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The Analysis of Knowledge

The objective of the analysis of knowledge is to state the conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for propositional knowledge: knowledge that such-and-such is the case. Propositional knowledge must be distinguished from two other kinds of knowledge that fall outside the scope of the analysis: knowing a place or a person, and knowing how to do something. The concept to be analyzed -- the analysandum -- is commonly expressed using the schema "S knows that p", where "S" refers to the knowing subject, and "p" to the proposition that is known. A proposed analysis consists of a statement of the following form: S knows that p if and only if -- . The blank is to be replaced by the analysans: a list of conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient. To test whether a proposed analysis is correct, we must ask (a) whether every possible case in which the conditions listed in the analysans are met is a case in which S knows that p, and (b) whether every possible case in which S knows that p is a case in which each of these conditions is met. When we ask (a), we wish to find out whether the proposed analysans is sufficient for S's knowing that p; when we ask (b), we wish to determine whether each of the conditions listed in the analysans is necessary.

1. Knowledge as Justified True Belief

According to the following analysis, which is usually referred to as the "JTB" account, knowledge is justified true belief.

The JTB Analysis of Knowledge:
S knows that p iff
    (i) p is true;
    (ii) S believes that p;
    (iii) S is justified in believing that p.

Condition (i), the truth condition, enjoys nearly universal assent, and thus has not generated any significant degree of discussion. It is overwhelmingly clear that what is false cannot be known. For example, it is false that G. E. Moore is the author of Sense and Sensibilia. Since it is false, it is not the sort of thing anybody can know.

1.1 The Belief Condition

Unlike the truth condition, condition (ii), the belief condition, has generated at least some discussion. Although initially it might seems obvious that knowing that p requires believing that p, some philosophers have argued that knowledge without belief is indeed possible. Suppose Walter comes home after work to find out that his house has burned down. He utters the words "I don't believe it." Critics of the belief condition might argue that Walter knows that his house has burned down (he sees that it has), but, as his words indicate, he does not believe it. Therefore, there is knowledge without belief. To this objection, there is an effective reply. What Walter wishes to convey by saying "I don't believe it" is not that he really does not believe what he sees with his own eyes, but rather that he finds it hard to come to terms with what he sees.

A more serious counterexample has been suggested by Colin Radford.[1] Suppose Albert is quizzed on English history. One of the questions is: When did Queen Elizabeth die?" Albert doesn't think he knows, but answers the question correctly. Moreover, he gives correct answers to many other question to which he didn't think he knew the answer. Let us focus on Albert's answer to the question about Elizabeth:

(E) Elizabeth died in 1603.

Radford makes the following two claims about this example:

    (a) Albert does not believe (E). Reason: He thinks he doesn't know the answer to the question. He doesn't trust his answer because he takes it to be a mere guess.
    (b) Albert knows (E). Reason: His answer is not at all just a lucky guess. The fact that he answers most of the questions correctly indicates that he has actually learned, and never forgotten, the basic facts of English history.

Since he takes (a) and (b) to be true, Radford would argue that knowledge without belief is indeed possible. How would an advocate of the JTB account respond to Radford's proposed counterexample? Their response would be, in short, that this is not a case of knowledge without belief because it isn't a case of knowledge to begin with. Albert doesn't know (E) because he has no justification for believing (E). If he were to believe (E), his belief would be unjustified. This reply anticipates what we have not yet discussed: the necessity of the justification condition. Let us first discuss why friends of JTB hold that knowledge requires justification, and then discuss in greater detail why they would not accept Radford's alleged counterexample.

1.2 The Justification Condition

Why is condition (iii) necessary? Why not say that knowledge is true belief? The standard answer is that to identify knowledge with true belief would be implausible because a belief that is true just because of luck does not qualify as knowledge. Beliefs that are lacking justification are false more often than not. However, on occasion, such beliefs happen to be true. Suppose William takes a medication that has the following side effect: it causes him to be overcome with irrational fears. One of his fears is that he has cancer. This fear is so powerful that he starts believing it. Suppose further that, by sheer coincidence, he does have cancer. So his belief is true. Clearly, though, his belief does not amount to knowledge. But why not? Most epistemologists would agree that William does not know because his belief's truth is due to luck (bad luck, in this case). Let us refer to a belief's turning out to be true because of mere luck as epistemic luck.It is uncontroversial that knowledge is incompatible with epistemic luck. What, though, is needed to rule out epistemic luck? Advocates of the JTB account would say that what is needed is justification. A true belief, if an instance of knowledge and thus not true because of epistemic luck, must be justified.[2] But what is it for a belief to be justified?

