with the requisite number of arguments. The proposition that Mary sang is said to contain a functional component indicated by ‘sang’, and an argument indicated by ‘Mary’: Sang(Mary). Frege thinks of the relevant function as a conditional mapping from individuals to truth values: Sang(x) = true if x sang, and false otherwise. The proposition that John admired Mary contains an ordered pair of arguments and a function: Admired(John, Mary). One can think of the function as a mapping from ordered pairs of individuals to truth values--or alternatively, as a function from individuals to functions from individuals to truth values. In any case, the proposition that Mary was admired by John has the same function-argument structure; although pace Frege, this is not yet reason to deny that all propositions have subject-predicate structure. (A traditional grammarian could say that the passive sentence fails to reflect the true structure of the indicated proposition, in which the subject is John, the first argument.) But Frege's treatment of quantified propositions, which flows from his claims about saturation, does depart from the tradition.

Let F be the function indicated by ‘Sang(  )’. Mary sang, if and only if: F maps the individual Mary onto the value true; i.e., F has the value true given Mary as argument. If Mary (or anyone else) sang, then someone sang. Thus, someone sang if and only if F maps at least one individual onto the value true; or using a modern variant of Frege's notation, ∃x[Sang(x)]. The quantifier ‘∃x’ is said to bind the variable ‘x’, which appears in ‘Sang(x)’; and this variable ranges over objects in a domain of discourse. (For now, assume the domain contains only persons.) If everyone sang, then each individual in the domain sang, so F maps each individual on the value true; or using formal notation, ∀x[Sang(x)]. A quantifier binds each occurrence of its variable, as in ‘∃x[D(x) & C(x)]’, which reflects the logical form of ‘someone is deceitful and clever’. Here the quantifier combines with a conjunction of functions:

[Quantifier]i [ Predicate([_]i) & Predicate([_]i) ]
Turning now to the syllogistic proposition that some politician is deceitful, traditional grammar suggests the division ‘some politician / is deceitful’, with the noun ‘politician’ going with ‘some’. Frege suggests, however, that the logically relevant division is between the quantifier and the rest: ∃x[P(x) & D(x)]; someone is both a politician and deceitful. (If the logical form is ‘∃x[P(x) ? D(x)]’, where ‘?’ is a connective, then ‘&’ is the connective we want; some politician is deceitful, if and only if someone is both a politican and deceitful.) With respect to the proposition that every politician is deceitful, Frege thinks the logical form is given by ‘∀x[P(x) → D(x)]’: everyone is such that if he is a politician then is deceitful. (Clearly, ‘∀x[P(x) & D(x)]’ would be wrong, since this implies that everyone is a politician. Frege defines ‘→’ so that ‘∀x[P(x) → D(x)]’ is equivalent to ‘∀xP(x) v D(x)]’, everyone either fails to be a politician or is deceitful; and ‘∀’ is defined so that ∀x[P(x)] ↔ ¬∃xP(x)].) This notation suggests that grammar is misleading in at least two respects. First, grammar leads us to think that ‘some politician’ indicates a major constituent of the proposition that some politician is deceitful. But if Frege is right, no constituent of the proposition contains both the quantifier and the predicate indicated by ‘politician’; quantified propositions divide along lines that keep the predicates together (apart from the quantifier). Second, grammar masks a difference between existential and universal syllogistic propositions: the main predicates are related conjunctively in the former, and conditionally in the latter. Initially, one might object to Frege's departure from intuition here; but on his view, multiply quantified propositions present no special difficulty.

