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Kant's Theory of Judgment

Theories of judgment bring together fundamental issues in semantics, logic, philosophical psychology, and epistemology: indeed, the notion of judgment is central to any theory of human rationality. But Kant's theory of judgment differs sharply from many other theories of judgment, both traditional and contemporary, in three ways: (1) by taking the capacity for judgment to be the central cognitive faculty of the human mind, (2) by insisting on the semantic, logical, psychological, and epistemic priority of the propositional content of a judgment, and (3) by systematically embedding judgment within the metaphysics of transcendental idealism. This article focuses exclusively on the first two parts of Kant's theory.

1. The Nature of Judgment

According to Kant, judgments are complex conscious cognitions that (i) refer to objects either directly (via intuitions) or indirectly (via concepts), (ii) include concepts that are predicated either of those objects or of other constituent concepts, (iii) exemplify pure logical concepts and enter into inferences according to pure logical laws, (iv) essentially involve both the following of rules and the application of rules to the objects picked out by intuitions, (v) express true or false propositions, (vi) mediate the formation of beliefs, and (vii) are unified and self-conscious. The two leading features of this account are, first, Kant's taking the capacity for judgment to be the central cognitive faculty of the human mind, in the sense that judgment, alone among our various cognitive achievements, is the joint product of all of the other cognitive faculties operating coherently and systematically together under a single higher-order unity of rational self-consciousness (the centrality thesis); and second, Kant's insistence on the priority of the propositional content of a judgment over its basic cognitive-semantic constituents (i.e., intuitions and concepts), over the inferential role of judgments, over the rule-like character of the judgment, over the conscious psychological states in which propositions are grasped as well as the nonconscious psychological processes in which propositions are synthetically generated, and over beliefs in those propositions (the priority-of-the-proposition thesis).

1.1 The power of judgment and the other faculties of cognition

According to Kant, a “judgment” (Urteil) is a kind of “cognition” (Erkenntnis) — which he defines in turn as an objective conscious mental representation (A320/B376) — and is the characteristic output of the “power of judgment” (Urteilskraft). The power of judgment, in turn, is a cognitive “capacity” (Fähigkeit) but also specifically a spontaneous and innate cognitive capacity, and in virtue of these is it is the “faculty of judging” (Vermögen zu urteilen) (A69/B94), which is also the same as the “faculty of thinking” (Vermögen zu denken) (A81/B106).

For Kant the mind is essentially active and vital — “the mind (Gemüt) for itself is entirely life (the principle of life itself)” (5: 278) — and a cognitive capacity in turn is a determinate conscious propensity of the mind to generate objective representations of certain kinds under certain conditions. What do spontaneity and innateness add to a mere capacity for cognition, so that it becomes a “faculty of cognition” (Erkenntnisvermögen)? A cognitive faculty is spontaneous in that whenever it is externally stimulated by raw unstructured sensory data as inputs, it then automatically organizes or "synthesizes" those data in an unprecedented way relative to those inputs, thereby yielding novel structured cognitions as outputs (B1-2, A50/B74, B132, B152). So cognitive spontaneity is a structural creativity of the mind with respect to its representations. Kant also uses the term ‘spontaneity’ in a somewhat different sense in a metaphysical context, to refer to a mental cause that can sufficiently determine an effect in time while also lacking any temporally prior sufficient cause of itself (A445/B473). What is shared between the two sorts of spontaneity is the unprecedented, creative character of the mind's operations. But in the cognitive sense of spontaneity, what is crucial is that the sensory data manifest “poverty of the stimulus” (Cook & Newson 1996, 81-85) — significant underdetermination of the outputs of an embodied cognitive capacity by the relevant inputs to that capacity, plus previous experiences or habituation — although the faculty's spontaneity must also always be minimally conditioned by external sensory triggering (B1-2). Correspondingly, a Kantian cognitive faculty is innate in the threefold sense that (i) it is intrinsic to the mind, hence a necessary part of the nature of the rational animal possessing that faculty, (ii) it contains internal structures that are underdetermined by sensory impressions — which is the same as their being a priori (B2), and (iii) it automatically systematically synthesizes those sensory inputs according to special rules that directly reflect the internal structures of the faculty, thereby generating its correspondingly-structured outputs. So Kantian innateness is essentially a procedure-based innateness, consisting in an a priori active readiness of the mind for implementing rules of synthesis, as opposed to the content-based innateness of Cartesian and Leibnizian innate ideas, according to which an infinitely large supply of complete (e.g., mathematical) beliefs, propositions, or concepts themselves are either occurrently or dispositionally intrinsic to the mind. But as Locke pointed out, this implausibly overloads the human mind's limited storage capacities.