Among the philosophers who favor the JTB approach, we find bewildering disagreement on how this question is to be answered. According to one prominent view, typically referred to as "evidentialism", a belief is justified if, and only if, it fits the subject's evidence.[3] Evidentialists, then, would say that the reason why knowledge is not the same as true belief is that knowledge requires evidence. Opponents of evidentialism would say that evidentialist justification (i.e., having adequate evidence) is not needed to rule out epistemic luck. They would argue that what is needed instead is a suitable relation between the belief and the mental process that brought it about. What we are looking at here is an important disagreement about the nature of knowledge, which will be our main focus further below. In the meantime, we will continue our examination of the JTB analysis.

Let us return to Radford's counterexample to the belief condition, which we considered above. We are now in a position to discuss further the reply to it. Recall that Albert does not take himself to know the answer to the question about the date of Elizabeth's death. He does not because he has does not remember having learned the basic facts of British history. Now, it is of course true that he did learn these facts, and is indeed able to recall them. But is this by itself sufficient for knowing them? Philosophers who think that knowledge requires evidence would say that it is not. Albert needs to have evidence for believing that he learned those facts. Until he is quizzed, he has no such evidence. After the quiz, when he is told that most of his answers were correct, he does have the requisite evidence. For once he comes to know that he is able to produce consistently correct answers to the questions he is asked, he has acquired evidence for believing that he must have learned this subject matter at school. This evidence is also evidence for the answers he has given. So at that point, the justification condition is met, and thus (since the other conditions of knowledge are also met) he knows (again) that Elizabeth died in 1603. However, he did not know this before he finds out that he must have learned those facts, for at that point his answer to the question lacked justification, and thus did not add up to knowledge. Evidentialists would deny, therefore, that Radford has supplied us with a counterexample to the belief condition.[4]

2. The Gettier Problem

In his short 1963 paper, "Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?", Edmund Gettier presented two effective counterexamples to the JTB analysis.[5] The second of these goes as follows. Suppose Smith has good evidence for the false proposition

(1) Jones owns a Ford.[6]

Suppose further Smith infers from (1) the following three disjunctions:

(2) Either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Boston.
(3) Either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona.
(4) Either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Brest-Litovsk.

Since (1) entails each of the propositions (2) through (4), and since Smith recognizes these entailments, he is justified in believing each of propositions (2)-(4). Now suppose that, by sheer coincidence, Brown is indeed in Barcelona. Given these assumptions, in believing (3), Smith holds a justified true belief. However, is it an instance of knowledge? Since Smith has no evidence whatever as to Brown's whereabouts, and believes what is true only because of luck, the answer would have to be ‘no’. Consequently, the three conditions of the JTB account -- truth, belief, and justification -- are not sufficient for knowledge.[7] How must the analysis of knowledge be modified to make it immune to cases like the one we just considered? This is what is commonly referred to as the "Gettier problem".

Epistemologists who think that the JTB approach is basically on the right track must choose between two different strategies for solving the Gettier problem. The first is to strengthen the justification condition. This was attempted by Roderick Chisholm.[8] The second strategy is to search for a suitable further condition, a condition that would, so to speak, "degettierize" justified true belief. Let us focus on this second strategy. According to one suggestion, the following fourth condition would do the trick:

(iv) S's belief that p is not inferred from any falsehood.[9]

Unfortunately, this proposal is unsuccessful. Since Gettier cases need not involve any inference, there are possible cases of justified true belief in which the subject fails to have knowledge although condition (iv) is met. Suppose, for example, that James, who is relaxing on a bench in a park, observes a dog that, about 8 yards away from him, is chewing on a bone. So he believes

(5) There is a dog over there.

Suppose further that what he takes to be a dog is actually a robot dog so perfect that, by vision alone, it could not be distinguished from an actual dog. James does not know that such robot dogs exist. But in fact a Japanese toy manufacturer has recently developed them, and what James sees is a prototype that is used for testing the public's response. Given these assumptions, (5) is of course false. But suppose further that just a few feet away from the robot dog, there is a real dog. Sitting behind a bush, he is concealed from James's view. Given this further assumption, James's belief is true. So once again, what we have before us is a justified true belief that doesn't qualify as an instance of knowledge. Arguably, this belief is directly justified by a visual experience; it is not inferred from any falsehood. But if (5) is indeed a non-inferential belief, then the JTB account, even if supplemented with (iv), gives us the wrong result that James knows (5).

