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Informal Logic

Informal logic is an attempt to develop a logic which can be used to assess, analyse and improve the informal reasoning that occurs in the course of personal exchange, advertising, political debate, legal argument, and in the types of social commentary found in newspapers, television, the World Wide Web and other forms of mass media.

In many instances, the evolution of informal logic has been motivated by a desire to develop ways of analysing and evaluating ordinary reasoning which can be made a part of general education, and which can inform and improve public reasoning, discussion and debate. To this extent, the interests of informal logic closely intersect with those of the Critical Thinking Movement, which has as its goal the development of a model of education which places more emphasis on critical inquiry.

Though informal logic is sometimes portrayed as a theoretical alternative to formal logic, the relationship between the two is more complex than this suggests. While the attempt to teach good reasoning and critical thinking is inevitably couched in natural language, research in informal logic may employ formal methods and one could argue that the informal accounts of argument in which informal logic specializes can in principle be formalized. Recent work in computational modelling, which attempts to implement informal logic models of natural-language reasoning, suggests that defeasible (non-monotonic) logic, probability theory and other non-classical formal frameworks may be well suited to this task.

1. History

Informal logic is a recent discipline, but one which has already exerted a significant influence on contemporary education. This influence is reflected in the thousands of courses and hundreds of textbooks that teach informal logic to university and college students in Canada, the United States, the United Kingdom, and a growing number of other countries.

In keeping with these educational developments, the beginnings of informal logic have been tied to the call for more relevant higher education that accompanied the social and political movements of the 1960s. In logic, and especially the teaching of logic, this prompted the attempt to apply logical analysis to concrete examples of everyday reasoning. To this extent, the roots of informal logic are found in the work of authors who replaced the artificial examples of good and bad argument that characterized earlier logic texts (e.g., Copi [1957]) with actual instances of reasoning, argument and debate taken from newspapers, the mass media, advertisements and political campaigns (as in Kahane [1971]).

Though Hamblin's Fallacies (Hamblin [1970]) and Toulmin's The Uses of Argument (Toulmin [1964]) anticipate the interest in informal reasoning that characterizes informal logic, the discipline begins in North America in the 1970s, in the work of Johnson and Blair. Their Logical Self-Defense (Johnson and Blair [1977])was an early introductory to emphasize concrete examples of informal reasoning, and their Informal Logic Newsletter (now the journal Informal Logic) established the field as a distinct discipline for discussion, development and research.

Much of the interest that has prompted the development of informal logic has been generated by the Critical Thinking Movement. One of its most significant achievements is the 1980 California State University Executive Order requiring formal instruction in critical thinking in post secondary education. According to the order:

Instruction in critical thinking is to be designed to achieve an understanding of the relationship of language to logic, which should lead to the ability to analyze, criticize, and advocate ideas, to reason inductively and deductively and to reach factual or judgmental conclusions based on sound inferences drawn from unambiguous statements of knowledge or belief. (Dumke [1980], Executive Order 338)

In keeping with educational interests of this sort, the development of informal logic has been intertwined with pedagogical discussions of the ways in which students can best be taught to reason. One of the most notable aspects of informal logic has, therefore, been the publication of hundreds of textbooks designed to teach students how to reason well. In some cases, these texts (e.g., Govier [2001]; Ruggiero [1992]; Woods, Irvine and Walton [2000]) are of theoretical interest because they advocate or assume novel approaches to theory and pedagogy in the field.

Two important signs of informal logic's development as a field of research are the progress of the journal Informal Logic, which will publish its 25th volume in 2005, and the conference, "Informal Logic @ 25," scheduled to mark the 25th anniversary of the "First International Symposium on Informal Logic" in 2003. The scholarly journals which have played a significant role in the development of the discipline include Argumentation, Philosophy and Rhetoric, Argumentation and Advocacy (formerly the Journal of the American Forensic Association) and Teaching Philosophy. (The interdisciplinary journal ProtoSociology published a related volume on "Reasoning and Argumentation" in 1999).

Though it is a quarter of a century old, informal logic might still be described as a discipline in its formative stages of development. There are some general trends that characterize the field (most notably, a move toward a broad conception of argumentation which extends the analysis of argumentation beyond the analysis of premises and conclusions) but there is no predominant approach to informal logic in the textbooks or the research literature. Instead, work in the field often makes different assumptions about the goals and methods of informal logic; about the usefulness of fallacies, formal logic, etc. in attempts to understand ordinary argument; about the proper understanding of inductive and conductive arguments (said to be non-deductive arguments which offer a number of independent non-conclusive premises for a conclusion); about the usefulness of diagramming techniques; and about the appropriate role of theories of communication, and dialectical and dialogical considerations, in assessing arguments.