Just as a single quantifier can bind an unsaturated position associated with a function that takes a single argument, two quantifiers can bind two unsaturated positions associated with a function that takes a pair of arguments. The proposition that everyone trusts everyone, for example, has the following (noncategorical) form: ∀xy[T(x,y)]. Assuming that ‘John’ and ‘Mary’ indicate arguments, it follows that John trusts everyone, and that everyone trusts Mary--i.e., ∀y[T(j,y)] and ∀x[T(x,m)]. It follows from all three propositions that John trusts Mary: T(j,m). Frege's rule of inference, which captures the key logical role of the universal quantifier, is that one can replace a variable bound by a universal quantifier with a name for some individual in the domain. Similarly, one can replace a name with a variable bound by an existential quantifier. (Schematically: ∀x(...x...), therefore ...n...; and ...n..., therefore ∃x(....x....). Given T(j,m), it follows that someone trusts Mary and that John trusts someone: ∃x[T(x, m)]; and ∃x[T(j,x)]. It follows from all three propositions that someone trusts someone: ∃xy[T(x,y)]. (A single quantifier can bind multiple argument positions, as in ‘∃x[T(x,x)]’; but this means that someone trusts herself.)

Mixed quantification introduces an interesting wrinkle. The propositions indicated by ‘∃xy[T(x,y)]’ and ‘∀yx[T(x,y)]’ differ. We can paraphrase the first as ‘there is someone who trusts everyone’ and the second as ‘everyone is trusted by someone or other’; the second follows from the first, but not vice versa. This raises the possibility that ‘someone trusts everyone’ is ambiguous--that it can indicate either of two propositions. (Although this in turn raises difficult questions about what natural language expressions are, and what it is for an expression to indicate a proposition. But for Frege, the important point was the distinction between the propositions--or thoughts, as he often called them. Similar remarks apply to ‘∀xy[T(x,y)]’ and ‘∃yx[T(x,y)]’.) A related phenomenon is exhibited by ‘John danced if Mary sang and Chris slept’. Is the indicated proposition of the form ‘(A if B) and C’ or ‘A if (B and C)’? Is someone who says ‘The artist drew a club’ talking about a sketch or a card game? One can use ‘is’ to express identity, as in ‘Hesperus is the planet Venus’; but in ‘Venus is bright’, ‘is’ indicates predication. In ‘Venus is a planet’, ‘a’ is logically inert; yet in ‘John saw a planet’, ‘a’ indicates existential quantification: ∃x[P(x) & S(j,x)]. (Rendering ‘Venus is a planet’ as ‘∃x[P(x) & x = v]’ treats ‘is a planet’ differently than ‘is bright’ by appealing, unnecessarily, to quantification and identity.)

According to Frege, such ambiguities provide further evidence that natural language is not ideally suited to the task of representing propositions and inferential relations perspicuously, and he wanted a language that was up to the task. (Leibniz and others had envisioned a ‘Characteristica Universalis’, but without suggestions for how to proceed beyond syllogistic logic in creating one; and given Frege's interest in the foundations of arithmetic, he was especially interested in claims, like ‘every number has a successor’.) This is not to say that natural language is ill-suited for other purposes, like communication, or that natural language is useless as a tool for representing propositions. Rather, Frege suggested that natural language is like the eye, whereas a good formal language is like a microscope that reveals structure not otherwise observable.

5. Descriptions and Analysis

Frege did not distinguish--or at least did not emphasize any distinction between--names like ‘John’ and descriptions like ‘the boy’ or ‘the tall boy in the garden’. Initially, both kinds of expression appear to indicate arguments, as opposed to functions; so one might think that the propositional contribution of ‘the...’, whatever its syntactic complexity, is just the individual that satisfies the description. On this view, the logical form of ‘the boy sang’ is ‘Sang(b)’, where ‘b’ is a an unstructured symbol that designates the boy in question. But this makes syntactic elements of the description logically irrelevant, and this seems wrong. If the boy sang, it follows that some boy sang; if the tall boy in the garden sang, some tall boy sang. Moreover, ‘the’ implies uniqueness in a way that ‘some’ does not. One can say ‘the boy sang’ without denying that universe contains a plurality of boys, but one implies that there is exactly one contextually relevant boy.