Another case illustrating that clause (iv) won't do the job is the well-known Barn County case.[10] Suppose there is a county in the Midwest with the following peculiar feature. The landscape next to the road leading through that county is peppered with barn-facades: structures that from the road look exactly like barns. Observation from any other viewpoint would immediately reveal these structures to be fakes: devices erected for the purpose of fooling unsuspecting motorists into believing in the presence of barns. Suppose Henry is driving along the road that leads through Barn County. Naturally, he will on numerous occasions form a false belief in the presence of a barn. Since Henry has no reason to suspect that he is the victim of organized deception, these beliefs are justified. Now suppose further that, on one of those occasions when he believes there is a barn over there, he happens to be looking at the one and only real barn in the county. This time, his belief is justified and true. But its truth is the result of luck, and thus his belief is not an instance of knowledge. Yet condition (iv) is met in this case. His belief is clearly not the result of any inference from a falsehood. Once again, we see that (iv) does not succeed as a solution to the Gettier problem.

Above, we noted that the role of the justification condition is to ensure that the analysans does not mistakenly identify as knowledge a belief that is true because of epistemic luck. The lesson to be learned from the Gettier problem is that the justification condition by itself cannot ensure this. Even a justified belief, understood as a belief based on good evidence, can be true because of luck. Thus if a JTB analysis of knowledge is to rule out the full range of cases of epistemic luck, it must be amended with a suitable fourth condition, a condition that succeeds in preventing justified true belief from being "gettiered." We will refer to an analysis of this type as a "JTB+" conception of knowledge.

3. An Alternative Approach: Reliabilism

The analysis of knowledge may be approached by asking the following question: What turns a true belief into knowledge? An uncontroversial answer to this question would be: the sort of thing that effectively prevents a belief from being true as a result of epistemic luck. Controversy begins as soon as this formula is turned into a substantive proposal. According to evidentialism, which endorses the JTB+ conception of knowledge, the combination of two things accomplishes this goal: evidentialist justification plus degettierization (a condition that prevents a true and justified belief from being "gettiered"). However, according to an alternative approach that has in the last three decades become increasingly popular, what stands in the way of epistemic luck -- what turns a true belief into knowledge -- is the reliability of the cognitive process that produced the belief. Consider how we acquire knowledge of our physical environment: we do so through sense experience. Sense experiential processes are, at least under normal conditions, highly reliable. There is nothing accidental about the truth of the beliefs these processes produce. Thus beliefs produced by sense experience, if true, should qualify as instances of knowledge. An analogous point could be made for other reliable cognitive processes, such as introspection, memory, and rational intuition. We might, therefore, say that what turns true belief into knowledge is the reliability of our cognitive processes.

This approach -- reliabilism, as it is usually called -- can be carried out in two different ways. First, there is reliabilism as a theory of justification (J- reliabilism).[11] Here the idea is that while justification is indeed necessary for knowledge, its nature is not evidentialist but reliabilist. The most basic version of this view -- let's call it "simple" J-reliabilism -- goes as follows:

Simple J-Reliabilism:
S is justified in believing that p if, and only if, S's belief that p was produced by a reliable cognitive process.

Second, there is reliabilism as a theory of knowledge (K-reliabilism).[12] According to this approach, knowledge does not require justification. Rather, what it requires (in addition to truth) is reliable belief formation. Fred Dretske defends this view as follows:

Those who think knowledge requires something other than, or at least more than, reliably produced true belief, something (usually) in the way of justification for the belief that one's reliably produced beliefs are being reliably produced, have, it seems to me, an obligation to say what benefits this justification is supposed to confer . . . Who needs it, and why? If an animal inherits a perfectly reliable belief-generating mechanism, and it also inherits a disposition, everything being equal, to act on the basis of the belief so generated, what additional benefits are conferred by a justification that the beliefs are being produced in some reliable way? If there are no additional benefits, what good is this justification? Why should we insist that no one can have knowledge without it?[13]

Further below we will discuss how advocates of the JTB approach might answer Dretske's question. In the meantime, let us focus a bit more on Dretske's account of knowledge. According to Dretske, reliable cognitive processes convey information, and thus endow not only humans, but (nonhuman) animals as well, with knowledge. He writes:

I wanted a characterization that would at least allow for the possibility that animals (a frog, rat, ape, or my dog) could know things without my having to suppose them capable of the more sophisticated intellectual operations involved in traditional analyses of knowledge.[14]

Attributing knowledge to animals is certainly in accord with our ordinary practiceof using the word ‘knowledge’. Dretske seems right, therefore, when he views the result that animals have knowledge as a desideratum.