Some of these issues may be resolved as research in informal logic is increasingly characterized by work which emphasizes its connections to the approaches to argumentation found in cognate disciplines and fields such as Speech Communication, Rhetoric, Linguistics, Artificial Intelligence, Cognitive Psychology and Computational Modelling. Looked at from this perspective, informal logic is one aspect of a much broader multi-disciplinary attempt to better understand the dynamics of informal reasoning. Its ties to this broader endeavour have been highlighted and nurtured in conferences and publications, most notably in five multi-disciplinary Amsterdam conferences (held in 1986, 1991, 1996, 1998 and 2002), hosted by the International Society for the Study of Argumentation (ISSA). Other initiatives of this kind include the First Tokyo Conference on Argumentation, hosted by the Japan Debate Association and Tokai University in 2000, and the "Symposium on Argument and Computation" held in Perthshire, Scotland in 2000.

2. Fallacy Theory and Beyond

Early work in informal logic tends to analyse informal reasoning in terms of fallacies. Traditional definitions construe fallacies as patterns of poor reasoning which appear to be patterns of good reasoning (see Hansen [2002]). Such accounts are problematic, for it is difficult to specify when poor reasoning appears to be good, especially as appearance is a subjective notion. In assessing ordinary arguments, it may more simply be said that fallacies are common patterns of poor reasoning which can be identified in the evaluation of informal reasoning.

In their appeals to fallacy theory, informal logicians revive a tradition which can be traced to Aristotle and that is reflected in the writings of figures as important as Locke, Whately, and Mill. Today, the fallacy tradition continues in many textbooks (and websites) which attempt to teach good informal reasoning by teaching students how to detect fallacious arguments.

Though there is no agreed upon standard set of fallacies, and no established taxonomy of fallacies, the fallacies discussed in informal logic contexts typically include formal fallacies such as affirming the consequent and denying the antecedent; and informal fallacies such as ad hominem ("against the person"), slippery slope, "ad bacculum" ("appeal to force"), "ad misericordiam" ("appeal to pity") and two wrongs make a right. Some authors use fallacy nomenclature designed to highlight the properties of particular kinds of fallacious arguments. (Thus "poisoning the well" refers to a particular kind of ad hominem, "misleading vividness" refers to vivid anecdotal evidence used as the basis of hasty generalizations, and so on.)

In keeping with its initial interest in fallacies, a great deal of research in informal logic has focussed on fallacious forms of argument. Woods and Walton, for example, have discussed the definition, analysis and assessment of a variety of fallacies in a series of articles and books, first as co-authors and then as individuals (see, e.g., Woods and Walton [1989]; Walton [1989]; Woods [1995]; and Walton [1992]). Van Eemeren and Grootendorst [1992] propose a pragma-dialectical theory of fallacies which analyses fallacies as violations of the rules of critical discussion (discussion which attempts to critically resolve a difference of opinion). A representative collection of classical and contemporary essays on the fallacies is found in Hansen and Pinto [1995].

Though much research in informal logic continues to focus on fallacies, and on the appropriate understanding of particular fallacies, the development of the field has tended to place less emphasis on this kind of research. Because informal logicians influenced by communication theory have, for example, seen fallacies as deviations from implicit rules that govern various kinds of dialogical exchange, their approach has made the implicit norms that govern different kinds of dialogue, not fallacies, the ultimate basis for their account of argument.

In other contexts, fallacy theory has been criticized both because traditional fallacies are imprecise tools for understanding argument, and because a focus on them inevitably emphasizes poor reasoning rather than good argument. In view of the latter, Hitchcock ([1995], 324) writes that the claim that we should teach good reasoning by fallacies is "like saying that the best way to teach somebody to play tennis without making the common mistakes ... is to demonstrate these faults in action and get him to label and respond to them."