In general, if the P is D, it follows that some P is D, and that there is only one (relevant) P. Or put another way: there is a P, and there is at most one P, and it is D. Russell held that the logical form of ‘the boy sang’ reflects these implications: ∃x{Boy(x) & ∀y[Boy(y) ↔ x = y] & Sang(x)}. The middle conjunct was Russell's way of expressing uniqueness; given an object x, ‘∀y[Boy(y) ↔ x = y)]’ says that everything is such that it is a boy if and only if it is identical with x. But however one formulates the middle conjunct, ‘the boy’ does not correspond to any constituent of Russell's formalism. This reflects his main point: while a speaker may refer to a boy in saying ‘the boy sang’, the boy is not a constituent of the proposition indicated. The proposition has the form of an existential quantification with a bound variable; it does not have the form of a function saturated by an argument--the boy referred to. In this respect, ‘the boy’ is like ‘some boy’; but not even ‘the’ indicates a constituent on Russell's view.

Natural language can thus mislead us about the constituency of the propositions we assert. Russell went on to apply this point to a now famous puzzle. Even though France is kingless, ‘the king of France is bald’ indicates a proposition; the sentence is not, in that sense, meaningless. If the proposition consists of the function indicated by ‘Bald(  )’ and an argument indicated by ‘the king of France’, there must be an argument so indicated. But what is it? Appeal to nonexistent kings is, to say the least, dubious. Russell concluded that ‘the King of France is bald’ indicates a quantified proposition: ∃x{K(x) & ∀y[K(y) ↔ x = y] & B(x)}. And one should not be led into thinking otherwise by the following spurious reasoning: every proposition is true or false; so the king of France is bald or not; so there is a present king of France (somewhere), and he is either bald or not. For let ‘¶’ stand for the proposition that the king of France is bald. Russell grants that ¶ is true or false. In fact, it is false, since there is no king of France; given ¬∃x[K(x)], it follows that ¬∃x{K(x) & ∀y[K(y) ↔ x = y] & B(x)}. But it hardly follows that there is a king of France who is either bald or not. Russell thinks the confusion lies in a failure to distinguish the negation of ¶ from: ∃x{K(x) & ∀y[K(y) ↔ x = y] & ¬B(x)}; the king of France is not bald. And the natural language expression ‘the king of France is bald or not’ fosters such a confusion.

The idea that philosophical puzzles might dissolve, if only we understood the logical forms of our claims, attracted copious attention. Wittgenstein argued, in his influential Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, that: (i) the very possibility of meaningful sentences, which can be true or false depending on how the world is, requires propositions with structures of the sort Frege and Russell were getting at; (ii) all propositions are logical compounds of--and thus analyzable into--atomic propositions that are inferentially independent of one another, though even simple natural language sentences may indicate complex propositions; and (iii) the right analyses would, given a little reflection, reveal all philosophical puzzles as confusions about how language is related to the world. Russell never endorsed (iii). But for reasons related to epistemological puzzles, Russell held that we are directly acquainted with the constituents of those propositions into which every proposition (that we can grasp) can be analyzed; we are not directly acquainted with mind-independent objects that cause our various sensory perceptions; and so the apparent referents of proper names (in natural language) are not constituents of basic propositions.

This led Russell to say that such names are disguised descriptions. On this view, ‘Venus’ is associated with a (perhaps complex) predicate, and ‘Venus is bright’ indicates a proposition of the form: ∃x{V(x) & ∀y[V(y) ↔ x = y] & B(x)}. This has the tendentious consequence that for some predicate ‘V’, it follows that ∃x[V(x)], if Venus is bright; though perhaps, pace Russell, 3V’ is an unanalyzable predicate true of exactly one mind-indepedent planet. (A related view is that ‘Venus is bright’ shares its logical form, not with ‘The nearest planet is bright’, but with ‘That planet is bright’.)