In contrast to both Rationalists and Empiricists, who hold that the human mind has only one basic cognitive faculty — reason or sense perception, respectively — Kant holds that the human mind has two basic cognitive faculties: (i) the “understanding” (Verstand) the faculty of concepts, thought, and discursivity, and (ii) the “sensibility” (Sinnlichkeit), the faculty of intuitions, perception, and mental imagery (A51/B75). Concepts are at once (a) general representations having the logical form of universality (9: 91), (b) discursive representations expressing pure logical forms and falling under pure logical laws (A68-70/B92-94, A239/B298), (c) complex intensions ranging over “comprehensions” (Umfangen) that contain all actual and possible objects falling under those intensions, as well as other narrower comprehensions (9: 95-96), (d) mediate or indirect (i.e., attributive or descriptive) representations of individual objects (A320/B320), (e) rules for classifying and organizing perceptions of objects (A106), and (f) “reflected” representations expressing the higher-order unity of rational self-consciousness or “apperception” (B133 and 133n.). Intuitions by contrast are representations of objects that are (1) singular (A320/B377) (9: 91), (2) sense-related (A19/B33, A51/B75), (3) object-dependent (B72) (4: 281), (4) immediate, or directly referential (A90-91/B122-123, B132, B145), and (5) nonconceptual (A284/B340) (9: 99) (Hanna 2001, ch. 4).

Understanding and sensibility are both subserved by the faculty of “imagination” (Einbildungskraft), which when taken generically is the source or engine of all sorts of synthesis, but which when taken as a “dedicated” or task-sensitive cognitive faculty, more specifically generates (α) the spatial and temporal forms of intuition, (β) novel mental imagery in conscious sensory states, (γ) reproductive imagery or memories, and (δ) “schemata,” which are supplementary rules for interpreting general conceptual rules in terms of more specific figural (spatiotemporal) forms and sensory images (A78/B103, B151, A100-102, A137-142/B176-181) (7: 167).

Just as understanding and sensibility are subserved by the bottom-up cognitive processing of the imagination, so correspondingly they are also superserved by the top-down cognitive processing of the faculty of “reason” (Vernunft), which produces logical inferences, carries out practical choices and decisions (also sometimes called “practical judgments”), imposes coherence and consistency on all sorts of cognitions, and above all recognizes and implements strongly modal concepts such as necessary truth and unconditional obligation, in the form of lawlike “principles” (Principien, Grundsätze) (A299-304/B355-361, A800-804/B828-832).

Finally, the objective unity of any cognition whatsoever is guaranteed by the faculty of apperception or rational self-consciousness, which plays the "executive" role in the corporate organization of the mind by introducing a single higher-order unity into all of its lower-order representations, and whose characteristic output is the cogito-like self-directed representation “I think” (Ich denke): as in “I think about X” (where X is some concept, say the concept of being a philosopher) or “I think that P” (where that-P is some proposition, say the proposition that Kant is a philosopher) (B131-132). The I think according to Kant is “the vehicle of all concepts whatever” (A341/B399), because it is both a necessary condition of the unity of every objective representation and also automatically implements one or another of a set of primitive pure a priori logical forms or functions of unity in judgments or thoughts—“the pure concepts of the understanding” or “categories” (A66-83/B91-116) — in the several semantic constituents of that cognition.