Problems with fallacy theory are compounded by many instances of traditional fallacies which appear to be reasonable patterns of argument. In discussions of fallacy theory, commentators point to examples like the following:

  1. Martin Luther King Jr., influenced by Gandhi, argued that we can justifiably break laws in a democratic country if our goal is change which has been unjustly obstructed. Such arguments play a central role in the American civil rights movement. They are not obviously fallacious, though they are a case of two wrongs make a right, for they suggest that we can justifiably do something wrong (break a law) if we are responding to another wrong (i.e. some law, decision or policy that unjustly obstructs change).
  2. The argument that "The attempt to use military might to put an end to terrorism is wrong because it will take us down a slippery slope that will end in improper interference in the affairs of independent states" cannot be dismissed as a bad argument simply by saying that it countenances a slippery slope. If such a slippery slope is plausible, then the argument has some merit.
  3. The argument "No one with a history of heart disease should take up running, for running is a strenuous form of exercise, and no one with a history of heart disease should engage in strenuous exercise" is, like many informal arguments, deductively valid. In such cases, it is impossible for the conclusion of the argument to be false if the premises are true. Sometimes this relationship is described by saying that the premises of the argument already contain the conclusion; but this implausibly suggests that all such arguments commit the fallacy begging the question, which is usually said to occur when an argument assumes what it attempts to prove.
  4. The argument that we should not listen to the metaphysical arguments of someone who has accosted us, on the grounds that he is psychotically disturbed and doesn't know what he is taking about, is an instance of ad hominem, but it is not fallacious. Assuming these premises are true, this is reasonable practical advice.

In the wake of examples of this sort, careful attempts to retain fallacies as the focus of informal logic have either abandoned their references to some kinds of fallacies or been forced to note exceptional cases in which arguments have the form of fallacies, but cannot be rejected as fallacious.

Most informal logicians would still maintain that some fallacies (such as equivocation and false dilemma) merit pedagogical and theoretical attention. Even so, the problems with fallacy theory have convinced many that theories of informal logic should focus, not on fallacies, but on general criteria for good reasoning (premise acceptability and relevance, etc.) and on forms of good argument (i.e. reliable argument schema) which set standards for good reasoning. One attempt to use traditional fallacies as a way to define good argument schema (by treating ad hominem, guilt by association, appeals to ignorance, two wrongs reasoning, etc. as inherently good arguments) is found in Groarke and Tindale [2003]. Other authors do not go this far, but many have developed approaches to informal logic that place more emphasis on the identification of good appeals to authority, good arguments by analogy, and other argument schema, and on the construction of good arguments.

3. Rhetoric

In some ways, informal logic's attempt to identify general criteria for good reasoning, and its attempt to define positive argument schema that specify particular forms of good reasoning, implies an approach to argument which can be compared to the approach implicit in classical formal logic. The latter emphasizes general criteria for good argument (validity, soundness) and deductive argument schema which are usually encapsulated in formal rules of inference like modus ponens, double negation, modus tollens, etc.

Though this comparison usefully highlights some differences that distinguish fallacy and non-fallacy approaches to informal logic, there are important ways in which the latter differ from classical formal logic. Most significantly, informal logic is, as a discipline, characterized by a broad understanding of argument that extends beyond traditional logical concerns. It has been pushed in this direction by the dynamics of ordinary argument, which have forced informal logicians to focus on aspects of argument that have not been traditionally included within the realm of logic.

Classical logic suggests that a good argument is a sound argument, i.e., a valid argument with true premises. Though this conception of good argument usefully models many kinds of argument, its appeal to true premises is ill suited to many informal contexts, which are often characterized by hypothetical and uncertain beliefs; by deep disagreements about what is true and false; by ethical and aesthetic claims which are not easily categorized as true or false; and by variable contexts in which dramatically different assumptions may be accepted and rejected.

In such contexts, an arguer who hopes to persuade an audience of a particular point of view (usually the reason for arguing in the first place), must pay attention to the attitudes of the audience to whom the argument is directed. Even if they are true, premises which are not accepted by an audience will not convince them of an argument's conclusion. Tindale [1999] has, therefore, developed an approach to argument which considers and evaluates arguments from the point of view of the audience to which the argument is directed. He continues a tradition which characterizes Aristotelean rhetoric and which maintains that a good arguer appeals to the pathos of their audience.

Even if I believe that we should believe the Bible, and that it speaks out against capital punishment, the rhetorical approach points out that I will not, if I am a proficient arguer, use these claims as premises in an argument intended to convince a free-thinking audience that it should oppose capital punishment.