Questions about names are related to psychological reports, like ‘Mary thinks Venus is bright’, which present puzzles of their own. At least intially, such reports seem to indicate propositions that are neither atomic nor logical compounds of simpler propositions; and as Frege noted in a famous paper, it seems that replacing one name with another name for the same object can affect the truth of a psychological report. If Mary fails to know that Hesperus is Venus, she might think Venus is a planet without thinking Hesperus is a planet; yet any function that has the value true given Venus as argument has the value true given Hesperus as argument. So unsurprisingly, Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein all held--in varying ways--that psychological reports are misleading with respect to their logical form, since intuitively coreferential names can be associated with distinct propositional contributions. (Wittgenstein later noted that claims like ‘This is red’ and ‘This is yellow’ present difficulties for his view: if the indicated propositions are unanalyzable, and thus logically independent, each should be compatible with the other; yet it is hard to envision any analysis that accounts for the apparent impeccabilty of ‘This is red, so this is not yellow’. This raises questions about whether all inferential security is due to logical form.)

6. Restricted Quantifiers

Within the Frege-Russell-Wittgenstein tradition, which flourished in England and America, it became a commonplace that logical form and grammatical form often diverge--even if the most ambitious analytic projects did not succeed. But recent work on quantifiers suggests that the divergence may have been exaggerated, because of how the idea of variable-binding was implemented. Consider again the proposition that some boy sang, and the proposed logical division into the quantifier and the rest:
x[Boy(x) & Sang(x)];
For some x, x is a boy and x sang.
While this captures the truth conditions of the English sentence, one can also offer a ‘logical paraphrase’ that more closely parallels the grammatical division ‘some boy / sang’: for some x such that x is a boy, x sang. One can formalize this alternative, by using restricted quantifiers, which (as the terminology suggests) incorporate a restriction on the domain over which the variable in question ranges. For example, ‘∃x:Boy(x)’ is an existential quantifier that binds a variable ranging over boys in the unrestricted domain. So ‘∃x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’ is interpreted as: for some x such that Boy(x), x sang; that is, some (individual who is a) boy sang. This is logically equivalent to ‘∃x[Boy(x) & Sang(x)]’.

Universal quantifiers can also be restricted, as in ‘∀x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’, which is interpreted as follows: for every x such that Boy(x), x sang; that is, every (individual who is a) boy sang. This is logically equivalent to ‘∀x[Boy(x) → Sang(x)]’; although one might well think the inferential difference between ‘some boy sang’ and ‘every boy sang’ lies entirely with the propositional contributions of ‘some’ and ‘every’--and not (in part) with the contribution of alleged connectives between predicates. Restrictors can be logically complex, as in ‘Some tall boy sang’ or ‘Some boy who respects Mary sang’, which are rendered as ‘∃x:Tall(x) & Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’ and ‘∃x:Boy(x) & Respects(x, mary)[Sang(x)]’.

From this perspective, words like ‘someone’, and the grammatical requirement that ‘every’ be followed by a noun (like ‘boy’), reflect the form of those quantifiers that figure in propositions indicated by natural language sentences. Such quantifiers are composed of a determiner, indicated by words like ‘some’ and ‘every’, and a (restricting) predicate that is true of individuals of some sort. One can think of determiners as functions from ordered pairs of predicates to truth values--or equivalently, as functions from predicates to functions from predicates to truth values. This makes explicit that ‘every’ and ‘some’ indicate relations between predicates, much as transitive verbs express relations between individuals.

