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Laws of Nature

Science includes many principles once thought to be laws of nature: Newton's law of gravitation, his three laws of motion, the ideal gas laws, Mendel's laws, the laws of supply and demand, and so on. Philosophers of science and metaphysicians address various issues about laws of nature, but the basic question is: What is it to be a law? Two influential answers are David Lewis's systems approach (1973, 1983, 1986, 1994) and David Armstrong's universals approach (1978, 1983, 1991, 1993). More recent treatments include views on which there no laws (van Fraassen 1989, Giere 1999) and antireductionist views (Carroll 1994, Lange 2000). Besides the basic question, the recent literature has also focused on (i) discussions of the role laws play in the problem of induction, (ii) whether laws involve metaphysical necessity, and (iii) the role laws have in scientific practice, especially the practice of physics as it contrasts with the practice of the other sciences.

1. The Basic Question: What is it to be a Law?

Here are four reasons philosophers examine what it is to be a law of nature: First, laws at least appear to have a central role in scientific practice. Second, laws are important to many other philosophical issues. The account of counterfactual conditionals defended by Roderick Chisholm (1946, 1955) and Nelson Goodman (1947) and the deductive-nomological model of explanation advanced by Carl Hempel and Paul Oppenheim (1948) sparked the literature on laws. Philosophers have wondered what makes counterfactual and explanatory claims true, have thought that laws must play some part, and so also have wondered what distinguishes laws from nonlaws. Third, Goodman famously suggested that there is a connection between lawhood and confirmability by an inductive inference. So, some sympathetic to Goodman's idea come to the problem of laws as a result of their interest in the problem of induction. Fourth, philosophers love a good puzzle. Suppose that everyone here is seated (cf., Langford 1941, 67). Then, trivially, that everyone here is seated is true. Though true, this generalization does not seem to be a law. It is just too accidental. Einstein's principle that no signals travel faster than light is also a true generalization but, in contrast, it is thought to be a law; it is not nearly so accidental. What makes the difference?

This may not seem like much of a puzzle. That everyone here is seated is spatially restricted in that it is about a specific place; the principle of relativity is not similarly restricted. So, it is easy to think that, unlike laws, accidentally true generalizations are about specific places. But that's not what makes the difference. There are true nonlaws that are not spatially restricted. Consider the unrestricted generalization that all gold spheres are less than one mile in diameter. There are no gold spheres that size and in all likelihood there never will be, but this is still not a law. There also appear to be generalizations that could express laws that are restricted. Galileo's law of free fall is the generalization that, on Earth, free-falling bodies accelerate at a rate of 9.8 meters per second squared.

The perplexing nature of the puzzle is clearly revealed when the gold-sphere generalization is paired with a remarkably similar generalization about uranium spheres:

All gold spheres are less than a mile in diameter.

All uranium spheres are less than a mile in diameter.

Though the former is not a law, the latter arguably is. The latter is not nearly so accidental as the first, since uranium's critical mass is such as to guarantee that such a large sphere will never exist (van Fraassen 1989, 27). What makes the difference? What makes the former an accidental generalization and the latter a law?

2. Systems

One popular answer ties being a law to deductive systems. The idea dates back to John Stuart Mill (1947 [f.p. 1843]), but has been defended in one form or another by Frank Ramsey (1978 [f.p. 1928]), David Lewis (1973, 1983, 1986, 1994), John Earman (1984) and Barry Loewer (1996). Deductive systems are individuated by their axioms. The logical consequences of the axioms are the theorems. Some true deductive systems will be stronger than others; some will be simpler than others. These two virtues, strength and simplicity, compete. (It is easy to make a system stronger by sacrificing simplicity: include all the truths as axioms. It is easy to make a system simple by sacrificing strength: have just the axiom that 2 + 2 = 4.) According to Lewis (1973, 73), the laws of nature belong to all the true deductive systems with a best combination of simplicity and strength. So, for example, the thought is that it is a law that all uranium spheres are less than a mile in diameter because it is, arguably, part of the best deductive systems; quantum theory is an excellent theory of our universe and might be part of the best systems, and it is plausible to think that quantum theory plus truths describing the nature of uranium would logically entail that there are no uranium spheres of that size (Loewer 1996, 112). It is doubtful that the generalization that all gold spheres are less than a mile in diameter would be part of the best systems. It could be added as an axiom to any system, but not without sacrificing something in terms of simplicity. (Lewis later made significant revisions to his account in order to address problems involving physical probability. See his 1986 and his 1994.)