The interest in audience which is emphasized in some approaches to informal logic bridges a traditional divide between logic and rhetoric. Rhetoric and informal logic also share a mutual (though in the case of informal logic, relatively unexplored) interest in the role that character (or ethos) plays in determining whether an argument is convincing. Looked at from this point of view, one of the goals of argument should be a style of argument which convinces an audience that one is credible and trustworthy. Arguers who indulge in frequent insult and exaggeration are unlikely to achieve this goal, for their arguments undermine their own credibility, creating the impression that they are untrustworthy and unreliable.

4. Dialectics

Other aspects of argument which extend the scope of informal logic beyond that of classical logic include the dialectical obligations that attach to argument. These are obligations which are (implicitly or explicitly) situated within an exchange between parties who hold different points of view. In Manifest Rationality (Johnson [2000]), Johnson has argued for a set of dialectical obligations which emphasize an arguer's obligation to respond to (and anticipate) objections that might be raised by others engaged in the same dialectical exchange.

In keeping with this view, Johnson distinguishes between the illative core of an argument and its dialectical tier. The illative core consists of the premises offered in support of the conclusion. The dialectical tier is made up of alternative points of view, likely objections to the conclusion and the premises and whatever assumptions characterize debate about the conclusion. Johnson argues that logic has focused too much on the illative core of arguments, and that rationality requires that an arguer pay as much attention to its dialectical tier.

In an attempt to emphasize the dialectical tier, Johnson claims that all genuine arguments are dialectical and must, by definition, discharge dialectical obligations. On this account, a simple giving of reasons for some conclusion can be classified only as a "proto-argument." Other authors (e.g., Govier [1999] and Hitchcock [2003]) have taken issue with the extent of the emphasis this places on dialectical obligations, Johnson's work has made it is clear that some accounting of the dialectical aspects of argument must play a role in any attempt to establish a broad understanding of informal argument, and in this way must be included within the analyses that characterize informal logic.

5. The Components of Informal Logic

As a field of study and research, informal logic has moved beyond its initial commitment to fallacy theory, and now embraces a more complex and comprehensive attempt to understand the nature and assessment of informal arguments. Though a list of the issues that would have to be addressed in a fully comprehensive informal logic cannot be definitive, the present state of the discipline suggests that a comprehensive account of natural language argument will include the following components:

  1. an explanation of the rules of communication which argumentative exchange depends upon;
  2. a distinction between different kinds of dialogue in which argument may occur, and the ways in which they determine appropriate and inappropriate moves in argument (e.g. the difference between scientific discussion and the negotiation that characterizes collective bargaining);
  3. an account of logical consequence, which explains when it can be said (and what it means to say) that one sentence is a logical consequence of another;
  4. general criteria for good argument, which may be associated with a theory of logical consequence, and which specify general criteria for deductive, inductive, and conductive arguments;
  5. definitions of positive argument schema which define good patterns of reasoning (reasonable appeals to authority, reasonable attacks against the person; etc.);
  6. some theoretical account of fallacies and the role they can (and cannot) play in understanding and assessing informal arguments;
  7. an account of the role that audience (pathos) and ethos and other rhetorical notions should play in analysing and assessing argument;
  8. an explanation of the dialectical obligations that attach to arguments in particular kinds of contexts.

The issues and debates which presently characterize research in informal logic can be understood in terms of these components and their constituent parts. Some of them (e.g., the role of pathos in convincing argument) have been the focus of extensive study, while others (e.g., the theory of logical consequence, and the study of ethos) have not been emphasized in research to date. The many case studies which inform discussions in informal logic have been used in discussions of most of its components, though individual authors often focus on one component or another. Most significantly, some emphasize the dialectical aspects of argument, others study traditional logical components, and others focus on rhetorical concerns.

6. New Developments

One feature of informal logic which merits special comment is its attempt to extend its methods to contexts beyond those with which it was initially preoccupied. One significant attempt to move in this direction is found in Gilbert [1997]. Gilbert propounds a notion of coalescent argument, according to which arguments are to be understood as representatives of clusters of attitudes, beliefs, feelings and intuitions which characterize the arguer. According to this account, argumentative exchange aims to identify the points of agreement that characterize different (and possibly opposed) arguers, thereby bringing about the coalescence of their points of view.

As the coalescence Gilbert emphasizes can be brought about by emotional or physical means as well as reasons in the traditional sense (and sometimes more effectively by these means), Gilbert argues for forms of argument which are essentially emotional, intuitive (kisceral) and physical (visceral) rather than logical. According to his account, a hug, a forlorn look, or tears may therefore count as argument.