The power of judgment, while a non-basic faculty, is nevertheless the central cognitive faculty of the human mind. This is because judging brings together all the otherwise uncoordinated sub-acts and sub-contents of intuition, conceptualization, imagination, and reason, via apperception or rational self-consciousness, for the purpose of generating a single cognitive product, the judgment, under the overarching pure concepts of the understanding or categories, thereby fully integrating the several distinct cognitive faculties and their several distinct sorts of representational information, and thereby also constituting a single rational animal. For Kant then, rational humans are judging animals.

1.2 Judgments are essentially propositional cognitions

But what exactly are judgments? Kant's answer, in a nutshell, is that they are essentially propositional cognitions — from which it immediately follows that rational humans are, more precisely, propositional animals. In what sense however is this the case?

Logicians before Kant tended to define judgment as a “representation of a relation between two concepts” (B140). This pre-Kantian definition implied that all judgments are of subject-predicate form; but in fact, as Kant points out (here following the Stoic logicians), some judgments — e.g., disjunctive judgments, and hypothetical conditional judgments — are truth-valued relational complexes of subject-predicate judgments and thus have essentially truth-functional form, not subject-predicate form. This idea later heavily influenced George Boole's ground-breaking view of logic as a set of a priori “laws of thought” governing a formal calculus of binary functions that mimic the “bipolar” behavior of the classical truth and falsity of propositions (Boole 1854). Perhaps even more importantly however, the pre-Kantian definition also failed to explain the unity of a judgment, and the difference between a judgment and a mere list of concepts. So in order to solve this “unity-of-the-judgment” problem — which later re-surfaced as “the problem of the unity of the proposition” in early analytic philosophy (Hylton 1984, Linsky 1992) — Kant offers a radically new conception of the judgment as a higher-order binding function for different types of lower-order objective representational content. In a pre-Critical essay, “The False Subtlety of the Four Syllogistic Figures,” he says that a judgment is an act of logical predication whereby a concept is applied to a thing, as expressed by the copula ‘is’ or ‘are’ (2: 47). In his logical textbook, the Jäsche Logic, he says that it is a representation of the unity of consciousness linking together several other representations, or a representation of their relation in a single concept (9: 101). And in the Critique of Pure Reason he characterizes judgment at least four times:

Judgment is … the mediate cognition of an object, hence the representation of a representation of it. In every judgment there is a concept that holds of many [representations], and that among this many also comprehends a given representation, which is then immediately referred to the object. (A68/B93)
All judgments are … functions of unity among our representations, since instead of an immediate representation a higher one, which comprehends this and other representations under itself, is used for the cognition of the object, and many possible cognitions are hereby drawn together into one. (A69/B94)
A judgment is nothing other than the way to bring given cognitions to the objective unity of apperception. That is the aim of the copula is in them: to distinguish the objective unity of given representations from the subjective. (B141).
[Pure general logic] deals with concepts, judgments, and inferences, corresponding exactly to the functions and order of those powers of the mind, which are comprehended under the broad designation of understanding in general… If the understanding in general is explained as the faculty of rules, then the power of judgment is the faculty of subsuming under rules, i.e., of determining whether something stands under a given rule (casus datae legis) or not. (A130-132/B170-172)