Many features of the systems approach are appealing. For one thing, it appears to deal with a challenge posed by vacuous laws. Some laws are vacuously true: Newton's first law of motion — that all inertial bodies have no acceleration — is a law, even though there are no inertial bodies. But there are also lots of vacuously true nonlaws: all plaid pandas weigh 5 lbs., all unicorns are unmarried, etc. With the systems approach, there is no exclusion of vacuous generalizations from the realm of laws, and yet only those vacuous generalizations that belong to the best systems qualify (cf., Earman 1978, 180; Lewis 1986, 123). Furthermore, it is reasonable to think that one goal of scientific theorizing is the formulation of true theories that are well balanced in terms of their simplicity and strength. So, the systems approach seems to underwrite the truism that an aim of science is the discovery of laws of nature (Earman 1978, 197; Loewer 1996, 112). One last aspect of the systems view that is appealing to many (though not all) is that it is in keeping with broadly Humean constraints on an account of lawhood. There is no overt appeal to closely related modal concepts (e.g., the counterfactual conditional) and no overt appeal to modality-supplying entities (e.g., possible worlds or universals). Indeed, the systems approach was the centerpiece of Lewis's defense of the principle he called Humean supervenience, "the doctrine that all there is in the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of particular fact, just one little thing and then another" (1986, ix).

Other features of the systems approach have made philosophers wary. (See, especially, Armstrong 1983, 66-73; van Fraassen 1989, 40-64; Carroll 1990, 197-206.) Some argue that this approach will have the untoward consequence that laws are inappropriately mind-dependent in virtue of the account's appeal to the concepts of simplicity, strength and best-balance, concepts whose application seems to depend on cognitive abilities, interests, and purposes. The appeal to simplicity raises further questions stemming from the apparent need for a regimented language to permit reasonable comparisons of the systems. Interestingly, sometimes the view is abandoned because it satisfies the broadly Humean constraints on an account of laws of nature; some argue that what generalizations are laws is not determined by local matters of particular fact.

3. Universals

In the late 1970s, there emerged competition for the systems approach and all other Humean attempts to say what it is to be a law. Led by David Armstrong (1978, 1983, 1991, 1993), Fred Dretske (1977), and Michael Tooley (1977, 1987), the rival approach appeals to universals to distinguish laws from nonlaws.

Focusing on Armstrong's development of the view, here is one of his concise statements of the framework characteristic of the universals approach:

Suppose it to be a law that Fs are Gs. F-ness and G-ness are taken to be universals. A certain relation, a relation of non-logical or contingent necessitation, holds between F-ness and G-ness. This state of affairs may be symbolized as ‘N(F,G)’ (1983, 85).
This framework promises to address familiar puzzles and problems: Maybe the difference between the uranium-spheres generalization and the gold-spheres generalization is that being uranium does necessitate being less than one mile in diameter, but being gold does not. Worries about the subjective nature of simplicity, strength and best balance do not emerge; there is no threat of lawhood being mind-dependent so long as necessitation is not mind-dependent. Some (Armstrong 1991, Dretske 1977) think that the framework supports the idea that laws play a special explanatory role in inductive inferences, since a law is not just a universal generalization, but is an entirely different creature — a relation holding between two other universals. The framework is also consistent with lawhood not supervening on local matters of particular fact; adoption of some nonsupervenience thesis often accompanies acceptance of the universals approach.