Since ‘x’ and ‘y’ are variables ranging over individuals, one can say that the function indicated by the transitive verb ‘loves’ has the value true given the ordered pair <x,y> as argument if and only if x loves y. In this notational scheme, ‘y’ corresponds to the direct object (or internal argument), which combines with the verb to form a complex predicate (like ‘loves Chris’); ‘x’ corresponds to the grammatical subject (or external argument) of the verb. If we think about ‘every boy sang’ analogously, ‘boy’ is the internal argument with which ‘every’ combines to form a phrase. We can now introduce ‘X’ and ‘Y’ as variables ranging over functions from individuals to truth values, stipulating that the extension of such a function is the set of things that the function maps onto the value true. Then one can say that the function indicated by ‘every’ has the value true given the ordered pair <X, Y> as argument if and only if the extension of X includes the extension of Y. Similarly, the function indicated by ‘some’ has the value true given the ordered pair <X, Y> as argument if and only if the extension of X intersects with the extension of Y. At this point, we no longer need the symbols ‘∃’ and ‘∀’. For we can say that ‘Every:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’ is true if and only if the singers included the boys; and ‘Some:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’ is true if and only if the singers and the boys intersect. (Moreover, the truth condition for ‘Most boys sang’ cannot be captured with ‘∃’, ‘∃’, and the sentential connectives. But we can say that most boys sang if and only if: the boys who are also singers outnumber the boys who are not singers; or put another way, the number of boys who sang exceeds the number of boys who did not sing. So we can say that ‘most’ indicates a function that takes the value true given <X, Y> as argument if and only if: the number of things that Y and X both map onto true exceeds the number of things that Y maps onto true but X does not.)

The Russellian formula

x{Boy(x) & ∀y[Boy(y) → x = y] & Sang(x)}

can be replaced with

Some:Boy(x)[Sang(x)] & |Boy| = 1

interpreted as follows: for some x, x a boy, x sang; and there is exactly one (relevant) boy. On this view, ‘the boy’ still does not correspond to a constituent of the formalism; nor does ‘the’. But one can also treat ‘the’ as a determiner in its own right, as in

while specifying the propositional contribution of this determiner as follows:
The <X, Y> = true if |Y| = 1 & the extensions of X and Y intersect, and false otherwise.
This version of Russell's theory still preserves his central claim. While there may be a boy one refers to in saying ‘the boy sang’, the boy is not a constituent of the indicated proposition, which is quantificational--involving two predicates and a logical relation between them. But far from showing that the logical form of ‘the boy sang’ diverges dramatically from its grammatical form, the restricted quantifier notation suggests that the logical form closely parallels the grammatical form.

It is worth noting, briefly, an implication of this point for the inference ‘the boy sang, so some boy sang’. If the logical form of ‘the boy sang’ is

Some:Boy(x)[Sang(x)] & |Boy|=1,
then the inference is an instance of the simple schema ‘A & B; so A’. But if the logical form of  ‘the boy sang’ is simply ‘The:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’, both premise and conclusion of the inference have the abstract form ‘Determiner:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’; in which case, the impeccability of the inference depends on the specific propositional contributions of ‘the’ and ‘some’. (If the validity of an inference depends solely on the propositional contributions of its logical elements, perhaps ‘the’ and ‘some’ indicate logical elements that are inferentially related.)

7. Transformational Grammar

Still, the subject/predicate structures of ‘Mary trusts every doctor’ and ‘Some boy trusts every doctor’ diverge from the logical forms of the indicated propositions. Even with restricted quantifiers, and rewriting ‘T(x, y)’ as ‘(x)T(y)’, the formal sentences ‘Every:Doctor(y){(mary)Trusts(y)}’ and ‘[Some:Boy(x)][Every:Doctor(y)]{(x)Trusts( y)]}’ differ from the spoken English sentences. But in thinking about the relation of logic to grammar, one must not assume a naive conception of the latter. For example, the grammatical form of a sentence need not be determined by the linear order of its words. We can distinguish the logical form ‘(A if B) and C’ from ‘A if (B and C)’. And we can distinguish ‘Mary{saw [the boy (with binoculars)]}’ from ‘Mary{[saw (the boy)](with binoculars)}’; with the former indicating that the boy had binoculars, while the latter indicates that Mary used binoculars to see the boy. Diagnosing ambiguity may be just one among many reasons for positing unobvious grammatical structure. And it turns out that the study of natural language suggests a rich conception of grammatical form that diverges from the Aristotelian tradition in just the way that modern quantificational logic does.