A second advantage of his theory is, so Dretske claims, that it avoids Gettier problems. He says:

Gettier difficulties . . . arise for any account of knowledge that makes knowledge a product of some justificatory relationship (having good evidence, excellent reasons, etc.) that could relate one to something false . . . This is [a] problem for justificational accounts. The problem is evaded in the information-theoretic model, because one can get into an appropriate justificational relationship to something false, but one cannot get into an appropriate informational relationship to something false.[15]

Solving the Gettier-problem is, however, a bit more complex than this passage suggests. Consider again the case of Henry in Barn County. He sees a real barn in front of him, yet does not know that there is a barn near-by. Exactly how can Dretske's theory explain Henry's failure to know? After all, he perceives an actual barn, and so does not stand in any informational relationship to something false. So if perception, on account of its reliability, normally conveys information, it should do so in this case as well. Alas, it doesn't. Clearly, if a theory like Dretske's is to handle this case and others like it, it must be supplemented with a clause that makes it immune to the case of the fake barns, and other examples like it.[16]

4. Internalism and Externalism

Evidentialists reject both J-reliabilism and K-reliabilism. They reject J-reliabilism because they advocate internalism: they take justification to be something that is "internal" to the subject. J-reliabilists disagree; they take justification to be something that is "external" to the subject.[17]

In order to pin down what the "internality" of justification is supposed to be, let us turn to Roderick Chisholm, one of the chief advocates of internalism. In the third edition of The Theory of Knowledge, Chisholm says the following:

If a person S is internally justified in believing a certain thing, then this may be something he can know just by reflecting upon his own state of mind.[18]

In the second edition of this book, he characterizes internalism in a somewhat different way:

We presuppose . . . that the things we know are justified for us in the following sense: we can know what it is, on any occasion, that constitutes our grounds, or reasons, or evidence for thinking that we know.[19]

These passages differ in the following respect: in the first Chisholm is concerned with the property of justification (a belief's being justified); in the second, with justifiers: the things that make justified beliefs justified. What is common to both passages is the constraint Chisholm imposes. In the first passage, Chisholm characterizes justification as something that is recognizable on reflection, and in the second as the sort of thing that can be known on any occasion.Arguably, this is just a terminological difference. It would not be implausible to claim that what can be recognized through reflection is something that can be recognized on any occasion, and what can be recognized on any occasion is something that can be recognized through reflection. Although this point deserves further examination, let us here simply assume that recognizability on reflection and recognizability on any occasion amount to the same thing. In what follows, we will refer to it as direct recognizability.

As already noted, in the first passage Chisholm imposes the direct recognizability constraint on justification, in the second on justifiers. Does this amount to a substantive difference? If the direct recognizability of justifiers implies the direct recognizability of justification, and vice versa, then the two passages we considered would indeed just be alternative ways of stating the same point. Whether they really are is debatable, but here we will simply assume that it makes no difference whether internalism is characterized in terms of the direct recognizability of justification, or that of justifiers.

Chisholm, then, defines internalism in terms of how justification (justifiers) is (are) knowable, that is, in terms of direct recognizability, or epistemic accessibility. This type of internalism may therefore be called accessibility internalism. Alternatively, internalism can be defined in terms of limiting justifiers to mental states. According to this second way of defining internalism, justifiers must be internal to the mind, i.e., must be mental events or states. Internalism thus defined could be referred to as mental state internalism.[20] Whether accessibility internalism and mental state internalism are genuine alternatives depends on whether mental states (and events) are directly recognizable. If they are, what appear to be genuine alternatives might in fact not be.[21] Since here we cannot go into the details of this issue, we will cut this matter short and simply define internalism, as suggested by Chisholm, in terms of direct recognizability, while acknowledging that it might be preferable to define it by restricting justifies to mental states. We will refer to internalism as defined here as "J-internalism," since it imposes the direct recognizability constraint on not knowledge, but justification.

Justification is directly recognizable. At any time t at which S holds a justified belief B, S is in a position to know at t that B is justified.[22]

J-internalism is to be contrasted with J-externalism, which is simply its negation.

Justification is not directly recognizable. It is not the case that at any time t at which S holds a justified belief B, S is in a position to know at t that B is justified. (There are times at which S holds a justified belief B but is not in a position to know that B is justified.)

Next, we will discuss what consequences we can derive from J-internalism. To begin with, we can derive the result that simple J-reliabilism is an externalist theory. According to Simple J-Reliabilism, reliability by itself -- without the subject's having any evidence indicating its presence -- is sufficient for justification. So simple J-reliabilism allows for possible cases of the following kind:

(i) the subject holds a reliably formed belief;
(ii) the subject has no evidence whatever indicating that this belief was reliably formed, nor any other evidence in its support;
(iii) the belief in question is justified.