For there truly to be this payoff, however, more has to be said about what N is. This is the first of the two problems Bas van Fraassen calls the identification problem and the inference problem (1989, 96). The essence of these two problems was captured early on by David Lewis with his usual flair:

Whatever N may be, I cannot see how it could be absolutely impossible to have N(F,G) and Fa without Ga. (Unless N just is constant conjunction, or constant conjunction plus something else, in which case Armstrong's theory turns into a form of the regularity theory he rejects.) The mystery is somewhat hidden by Armstrong's terminology. He uses ‘necessitates’ as a name for the lawmaking universal N; and who would be surprised to hear that if F ‘necessitates’ G and a has F, then a must have G? But I say that N deserves the name of ‘necessitation’ only if, somehow, it really can enter into the requisite necessary connections. It can't enter into them just by bearing a name, any more than one can have mighty biceps just by being called ‘Armstrong’ (1983, 366).
Basically, there needs to be a specification of what the lawmaking relation is (the identification problem). Then, there needs to be a determination of whether it is suited to the task (the inference problem): Does N's holding between F and G entail that Fs are Gs? Does its holding support corresponding counterfactuals? Do laws really turn out not to supervene, to be mind-independent, to be explanatory?

Armstrong does say more about what his lawmaking relation is. He states in reply to van Fraassen:

It is at this point that, I claim, the Identification problem has been solved. The required relation is the causal relation, ... now hypothesized to relate types not tokens (1993, 422).
Yet, questions remain about the nature of this causal relation understood as a relation that relates both token events and universals. (See van Fraassen 1993, 435-437, and Carroll 1994, 170-174.) Others resist Armstrong's approach because of its ontological commitment to universals and the semantic and epistemological problems some associate with a rejection of supervenience. (See Loewer 1996, Beebee 2000.)

4. Other Approaches

There are many, many attempts to say what it is to be a law of nature in the contemporary philosophical literature. Not all can be covered here. Robert Pargetter's (1984) possible worlds account (also see Bigelow and Pargetter 1990, 214-262) and Simon Blackburn's (1984 and 1986) noncognitivism (also see Ward 2002) are just two important examples of interesting views that are left out. Nevertheless, there are two views, put forward in the wake of the universals and systems approaches, that have gained prominence. They have not yet had the influence of David Lewis's and David Armstrong's views, but deserve brief mention.

4.1 No Laws

The majority of contemporary philosophers agree on the reality of laws; they believe that there are laws of nature. There are, however, philosophers who disagree on this point. For example, Bas van Fraassen and also Ronald Giere believe that there are no laws. Van Fraassen finds support for his view in the problems facing accounts like Lewis's and Armstrong's, and the perceived failure of Armstrong and others to describe an adequate epistemology that permits rational belief in laws (van Fraassen 1989, 130 and 180-181). Giere finds support for his view in the origins of the use of the concept of law of nature in the history of science (1999 [f.p. 1995], 86-90) and in his belief that the generalizations often described as laws are not in fact true (90-91). The challenge for these theorists is accounting for the apparent role laws play in scientific practice and the havoc lawless reality would play on common-sense ontology given lawhood's close conceptual ties to other nomic concepts, concepts like the counterfactual conditional, explanation, and causation. (See Carroll 1994, 88-102.)

4.2 No Reductive Analysis

John Carroll (1994) and Marc Lange (2000) advocate antireductionist views. (Also see Woodward 1992.) Regarding the question of what it is to be a law of nature, they reject the answers given by Humeans like Lewis, and see no advantage in an appeal to universals. They reject all attempts to say what it is to be a law that do not appeal to nomic concepts. Yet they still believe that there are laws of nature; they are not eliminativists a la Giere and van Fraassen. Carroll's focus is on arguing for the nonsupervenience of lawhood on the nonnomic concepts and highlighting the interconnections between lawhood and other concepts. Lange's treatment includes an account of what it is to be a law in terms of a counterfactual notion of stability. The challenges to antireductionism appear to be developing around specific challenges to the nonsupervenience arguments (Roberts 1998), and around semantic and epistemological concerns similar to those leveled against the universals approach. (Once again, see Loewer 1996 and Beebee 2000.)