A leading idea of modern linguistics is that at least some grammatical structures are transformations of other structures; and this is related to the idea that words (and phrases) often appear to be displaced from the positions typically associated with the relevant grammatical roles. For example, the word ‘who’ in (13) is associated with the second (direct object) argument position of the verb ‘saw’:

(13) Mary wondered who John saw.
Correspondingly, (13) can be glossed as ‘Mary wondered for which x (x a person) John saw x’. This suggests that (13) reflects a transformation of the ‘deep structure’ (13d) into the ‘surface structure’ (13s):
(13d) Mary wondered [John saw who]
(13s) Mary wondered [ whoi [John saw [_]i ]]
In (13d), the embedded clause has the same basic form as ‘John saw Bill’; and in (13s), ‘who’ has been displaced from the argument position represented by the blank. Evidently, ‘who’ is also displaced in ‘Who did John see’. (Similar remarks apply to ‘why’, ‘what’, ‘when’, ‘how’, etc.)

One might also explain the synonymy of (14) and (15), by positing a common deep structure, (14d):

(14) John seems to like Mary
(14s) Johni seems ( [_]i to like Mary )
(14d) Seems(John likes Mary)
(15) It seems John likes Mary
Since every English sentence needs a grammatical subject, (14d) must be modified: either by displacing ‘John’, as in (14s); or by inserting a dummy subject ‘it’, which does not indicate an argument, as in (15). (Compare ‘There is something in the garden’, which is synonymous with ‘Something is in the garden’.) Appeal to displacement also lets one distinguish the superficially parallel sentences (16) and (17):
(16) John is easy to please.
(17) John is eager to please
If (16) is true, it is easy (for somone) to please John, and so someone can easily please John; but if (17) is true, John is eager that he please someone or other. This asymmetry is effaced by representations like ‘Easy-to-please(John)’ and ‘Eager-to-please(John)’. But the contrast is made manifest by:
(16s) Johni is easy [ e to please [_]i ]
(17s) Johni is eager [ [_]i to please e ]
where ‘e’ indicates an unvoiced (or empty) argument position. On this view of grammar, the ‘surface subject’ may in fact be the object of a verb embedded within the main predicate. Of course, such hypotheses about (hidden) grammatical structure require defense. But Chomsky and others have argued that such hypotheses are needed to account for a range of data concerning human linguistic capacities.

As an illustration of the kind of data that is relevant, note that (18-20) are perfectly fine expressions of English, while (21) is word salad.

(18) The boy who sang was happy.
(19) Was the boy who sang happy.
(20) The boy who was happy sang.
(21) *Was the boy who happy sang.
This suggests that the auxiliary verb ‘was’ can be displaced from some positions but not others. That is, while (19s) is a permissible transformation of (18d), (21s) is not a permissible transformation of (20d):
(18d) {The [boy (who sang)]} [was happy]
(19s) Wasi <{the [boy (who sang)]} [  [_]i happy ]>
(20d) {The [boy (who <was happy>)]} sang}
(21s) *Wasi <{the [boy (who < [_]i happy>)]} sang}>
The ill-formedness of (21s) is striking, since one can ask if the boy who was happy sang. One can also ask whether (22) is true. But (23) corresponds to ‘The boy who lost was kept crying’, and not (22):
(22) The boy who was lost kept crying.
(23) Was the boy who lost kept crying.
This is precisely what one would expect, if ‘was’ cannot be displaced from its position in (22):
*Wasi <{the [boy (who [_]i lost)]} [kept crying]}>
Such explanations appeal to nonobvious grammatical structure, and constraints on transformations. (For example, no ‘fronting’ an auxiliary verb from an embedded clause.) A sentence was thus said to have a deep structure (DS), which reflects Fregean function-argument stucture, as well as a surface structure (SS); and linguists posited various constraints on DS, SS, and the transformations that relate them. But as the theory was elaborated and refined under empirical pressure, linguists concluded that DS and SS failed to reflect all the grammatically relevant features of sentences. It was argued that another level of grammatical structure, obtained by an operation on SS, was needed to account for certain linguistic facts. The hypothesized transformation, called quantifier raising because it targeted the kinds of expressions that indicate (restricted) quantifiers, mapped structures like (24s) onto structures like (24LF).
(24s) {(some boy) [trusts (every doctor)]}.
(24LF) [some boy]i[every doctor]j{ [_]i [ trusts [_]j ]}
Clearly, (24LF) does not reflect the pronounced word order in English. But the idea is that (24s) can determine the pronounced form of the sentence, while also serving as input to the new transformation. The label ‘LF’ (intimating ‘logical form’) was used for a grammatical structure, since the scope of a natural language quantifier is determined by its position at LF--and not by its position at DS or SS. Moreover, the mapping between (24LF) and the following logical formalism is trivial:
And (24LF) differs from another structure, interpreted as:

[every doctor]i[some boy]j{ [_]j [ trusts [_]i ]}

There is a large body of work suggesting that many logical properties of quantifiers, names, and pronouns are similarly reflected in properties of LF. To take just one example, if (25) is true, it follows that some doctor treated some doctor; whereas (26) does not have this consequence:
(25) Every boy saw the doctor who treated himself.
(26) Every boy saw the doctor who treated him.
The truth conditions of (25-26) seem to be (respectively):
[every:boy(x)][the:doctor(y) & treated(y,y)]{saw(x, y)]}

[every:boy(x)][the:doctor(y) & treated(y,x)]{saw(x, y)}

This suggests that ‘himself’ is behaving like a variable bound by ‘the doctor’, while ‘every boy’ can bind ‘him’. And there are independent grammatical reasons for saying that ‘himself’ must be linked to ‘the doctor’, while ‘him’ must not be so linked:
Every boy saw [the doctor]i who treated [himself]i
*[Every boy]i saw the doctor who treated [himself]i

[Every boy]i saw the doctor who treated [him]i
*Every boy saw [the doctor]i who treated [him]i

While there is a conceptual distinction between LF and the traditional notion of logical form, perhaps the LF of a sentence is at least isomorphic to the logical form of the indicated proposition. (If so, one might avoid certain questions prompted by Frege's view of natural language. How can a sentence indicate a proposition with a different structure? And if grammar is deeply misleading, why think our intuitions of (im)peccability provide reliable evidence about which propositions follow from which?

8. Semantic Structure and Events

The notion of logical form has also played a significant role in theories of meaning for natural languages. One would like to show how the meaning of a complex expression depends on (i) the meanings of its constituents, and (ii) the ways in which the constituents are arranged. It seems that ‘every tall sailor respects some doctor’ and ‘some short boy likes every politician’ exhibits a common mode of semantic combination; and the meaning of each sentence is presumably fixed by this mode of combination, given the relevant word meanings. This claim is sometimes expressed as follows: the meaning of a sentence is determined by its logical form and the meanings of its parts. This assumes that sentences, like propositions, have logical forms. But in so far as grammatical form mirrors logical form, one might say that the meaning of a sentence S is determined by S's grammatical form and the meanings of its words. (Indeed, some theorists identify the logical form of a sentence with its semantic structure3the way in which its parts are arranged so as to create a complex whose meaning is determined compositionally; and some identify grammatical form with LF, especially in light of Chomsky's recent work, which eschews constraints on DS and SS in favor of constraints on the generation of LFs.)

Davidson and others have urged a version of this idea that draws on Tarski's development of Frege's work. Tarski showed how to provide finitely statable interpretations for certain formal languages, which generate arbitrarily many sentences, by employing recursive rules that assign semantic values to every expression of the language given assignments of semantic values to primitive elements of the language. (This is related to the idea that an inference is valid if and only if: every interpretation that makes the premises true makes the conclusion true, holding fixed the interpretations of logical elements like ‘if’ and ‘every’.) Davidsonians try to construct Tarski-style theories that assign truth conditions to natural language sentences, given the extensions of words and the relevant logical forms. For on their view, a sentence S means that p, if a recursive theory of the right sort assigns the following truth conditions to S: true if p, and false otherwise. (Montague and others have pursued a similar line of thought.)