Gilbert's examples show that actions of this sort can play a decisive role in convincing others of particular points of view. But it remains unclear whether this requires the radical re-conception of argument his analysis proposes, for one can account for many of the moves that he identifies as arguments as non-verbal means of communicating propositions which function as premises in a relatively ordinary sense.

When a student, to take one of Gilbert's examples, cries in a professor's office in order to convey the importance he attaches to an A grade in a course, this might be understood as a non-verbal way of communicating the enthymematic argument "I will be terribly upset if I do not receive an A in this course; you should act in a way that doesn't leave me terribly upset; so you should give me an A grade." While it must be granted that this must be classified as an "emotional argument," it is not clear that it needs to be assessed by fundamentally different criteria than those that apply to other arguments. One might instead proceed in the standard way, by judging whether the premises are plausible or not, and whether they entail or make probable the conclusion.

Whatever criteria for assessment one applies to the kinds of examples Gilbert emphasizes, he does show that important realms of argument exist outside the verbal (and typically written) arguments that were the initial focus of studies in informal logic.

Another attempt to recognize these non-verbal realms of argument is found in studies of visual argument which attempt to understand and assess visual persuasion in the manner in which informal logic understands and assesses verbal arguments (see, e.g., Birdsell and Groarke [1996]; Blair [1996]; Collins and Schmid [1999]; Lunsford, Ruszkiewicz and Walters [2001]; Groarke [2002]; Shelley [2003]). Such studies suggest that many images function as a means of conveying premises and conclusions which can be understood and evaluated as visual arguments. The study of images of this sort is motivated by the same desire that has motivated the development of informal logic (i.e. the desire to have some means for understanding and assessing the informal argument and persuasion which surrounds us). Visual persuasion of this sort tends to be a standard feature of contemporary advertising, art, design, television, the world wide web, political commentary, and so on.

Theoretical debates about visual arguments revolve around the question whether it is possible to understand visual statements in a way that treats them as a visual analogue of propositions understood in a verbal way, for some such understanding is necessary if they are to be treated as premises and conclusions in the way that we understand premises and conclusions when we deal with the claims that make up verbal arguments. In future research, a more detailed account of visual argument will have to be based on a more detailed account of visual meaning which will explain how visual images can convey the kinds of propositions which are essential to arguments in the premise/conclusion sense.

A third attempt to extend the reach of informal logic is found in recent initiatives that use the models of argument developed by informal logicians as a basis for computational models that study interactions between agents in multi-agent systems or that mimic or assist human reasoning. Computational applications already include systems that reason about medical decisions, the law, chemical properties and complex systems (see, e.g., Carbogim et. al. [2000]; Prakken and Vreeswijk [2001];Reed [1997]; Reed and Long [1998]; Reed and Walton [2001]). Verheij [1999] has developed systems of automated argument assistance which function as computational aids that can assist in the generation of an argument (see his Automated Argument Assistance web site in Other Internet Resources below).

Insofar as informal logic remains an attempt to develop a logic that can be used to teach reasoning skills, and a discipline which is motivated by a desire to promote cogent reasoning as a public good, it and computational modelling will remain separate theoretical endeavours. That said, there is room for much collaborative work insofar as both depend on an understanding of the way that informal reasoning works and should be assessed. In the long run, work of this sort may be of historical importance to logic, insofar as it may reestablish links between formal and informal logic (links that will depend on more sophisticated logics than classical logic, which are more sensitive to the different facets of ordinary reasoning). The results could encourage the development of informal logic within a more integrated discipline that recognizes the differences between formal and informal logic, but recognizes an overarching model of reasoning that may reflect both endeavours.

7. Example One: Ad Hominem

As informal logic emphasizes the analysis and assessment of real arguments, the issues and approaches it encompasses can best be illustrated with examples. Consider, as a first instance, a comment taken from a Danish television debate over the question whether the Danish church should be separate from the Danish state (Jorgensen [1995], 369). At one point in this debate, the debater arguing against the separation of church and state declares to the audience that "My opponent wants to sever the Danish church from the state for his own personal sake. His motion is an attempt to take over the church and further his ecumenical theology by his usual mafia methods."

We can plausibly understand this remark as a simple argument that contains one premise and an implicit (sometimes called a "missing" or "hidden") conclusion. The premise (P) is the claim that "My opponent wishes to sever the Danish church from the state for the sake of his personal interests (in order to take it over and further his ecumenical theology by his usual mafia methods)." The implied conclusion (C) is the implicit claim that "We should (therefore) reject his motion to separate the Danish church and state."