5. Induction

Goodman thought that the difference between laws of nature and accidental truths was linked inextricably with the problem of induction. In his "The New Riddle of Induction" (1983, [f.p. 1954], 73), Goodman says,
Only a statement that is lawlike — regardless of its truth or falsity or its scientific importance — is capable of receiving confirmation from an instance of it; accidental statements are not.
(Terminology: P is lawlike if and only if P is a law if true.) Goodman claims that, if a generalization is accidental (and so not lawlike), then it is not capable of receiving confirmation from one of its instances.

This has prompted much discussion, including some challenges. For example, suppose there are ten flips of a fair coin, and that the first nine land heads (Dretske 1977, 256-257). The first nine instances — at least in a sense — confirm the generalization that all the flips will land heads; the probability of that generalization is raised from (.5)10 up to .5. But, this generalization is not lawlike; if true, it is not a law. It is standard to respond to such an example by arguing that this is not the pertinent notion of confirmation (that it is mere "content-cutting") and by suggesting that what does require lawlikeness is confirmation of the generalization's unexamined instances. Notice that, in the coin case, the probability that the tenth flip will land heads does not change after the first nine flips land heads. There are, however, examples that generate problems for this idea too.

Suppose the room contains one hundred men and suppose you ask fifty of them whether they are third sons and they reply that they are; surely it would be reasonable to at least increase somewhat your expectation that the next one you ask will also be a third son (Jackson and Pargetter 1980, 423)

It does no good to revise the claim to say that no generalization believed to be accidental is capable of confirmation. About the third-son case, one would know that the generalization, even if true, would not be a law. The discussion continues. Frank Jackson and Robert Pargetter have proposed an alternative connection between confirmation and laws on which certain counterfactual truths must hold: my observations of these As that are F and B confirms that all non-F As are Bs only if the As would still have been both A and B if they had not been F. This suggestion is criticized by Elliott Sober. See his (1988, 97-98). Marc Lange (2000, 111-142) uses a different strategy. He tries to refine further the relevant notion of confirmation, characterizing what he takes to be an intuitive notion of inductive confirmation, and then contends that only generalizations that are not believed not to be lawlike can be (in his sense) inductively confirmed.

Sometimes the idea that laws have a special role to play in induction serves as the starting point for a criticism of Humean analyses. Fred Dretske (1977, 261-262) and David Armstrong (1983, 52-59, and 1991) adopt a model of inductive inference on which it involves an inference to the best explanation. (Also see Foster 1983.) On its simplest construal, the model describes a pattern that begins with an observation of instances of a generalization, includes an inference to the corresponding law (this is the inference to the best explanation), and concludes with an inference to the generalization itself or to its unobserved instances. The complaint lodged against Humeans is that, on their view of what laws are, laws are not suited to explain their instances and so cannot sustain the required inference to the best explanation.

This is an area where work on laws needs to be done. Armstrong and Dretske make substantive claims on what can and can't be instance confirmed: Roughly, Humean laws can't, laws-as-universals can. But, at the very least, these claims cannot be quite right. Humean laws can't? As the discussion above illustrates, Sober, Lange and others have argued that even generalizations known to be accidental can be confirmed by their instances. Dretske and Armstrong need some plausible and suitably strong premise connecting lawhood to confirmability and it is not clear that there is one to be had. Here is the basic problem: As many authors have noticed (e.g., Sober 1988, 98; van Fraassen 1987, 255), the confirmation of a hypothesis or its unexamined instances will always be sensitive to what background beliefs are in place. So much so, with background beliefs of the right sort, just about anything can be confirmed irrespective of its status as a law or whether it is lawlike. Thus, stating a plausible principle describing the connection between laws of nature and the problem of induction will be difficult. In order to uncover a nomological constraint on induction, something needs to be said about the role of background beliefs.