To illustrate this point, let us consider a familiar example due to Laurence BonJour. Suppose Norman is a perfectly reliable clairvoyant. At time t, his clairvoyance causes Norman to form the belief that the president is presently in New York. However, Norman has no evidence whatever indicating that he is clairvoyant. Nor has he at t any way of recognizing that his belief was caused by his clairvoyance. Norman, then, cannot at t recognize that his belief is justified. So Simple J-reliabilism implies that Norman's belief is justified at t although Norman cannot recognize at t that that his belief is justified. Simple J-Reliabilism, therefore, is a version of J-externalism.

Second, J-internalism allows us to derive the consequence -- as it should -- that evidentialism is an internalist theory. The question of what a person's evidence consists of is of course not uncontroversial.[23] Nor is it uncontroversial what kind of cognitive access a subject has to her evidence.[24] However, it would certainly not be without a good deal of initial plausibility, at least if one looks at the matter from the point of view of the evidentialist, to make the following two assumptions. First, a subject's evidence consists of both her beliefs and experiential states (such as sensory, introspective, memorial, and intuitional states). Second, a subject's beliefs and experiential states are directly recognizable to her. And if we now add the further assumption (mentioned above) that the direct recognizability of justifiers implies the direct recognizability of justification, then we get the result that evidentialism is a form of J-internalism. Let us display the argument in detail:

Why Evidentialism Is A Version of J-Internalism:
(1) According to evidentialism, justifiers consist of a person's evidence.
(2) A person's evidence is directly recognizable to that person.
(3) According to evidentialism, a person's justifiers are directly recognizable to that person.
(4) If the justifiers that make a person's justified beliefs justified are directly recognizable to that person, then the justification of that person's justified beliefs is directly recognizable to that person.
(5) According to evidentialism, the justification of a person's justified beliefs is directly recognizable to that person.

The crucial premises in this argument are (2) and (4). Surely, evidentialists would be reluctant to call "evidence" something that is not directly recognizable to a subject.[25] So (2) would appear to be a premise that evidentialists are likely to endorse. And (4) expresses no more than one part of what we already assumed: that the direct recognizability of justifiers implies the direct recognizability of justification, and vice versa. Of course, this assumption might be challenged. What seems safe to say, therefore, is the conditional point that, if (2) and (4) capture what is essential to evidentialism, then evidentialism implies internalism about justification.

As mentioned at the beginning of this section, evidentialists also reject K-reliabilism. They do so because, pace Dretske, they think that internal justification -- justification in the form of having adequate evidence -- is necessary for knowledge. In other words, they deny that a belief's origin in a reliable cognitive process is sufficient for the belief's being an instance ofknowledge. Let us refer to this position as internalism about knowledge, or K-internalism, and let us define it using the concept of internal justification: the kind of justification that meets the direct recognizability constraint.

Internal justification is a necessary condition of knowledge. A belief's origin in a reliable cognitive process is not sufficient for its being an instance of knowledge.

K-externalism is simply the negation of internalism:

Internal justification is not a necessary condition of knowledge. A belief's origin in a reliable cognitive process is sufficient for its being an instance of knowledge. Consequently, there are cases of knowledge without internal justification.

In this section, we have merely concerned ourselves with what internalists and externalists disagree about with regard to both justification and knowledge. In the next two sections, we will examine what reasons internalists and externalists can cite in support of their respective views.

5. Why Internalism?

To begin with, one straightforward argument for J-internalism proceeds from evidentialism as a premise. For as we have seen above, there is a plausible construal of evidentialism that proceeds from the direct recognizability of a person's evidence to the direct recognizability of justification. So philosophers who are attracted to evidentialism are likely to be attracted to J-internalism as well. Furthermore, as was already mentioned at the end of the previous section, evidentialism is not only a view about the nature of justification, but also a view about the nature of knowledge. And what evidentialists would say about the nature of knowledge is this: having justification -- in the form of having adequate evidence -- is a necessary condition of knowledge.[26] But such justification is plausibly construed as internal justification, as satisfying the direct recognizability constraint that J-internalism imposes. It would appear, therefore, that evidentialists take internal justification to be necessary for knowledge, and thus hold the view we have labeled "K-internalism".

Second, there is an argument for internalism that starts with what is referred to as the deontological conception of epistemic justification:

Deontological Justification:
S is justified in believing that p iff in believing that p, S does not violate his epistemic duty.