Looked at from the point of view of the fallacy approach to informal logic, this is a classic case of ad hominem. Kahane [1995, 65], for example, describes ad hominem as a fallacy that occurs when an arguer is guilty "of attacking his opponent rather than his opponent's evidence and arguments." In this case, the debater in question attacks the motivation and the character of the person promoting a separate Danish church instead of showing what is wrong with his evidence for the claim that this is a good idea. On these grounds, the proposed reasoning is fallacious.

Though dialogical approaches to argument assume a different theoretical structure than fallacy theory, they invite a very similar analysis of this example. According to Van Eemeren and Grootendorst [1992], an instance of ad hominem is a violation of the first rule for critical discussion, which maintains that "Parties [to a dispute] must not prevent each other from advancing standpoints or casting doubts on arguments." Different kinds of ad hominem (abusive, tu quoque, and circumstantial ad hominem) are different violations of this rule. In this case, it suffices to say that the debater's attack on his opponent can be seen as an illegitimate attempt to deny him his right to make a case for his position.

Other approaches to informal logic are characterized by a more sympathetic attitude to ad hominem arguments which accepts that criticisms of an arguer (as opposed to their position) can be appropriate. One may, for example, reasonably cast doubt on an arguer's reasoning by pointing out that the arguer lacks the requisite knowledge to make appropriate judgments in the area in question, or by pointing out that the arguer has a vested interest. Such appeals play an important role in ordinary language reasoning, which typically occurs in contexts in which time constraints make it impossible to analyse carefully all the arguments presented, forcing us to decide which ones we pay attention to, often by relying on an assessment of the arguer.

Though this approach to ad hominem (which does not reject ad hominem arguments outright) makes ad hominem a form of reasoning which is acceptable in principle, it does not save the example in question, for this is a case in which the ad hominem is not founded on a credible criticism of the arguer. Instead, it relies on little more than insult. At best, one could claim that it forwards a heavy-handed and unsubstantiated charge of vested interest against the debater who advocates the separation of the Danish church and state. This is a charge which is particularly inappropriate in a debate which is designed as an opportunity to discuss the merits and demerits of the separation (and not the character of the debaters).

Another approach to ad hominem arguments which allows for ad hominem reasoning analyzes them from a rhetorical point of view, understanding them in terms of Aristotle's suggestion that the ethos of a speaker plays a crucial role in determining whether an argument is persuasive or not. According to this account, an ad hominem argument may be an effective (and from a rhetorical point of view, acceptable) attack on the ethos of an arguer, but not in the case in question, for it is not a credible attack. Indeed, one might argue that the intemperate nature of this particular ad hominem undermines, not the ethos of the person attacked, but the ethos of the speaker who has presented it.

8. Example Two: A Visual Argument

An example which can illustrate how the techniques of informal logic apply to visual images is found in the glossy advertisement for vodka reproduced below (it is a concocted example but one which has close affinities to actual advertisements). Under the title "Just Add Vodka" it features a bottle of vodka pouring its contents onto a sleepy hamlet. The time of day (dusk), the lack of activity, and the isolated lights at the borders of the image suggest a humdrum hamlet where there is nothing to do. This inactivity is further highlighted by the sharp contrast between the hamlet and the bustling city scape that has sprung up where the vodka splashes to the ground below. Unlike the hamlet, the latter boasts skyscrapers, lights, nightclubs, restaurants and an exciting nightlife.

vodka print ad

Understood literally, the image in question makes no sense. Bottles of vodka are not so absurdly large, and do not pour their contents on to sleepy villages. If they did the result would not be a Manhattan-like street scape.

The image must, in view of such considerations, not be understood literally, but as a visual metaphor. In this case, the message is clearly one of transformation, the vodka acting as the catalyst for the change. The message of the advertisement might be summarized as a visual proposition which can be paraphrased as the claim that "Vodka can transform a sleepy life into one full of cosmopolitan excitement." In the context of argumentation, one might usefully express this proposition as the conditional "If you add vodka to your life, your sleepy life will be transformed into a life of cosmopolitan excitement." It is appropriate to understand the proposition argumentatively, for in the context of an advertisement, this conditional is being offered as a reason (premise) for the implicit conclusion that "You should add vodka to your life (i.e. you should purchase vodka)."