6. Necessity

Philosophers have generally held that some contingently true propositions are (or could be) laws of nature. Furthermore, they have thought that, if it is a law that all Fs are Gs, then there need not be any (metaphysically) necessary connection between F-ness and G-ness, that it is possible that something be F without being G. For example, any possible world that as a matter of law obeys the general principles of Newtonian physics is a world in which Newton's first is true and a world containing accelerating inertial bodies is a world in which Newton's first is false. The latter world is also a world where being inertial is instantiated but does not necessitate no acceleration. Some necessitarians, however, hold that all laws of nature are necessary truths. (See Shoemaker 1980 and 1998, Swoyer 1982, and Fales 1990.) Others have held something that is only slightly different. Maintaining that some laws are singular statements about universals, they allow that some laws are contingently true. So, on this view, an F-ness/G-ness law could be false if F-ness does not exist. Still, this difference really is minor. These authors think that, for there to be an F-ness/G-ness law, it must be necessarily true that all Fs are Gs. (See Tweedale 1984, Bigelow, Ellis, and Lierse 1992, and Ellis and Lierse 1994.)

Two reasons are traditionally given for believing that being a law does not depend on any necessary connection between properties. The first is the conceivability of it being a law in one possible world that all Fs are Gs even though there is another world with an F that is not G. The second is that there are laws of the form that all Fs are Gs that can only be discovered in an a posteriori manner. If necessity is always associated with laws of nature, then it is not clear why scientists can't always get by with a priori methods. Naturally, these two traditional reasons are often challenged. The necessitarians argue that conceivability is not a guide to possibility. They also appeal to Saul Kripke's (1972) arguments meant to reveal certain a posteriori necessary truths, suggesting that the a posteriori nature of some laws does not prevent their lawhood from depending on a necessary connection. In further support of their own view, the necessitarians often argue that their position is a consequence of the correct theory of the individuation of properties. Roughly, mass just would not be the property it is unless it had the causal powers it does, and hence obeyed the laws that it does. As they see it, it is also a virtue of their position that they can explain why laws of nature are counterfactual supporting: They support counterfactuals in the same way that the truths of logic and mathematics do (Swoyer 1982, 209; Fales 1990, 85-87).

7. Physics and the Special Sciences

Two separate (but related) questions have received much recent attention in the philosophical literature surrounding laws of nature. Neither has much to do with what it is to be a law. First: Do any scientists try to discover exceptionless regularities in their attempts to discover the laws? Second, could there be any special-science laws?

7.1 Do Physicists try to discover Exceptionless Regularities?

Philosophers draw a distinction between strict generalizations and ceteris-paribus generalizations. (‘Ceteris paribus’ is Latin for ‘other things being equal’.) The contrast is supposed to be between universal generalizations of the sort discussed above (e.g., that all inertial bodies have no acceleration) and seemingly less formal generalizations like that, other things being equal, smoking causes cancer. The idea is that the former would be contradicted by a single counterinstance, say, one accelerating inertial body, though the latter is consistent with there being one smoker who never gets cancer. Though in theory this distinction is easy enough to understand, in practice it is often difficult to distinguish strict from ceteris-paribus generalizations. This is because many philosophers think that many utterances which include no explicit ceteris-paribus clause implicitly do include such a clause.

A few philosophers, however, are doubtful that there are exceptionless regularities even at the level of fundamental physics. For example, Nancy Cartwright has argued that the descriptive and the explanatory aspects of laws of nature conflict. "Rendered as descriptions of fact, they are false; amended to be true, they lose their fundamental explanatory force" (1980, 75). Consider Newton's gravitational principle, F = Gmm′/r2. Properly understood, according to Cartwright, it says that for any two bodies the force between them is Gmm′/r2. But if that is what the law says then the law is not an exceptionless regularity. This is because the force between two bodies is influenced by other things than just their mass and the distance between them, e.g. the charge of the two bodies as described by Coulomb's law. The statement of the gravitational principle can be amended to make it true, but that, according to Cartwright, at least on certain standard ways of doing so, would strip it of its explanatory power. For example, if the principle is taken to hold only that F = Gmm′/r2 if there are no forces other than gravitational forces at work, then though it would be true it would not apply except in idealized circumstances. Lange (1993) uses a different example to make a similar point. Consider a standard expression of the law of thermal expansion: “Whenever the temperature of a metal bar of length L0 changes by T, the length of the bar changes by L = kL0T”, where k is a constant, the thermal expansion coefficient of the metal. If this expression were used to express the strict generalization straightforwardly suggested by its grammar, then such an utterance would be false since the length of a bar does not change in the way described in cases where someone is hammering on its ends. It looks like the law will require provisos, but so many that the only apparent way of taking into consideration all the required provisos would be with something like a ceteris-paribus clause. Then, the concern becomes that the statement would be empty. Because of the difficulty of stating plausible truth conditions for ceteris-paribus sentences, it is feared that “Other things being equal, L = kL0T” could only mean “L = kL0T provided that L = kL0T”.