The concept of duty employed here must not be confused with ethical duty, or prudential duty. The type of duty in question is specifically epistemic.[27] Exactly what epistemic duties are, however, is a matter of controversy. The basic idea is that epistemic duties are those that arise in the pursuit of truth.[28] Thus we might express (1) alternatively as follows: S is justified in believing that p iff in believing that p, S does not fail to do what he ought to do in the pursuit of truth. Of course, this way of putting things leads us directly to a further question: in the pursuit of truth, exactly what is it that one ought to do? Evidentialists would say: it is to believe what, and only what, one has evidence for.[29] Now if that is one's epistemic duty, then those who take justification to be deontological can employ the argument considered above (which proceeds from evidentialism to J-internalism) to derive the conclusion that deontological justification is internal justification. So the combination of deontology about justification with evidentialism allows for a pretty straightforward derivation of J-internalism.

It has also been suggested that there is a more direct argument from deontology to J-internalism, an argument that does not depend on evidentialism as a premise.[30] It derives the direct recognizability of justification from the premise that what determines epistemic duty is directly recognizable.

From Deontology to Internalism:
(1) Justification is a matter of epistemic duty fulfillment.
(2) What determines justification is identical to what determines epistemic duty.
(3) What determines epistemic duty is directly recognizable.
(4) What determines justification is directly recognizable.
(5) If what determines justification is directly recognizable, then justification itself is directly recognizable.
(6) Justification is directly recognizable.

(2) follows directly from the deontological conception of justification. (5) is nothing new; we have assumed it above already. The argument's main premise is of course (3).[31] Certainly (3) is not obviously implausible. Nevertheless, it is open to criticism, as is (5), which we merely assumed. Obviously, then, the argument is not uncontroversial. Nevertheless, it seems fair to say that it represents a straightforward and defensible derivation of internalism from deontology.

Third, internalism (J or K) can be defended indirectly on the basis of objections to particular externalist accounts of justification or knowledge. Since reliabilism is the dominant externalist approach, let us briefly consider a couple of internalist objections to reliabilism. First, recall BonJour's example of Norman: a subject who unwittingly possesses a reliable faculty of clairvoyance.[32] This faculty produces the belief that the president is in New York, a belief that is reliably produced, and thus according to simple J-reliabilism justified. But is that belief really justified? Internalists would say that Norman's belief is actually unjustified, and thus not an instance of knowledge. They would say, therefore, that a belief's being reliably produced is not sufficient for making it justified, and that a true belief's being reliably produced is not sufficient for making it an instance of knowledge.

Second, internalists would say that reliable belief production is not even necessary for knowledge. Suppose you are a victim of Descartes's evil demon. You believe that you have a body and that there is a world of physical things, but in fact neither of these beliefs is true. There is no physical world at all. Since your perceptual beliefs are not reliably produced under these circumstances, simple J-reliabilism implies that they are unjustified. To internalists, this is an intuitively implausible result. They would take your beliefs to be (by and large) justified because they are (by and large) based on adequate evidence or good reasons.[33] Hence they would reject the claim that being produced by reliable faculties is a necessary condition of epistemic justification.[34]

6. Why Externalism?

One reason for externalism lies in the attraction of "philosophical naturalism." According to Gilbert Harman, this view, when applied to ethics, "is the doctrine that moral facts are facts of nature. Naturalism as a general view is the sensible thesis that all facts are facts of nature."[35] What naturalists in ethics want, according to Harman,

is to be able to locate value, justice, right, wrong, and so forth in the world in the way that tables, colors, genes, temperatures, and so on can be located in the world.[36]

According to this conception of naturalism, a naturalist in epistemology wants to be able to locate such things as knowledge, certainty, epistemic justification, and probability "in the world in the way that tables, colors, genes, temperatures, and so on can be located in the world." How, though, are naturalists to accomplish this? According to one answer to this question, they can accomplish this by identifying the non-epistemic grounds on which epistemic phenomena supervene. Alvin Goldman describes this desideratum as follows:

The term "justified," I presume, is an evaluative term, a term of appraisal. Any correct definition or synonym of it would also feature evaluative terms. I assume that such definitions or synonyms might be given, but I am not interested in them. I want a set of substantive conditions that specify when a belief is justified . . . I want a theory of justified belief to specify in non-epistemic terms when a belief is justified."[37]
However, internalists need not deny that epistemic phenomena supervene on non-epistemic grounds, and that it is the task of epistemology to reveal these grounds. That is, internalists might as well agree that what a theory of justification ought to accomplish is an account of the substantive conditions of justification that is carried out in non-epistemic terms. It is doubtful, therefore, that the goal of locating epistemic value in the natural world establishes a link between philosophical naturalism and externalism.[38]