This interpretation of the images suggests that it forwards a visual argument which contains a premise and conclusion that can be paraphrased as follows:

Premise 1: If you add vodka to your life, your sleepy life will be transformed into a life of cosmopolitan excitement.

Implicit Premise 2: A life of cosmopolitan excitement is desirable.

Conclusion: You should add vodka to your life (i.e. purchase vodka).

Once this implicit argument is recognized, it can be assessed in the way that we assess verbal arguments. An analysis of the argument may also wish to analyse its use of colours, its aesthetic qualities, etc., but not in a way that denies this core argument.

This approach to the image allows a more critical assessment of the image because it provides a basis for a critical rejection of the argument it presents. To begin with, it is obvious that premise 1 can be questioned, for one might question the claim that the consumption of vodka produces an exciting cosmopolitan life (it may instead produce alcohol-related problems).

Having recognized premises 1 and 2 and the conclusion, we can go further, and recognize the argument as an instance of a variant of the affirming the consequent fallacy, though a normative variant which points out that "If X then Y" and "Y is desirable" do not allow one to conclude that "X is desirable." The unacceptability of such arguments might be demonstrated with many examples, as with the argument "If all sex acts were eliminated, we would eliminate sexually transmitted diseases. The elimination of sexually transmitted disease is desirable. Therefore the elimination of all sex acts is desirable."

Insofar as the visual argument in the image can be recognized in this way as an analogue of verbal arguments, it can be understood as a visual argument which can be assessed and evaluated using the concepts and the tools of informal logic. In this way, the evaluation of the meaning of an image can be made a matter of systematic examination and critical inquiry which goes beyond aesthetic assessment. One might, therefore, argue that the image is an impressive one from an aesthetic point of view, but still criticize it as an image which conveys a fallacious argument with questionable premises and debatable assumptions. It is in this way that analyses of visual argument allow informal logic to promote a more critical approach to visual as well as verbal argument.

9. Relationship to Philosophy

Philosophy and philosophers continue to play the defining role in the evolution of informal logic, though they have increasingly attempted to incorporate developments in cognate disciplines such as Communication Studies, Rhetoric and Artificial Intelligence. Within writings on informal logic, one may distinguish two distinct attitudes to philosophical considerations. On the one hand, the work of some commentators suggests that philosophy is the core element of informal logic. The paradigm example of such a view is found in Johnson [2000], which argues that a comprehensive account of argument must be built upon a philosophical account of rationality.

An alternative view suggests that informal logic's relationship to philosophy is more comparable to the relationship that exists between formal logic and the philosophy of logic. According to this view, informal logic may (at least in many instances) be developed independently of philosophical considerations. According to this approach, the development of the means to analyse and assess ordinary argument can take place independently of a consideration of many of the philosophical questions which might be raised about its ultimate justification and its philosophical implications (see Groarke [2001]). Such a view suggests that we should distinguish between informal logic and the philosophy of informal logic, separating the development of our understanding of day-to-day reasoning from the attempt to provide a philosophical account of it.

However one understands the role of philosophy within informal logic, it can be said that informal logic has ties to a variety of other philosophical endeavours which extend beyond its immediate concerns. The natural connections between informal logic and epistemology are evident in Goldman [1999], who attempts to defend an account of knowledge and the acquisition of knowledge which situates knowledge within social interactions that take place within interpersonal exchange and knowledge institutions. This allows him to evaluate social practices in terms of their veritistic value (i.e., their tendency to produce states like knowledge, error and ignorance). In the process, his account devotes considerable attention to the practice of argumentation, and the constraints which make it a practice which is to be valued because it produces positive veritistic results. In doing so, he draws on work in informal logic and reflects its interest in both monological and dialogical argumentation, and in a broad understanding of argument that incorporates rhetorical and dialectical responsibilities.

In this and other ways, informal logic's attempt to model informal reasoning reflects, and has important implications for, philosophical concerns about the nature of rationality, the nature of the mind and its processes, the standards of good reasoning, the value of logic and rhetoric, and the social, political and epistemological role of reasoning and argument. In many ways, the discussion of informal logic's ties to philosophy of mind, ethics and epistemology, has just begun. A more extensive exploration of these ties is likely to be one significant aspect of research in informal logic in the future.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotle: rhetoric | fallacies: medieval theories of | logic: classical

Copyright © 2002
Leo Groarke

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