Even those who agree with the arguments of Lange and Cartwright sometimes disagree about what ultimately the arguments say about laws of nature. Cartwright believes that the true laws of nature are not exceptionless regularities, but instead are statements that describe causal powers. So construed they turnout to be both true and explanatory. Lange ends up holding that there are propositions properly adopted as laws though in doing so one need not also believe any exceptionless regularity; there need not be one. Ronald Giere (1999) can usefully be interpreted as agreeing with Cartwright's and Lange's basic arguments but insisting that law-statements don't have implicit provisos or implicit ceteris-paribus clauses. So, he concludes that there are no laws.

John Earman and John Roberts hold that there are exceptionless and lawful regularities. More precisely, they argue that scientists doing fundamental physics do attempt to state strict generalizations that are such that they would be strict laws if they were true:

Our claim is only that ... typical theories from fundamental physics are such that if they were true, there would be precise proviso free laws. For example, Einstein's gravitational field law asserts — without equivocation, qualification, proviso, ceteris paribus clause — that the Ricci curvature tensor of spacetime is proportional to the total stress-energy tensor for matter-energy; the relativistic version of Maxwell's laws of electromagnetism for charge-free flat spacetime asserts — without qualification or proviso — that the curl of the E field is proportional to the partial time derivative, etc. (1999, 446).
About Cartwright's gravitational example, they think (473, fn. 14) that a plausible understanding of the gravitational principle is as describing only the gravitational force between the two massive bodies. (Cartwright argues that there is no such component force and so thinks such an interpretation would be false. Earman and Roberts disagree.) About Lange's example, they think the law should be understood as having the single proviso that there be no external stresses on the metal bar (461). In any case, much more would need to be said to establish that all the apparently strict and explanatory generalizations that have been or will be stated by physicists have turned or will turn out to be false.

7.2 Could there be any Special-Science Laws?

Supposing that physicists do try to discover exceptionless regularities, and even supposing that our physicists will sometimes be successful, there is a further question of whether it is a goal of any science other than fundamental physics — any so-called special science — to discover exceptionless regularities and whether these scientists have any hope of succeeding. Consider an economic law of supply and demand that says that, when demand increases and supply is held fixed, price increases. Notice that, in some places, the price of gasoline has sometimes remained the same despite an increase of demand and a fixed supply, because the price of gasoline was government regulated. It appears that the law has to be understood as having a ceteris-paribus clause in order for it to be true. This problem is a very general one. As Fodor (1989, 78) has pointed out, in virtue of being stated in a vocabulary of a special science, it is very likely that there will be limiting conditions — especially underlying physical conditions — that will undermine any interesting strict generalization of the special sciences, conditions that themselves could not be described in the special-science vocabulary. Donald Davidson prompted much of the recent interest in special-science laws with his "Mental Events" (1980 [f.p. 1970], 207-225). He gave an argument specifically directed against the possibility of strict psycho-physical laws. More importantly, he made the suggestion that the absence of such laws may be relevant to whether mental events ever cause physical events. This prompted a slew of papers dealing with the problem of reconciling the absence of strict special-science laws with the reality of mental causation (e.g., Lepore and Loewer 1987 and 1989, Fodor 1989, Schiffer 1991, Pietroski and Rey 1995).


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causation: the metaphysics of | conditionals: counterfactual | determinism: causal | Hume, David | induction: problem of | metaphysics | possible worlds | probability, interpretations of | properties | science, philosophy of | supervenience

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