According to a second answer to the question of how epistemic value can be located in the natural world, the way to do that is to employ the methods of the natural sciences.[39] Appealing to this methodological constraint, externalists might argue that, because the study of justification and knowledge is an empirical study, justification and knowledge cannot be what internalists take it to be, but rather must be identified with reliable belief production: a phenomenon that can be studied empirically. It is far from clear, however, that the fundamental questions of epistemology can be answered by employing the methods of natural science. If they cannot be answered that way, then epistemology cannot be done without employing, at least to some extent, the a priori methods of the armchair philosopher. But then the universal scope of the methodological constraint in question remains unmotivated, and no compelling reason remains to think that justification and knowledge are the sort of thing that can only be studied empirically, and thus cannot be what internalist take them to be.

A second reason for externalism (more specifically, J-externalism) has to do with the connection between justification and truth. Internalists conceive of a justified belief as a belief that, relative to the subject's evidence or reasons, is likely to be true. However, such likelihood of truth is compatible with the belief's actual falsity. Indeed, such likelihood of truth is compatible with the evil demon scenario in which the vast majority of your empirical beliefs, although justified, is in fact false. Externalists consider this connection between justification and truth too thin, and thus demand a stronger kind of likelihood of truth.[40] Reliability is usually taken to fill the bill.[41] William Alston, for example, would concur that, without a reliability constraint, the connection between justification and truth becomes too tenuous.[42] He argues that only reliably formed beliefs can be justified, and defines a reliable belief-producing mechanism as one that "would yield mostly true beliefs in a sufficiently large and varied run of employments in situations of the sorts we typically encounter."[43] Suppose we endorse this conception of justification. Let's suppose further that most of our beliefs are justified. It then follows that most of the beliefs we form in ordinary circumstances would have to be true most of the time. Such a belief system could still be brought about by an evil demon. However, it would not be a belief-system consisting of mostly false beliefs, and thus the evil demon responsible for it wouldn't be quite as evil as he could be. So what Alston-type justification rules out is this: a belief system of mostly justified beliefs that is generated by an evil demon who sees to it that most of our beliefs are false. This, then, is the benefit we can secure when, as externalists suggest, we make reliability a necessary element of justification.

Internalists would object that a strong link between justification and truth runs afoul of the rather forceful intuition that the beliefs of an evil demon victim are justified although they are mostly false. In response, externalists might concede that the sort of justification internalists have in mind and attribute to evil demon victims is a legitimate concept, but question the epistemological relevance of that concept. Of what epistemic value (of what value to the acquisition of knowledge), they might ask, is internal justification if it is the sort of thing an evil demon victim can enjoy, a person whose belief system is massively marred by falsehood? Internalists would reply that internal justification should not be expected to supply us with a guarantee of truth, and that its value derives from the fact that internal justification is necessary for knowledge.

A third reason for externalism has to do with Dretske's question about justification: "Who needs it, and why?" Dretske would say, of course, that nobody needs it (for the acquisition of knowledge, that is) because reliable belief production is sufficient for turning true belief into knowledge. With this, internalists disagree.[44] They take the existence of examples like BonJour's clairvoyant Norman as a decisive reason to reject this sufficiency claim. According to them, Norman's belief about the whereabouts of the president, although reliably formed, is clearly unjustified, and thus not an instance of knowledge. Internalists, therefore, would answer Dretske's question thus: Those who wish to enjoy knowledge need justification, and they need it because one does not know that p unless one has adequate evidence or undefeated reasons for believing that p.

In reply to this, Dretske might repeat a point -- a point that amounts to a fourth reason for externalism -- from the passage we considered above: he takes animals such as frogs, rats, apes, and dogs to have knowledge. This is surely in line with the way we ordinarily use the concept of knowledge. The owner of a pet who does not attribute knowledge to it would be hard to find. But are animals capable of the sophisticated mental operations required by beings who enjoy the sort of justification internalists have in mind? It would seem not.[45] At this point, the disagreement between internalists and externalists appears unresolvable. On the one hand, there are examples like BonJour's clairvoyant Norman, examples that strongly suggest that internal justification is necessary for knowledge. On the other hand, there is Dretske's point that knowledge is enjoyed by not only humans but animals as well. And this strongly suggests that internal justification is not necessary for knowledge.