For present purposes, the details of this program are less important than Davidson's claim that in constructing any such theory of meaning, we should attend to inferential relations like those exhibited in

(27) Juliet kissed Romeo quickly at midnight.
(28) Juliet kissed Romeo quickly.
(29) Juliet kissed Romeo at midnight.
(30) Juliet kissed Romeo.
If (27) is true, so are (28-30); if (28) or (29) is true, so is (30). The inferences seem impeccable. But the function-argument structure of (27) is not obvious. If we represent ‘kissed quickly at midnight’ as a unstructured predicate that takes two arguments, like ‘kissed’ or ‘kicked’,  we will represent the inference from (27) to (30) as having the form: K*(x,y); so K(x,y). But this form is exemplified by the bad inference: Juliet kicked Romeo; so Juliet kissed Romeo. Put another way, if ‘kissed quickly at midnight’ is a logically unstructured binary predicate, then the following claim is an extra (nonlogical) assumption: if x kissed y in a certain manner at a certain time, x kissed y. But this seems like a tautology, not an assumption that introduces epistemic risk. Davidsonians thus hold that the surface appearances of sentences like (27-30) mask semantic structure; in particular, there is hidden quantification over events.

The true form of (30) is said to be manifested by the paraphrase ‘there was a kissing of Romeo by Juliet’. One can formalize this proposal in various ways: ∃e[Kissing(e) & Of(e, Romeo) & By(e, Juliet)]; or ∃e[Kiss(e, Juliet, Romeo)], with the verb ‘kiss’ indicating a function that takes three arguments; or

(30) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo)]
with Juliet and Romeo being explicitly represented as players of certain roles in the event--roughly, the doer (Agent) and the done to (Patient). But whatever the notation, adverbs like ‘quickly’ and ‘at midnight’ are said to indicate further features of the event described, as shown below:
(27a) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & Quick(e) & At-midnight(e)]
(28a) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & Quick(e)]
(29a) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & At-midnight(e)]
If this is correct, then the inference from (27) to (30) is an instance of the following valid form:
e[A(e, x) & K(e) & P(e, y) & Q(e) & M(e)],
therefore ∃e[A(e, x) & K(e) & P(e, y)]
And the other impeccable inferences involving (27-30) are similarly instances of conjunction reduction. If the grammatical form of (30) is simply ‘{Juliet [kissed (Romeo)]}’, then the mapping from grammatical to logical form is not transparent; and the grammar is misleading--or at least not entirely forthcoming--in that no word corresponds to the event quantifier. But a growing body of literature (in philosophy and linguistics) suggests that Davidson's proposal captures an important feature of natural language semantics, and that ‘event analyses’ provide a useful framwork for future discussions of logical form.


The following books provide a useful overview of the history and basic subject matter of logic: Frege's Begriffschrift can be found in: His later work on functions (‘Function and Concept’) and belief ascriptions (‘Sense and Reference’) can be found in: For these purposes, Russell's most important books are: See also the introduction to the latter, by David Pears; and Russell, by Mark Sainsbury (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979). Stephen Neale's Descriptions (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1990) is a recent development of Russell's theory. Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1961) is importantly related to Russell's logical atomism.

Two key articles on restricted quantifiers, and a third reviewing recent work, are:

For introductions to Transformational Grammar and Chomsky's conception of natural language, see: And for discussions of work in linguistics bearing directly on issues of logical form: For discussions of the Davidsonian program (briefly described in section 8) and appeal to events:

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Aristotle: logic | Davidson, Donald | descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | logic: classical | logical consequence | propositions: singular | propositions: structured | quantification | Russell, Bertrand


The author would like to Christopher Menzel for spotting an error in the formulation of the truth conditions for the generalized quantifier ‘every’, at the end of Section 6. This led to some revision and improvement in that discussion.

Copyright © 2002
Paul Pietroski

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