7. Two Analyses of Knowledge

K-internalism and K-externalism, then, are supported by conflicting intuitions. On the one hand, there is the thought that in order to know, one must have justification in the form of having adequate evidence or reasons. On the other hand, there is the thought that knowledge, resulting from reliable cognitive faculties, is not reserved to humans only. Both of these thoughts are inherently plausible. However, if it is indeed true that animals are not the sort of beings that can have internally justified or unjustified beliefs, these intuitions cannot be reconciled. If they cannot, then we get as a result of this irreconcilability two alternative and competing analyses of knowledge: one internalist, the other externalist. Let us state a gloss of the respective analyses. In these analyses, the term "internal justification" stands for the kind of concept internalists have in mind, and the term "external justification" for the kind of concept externalists employ.

External Knowledge (EK):
S knows that p iff
    (i) p is true;
    (ii) S believes that p;
    (iii) S is externally justified in believing that p.
Internal Knowledge (IK):
S knows that p iff
    (i) p is true;
    (ii) S believes that p;
    (iii) S is internally justified in believing that p;
    (iv) S's belief that p is degettiered.

EK and IK agree and differ in the following respects:

(a) According to both EK and IK, knowledge requires true belief. The question each of these analyses is intended to answer is: what do we need to add to true belief to get knowledge?
(b) According to both, external justification is necessary for knowledge. K-internalists acknowledge the necessity of external justification at least indirectly when they make degettierization a necessary condition of knowledge. The explanation of this point has to do with the nature of degettierization. What sort of thing would achieve it? Let us venture a hypothesis: what achieves degettierization is the sort of thing that produces external justification. If that is correct, then it follows that K-internalists are in agreement with K-externalists about the necessity of external justification.
(c) IK requires internal justification, EK does not. That is the one condition where the two analyses differ. As a result of this difference, EK includes within the scope of knowledge animals, but fails to accommodate the intuition underlying BonJour's case of clairvoyant Norman, and other cases like that. IK, on the other hand, does accommodate this intuition, but -- counter-intuitively, as K-externalists would say -- excludes animals from the range of subjects that can have knowledge.

If the internalism/externalism controversy is seen as essentially a controversy over the nature of knowledge, the debate over J-internalism vs. J-externalism would appear to be a case of talking past each other. J-internalists and J-externalists simply intend justification to achieve different things. They each operate with a different concept of justification. J-externalists take justification to be the sort of thing that turns true belief into knowledge, and view the Gettier problem merely as the problem of adding the right sort of bells and whistles to the justification-condition. J-internalists, on the other hand, cannot view degettierization as something that can, in the form of a suitable clause, be tacked on to the justification condition, for degettierization is an external matter.[46] Rather, internalists take justification to be the sort of thing that turns true and degettiered belief into knowledge. Since J-internalists and J-externalists assign different roles to justification, what they ultimately disagree about is not the nature of justification, but the sort of thing in relation to which the theoretical role of epistemic justification is fixed: knowledge. Internalists assign justification the role of turning true and degettiered belief into knowledge because they take internal justification to be necessary for knowledge. In contrast, externalists assign a different role -- that of turning true belief into knowledge -- to justification because they think that internal justification is not necessary for knowledge. It is this difference in their respective views on the nature of knowledge that leads to different views on the nature of justification.

Thus we are confronted with a fundamental disagreement about the nature of knowledge. Externalists such as Dretske would say that the desideratum of making knowledge a natural phenomenon that is instantiated equally by humans and animals must trump the demand that knowledge require the possession of justification in the form of adequate evidence. They would have to say, therefore, that Norman, the unwitting clairvoyant, has knowledge just as much as a mouse that knows where to look for the cheese. Internalists would argue the other way around. To them, Norman-type cases establish the necessity of adequate evidence or undefeated reasons. And so they would say that, just as Norman's reliable clairvoyance (by itself, in the absence of evidence) does not give him knowledge, a mouse's reliable cognitive mechanisms do not give it knowledge of where to look for the cheese. Externalists would say that it merely seems to us that Norman lacks knowledge when in fact he has it. Internalists would say that it merely seems to us that animals know when in fact they do not.

Who is right about the nature of knowledge: internalists or externalist? It might be a mistake to expect that there is a decisive argument that settles the dispute one way or the other.[47] Most likely, one reason why the nature of knowledge is a subject matter of philosophy is that in the end its nature remains enigmatic. Nevertheless, the common ground shared by IK and EK should not be overlooked. Both require true belief and external justification. What is contentious is merely the further question of whether knowledge requires internal justification as well.[48]


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epistemology: naturalized | epistemology: social | epistemology: virtue | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: contextualist theories of | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of


I wish to thank Laurence BonJour and Michael Bergman for helpful comments and criticisms.

Copyright © 2001
Matthias Steup

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