Despite the superficial differences in emphasis and formulation, these six characterizations all converge on the same basic account: a judgment is a complex conscious cognition which refers to objects either directly (via the essentially indexical content of intuitions) or indirectly (via the essentially attributive or descriptive content of concepts); in which concepts are predicated either of those objects or of other constituent concepts; in which concepts are intrinsically related to one another and to intuitional representations by pure logical concepts expressing various modifications and truth-functional compounds of the predicative copula; which enters into inferences according to pure laws of logic; which essentially involve both the following of rules and the application of rules to the perceptual objects picked out by intuition; and in which a composite objective representation is generated and unified by the higher-order executive mental processing of a single self-conscious rational subject. The crucial take-away points here are (a) a judgment's referential bottoming-out in intuitions, (b) the “privileging of predication” [Longuenesse 1998, 104]) over other sorts of logical operations, (c) the intrinsic logico-syntactic and logico-semantic form of the judgment, based on modifications or compound truth-functional relations of the predicative copula, (d) the rule-like character of the judgment, (e) the judgment's unified objective representational (i.e., semantic) content, and above all (f) its higher-order rationally self-conscious ground of unity.

As just noted, every judgment has an intrinsic logical form which is both syntactic and semantic in nature, centered on predication. Even more fundamentally however, every judgment also has an “intension” (Inhalt) or semantic content: the “proposition” (Satz). A propositional content is not monolithic but rather a unified composite of individually meaningful proper parts. Thus a proposition is the logically well-formed and semantically well-composed, truth-valued, unified objective representational content of a judgment, and more generally it is “what is judged” in the act of putting forward any sort of rational claim about the world (9: 109) (14: 659-660) (24: 934). Although a proposition is always generated by means of psychological processes however, it is not psychologically private and incommunicable: on the contrary, it is intersubjectively rationally communicable, due to the fact that the very same propositional form-and-content can be individually generated by many different judging animals, provided they are all equipped with the same basic cognitive architecture. In this way judgments for Kant are essentially propositional cognitions, in that the primary function of the faculty of judgment is just to generate these logically well-formed, semantically well-composed, truth-valued, intersubjectively rationally communicable, unified objective representational contents.

Indeed, for Kant this propositional function of the judgment is more basic than its inferential role — although every judgment does indeed play an inferential role (Longuenesse 1998, 90-95) — and for this reason Kant's logical constants (i.e., all, some, this/the, affirmation, propositional negation, predicate-negation, the predicative copula, if-then, disjunction, necessarily, possibly, and actually) are defined strictly in terms of their specific roles in the propositional content of judgments, quite apart from the ways those judgments can enter into inferences (CPR A69-76/B94-102).

Beliefs (Glauben), by contrast to propositions, are postures of the mind in which propositions are found to be subjectively sufficient or “subjectively valid,” and thus are “taken-for-true” (fürwahrhalten) (A820/B848) (9: 66), but also are objectively insufficient insofar as they are without certainty and fallible. So while judgments are proposition-generating acts (Handlungen) (A69/94), beliefs by contrast are merely defeasible rational pro-attitudes to propositions that presuppose acts of judgment.

1.3 Judgments, objective validity, objective reality, and truth

The rational pro-attitude of taking-for-true implies the subjective validity of a judgment, or its apparent meaningfulness and apparent truth for an individual cognizer. By contrast, the “objective validity” (objektiv Gültigkeit) of a judgment is its objective meaningfulness, precisely because it is compositionally based on the “reference” (Beziehung) — whether singular or comprehensional — of the basic constituent objective representations of any judgment, namely intuitions and concepts. The reference of intuitions and concepts, in turn, is necessarily constrained by the specifically aesthetic or sensible, non-discursive, and pre-rational or proto-rational dimension of human experience, which itself is jointly determined by (a) the brute givenness of material objects to our receptive capacity for empirical intuition, via the relation of external affection, and (b) the necessary and non-empirical forms of empirical intuition, our representations of space and time (A19-22/B33-36), which ultimately express the outer and inner sensory aspects of the embodiment of our minds (Hanna 2000a). In this way, an intuition is objectively valid if and only if either (i) it directly refers to some individual actual or possible external sensible object or to the subject's phenomenally conscious inner response to this outer reference (this accounts for the objective validity of empirical intuitions), or else (ii) it represents a phenomenally immanent necessary condition of empirical intuitions (this accounts for the objective validity of the forms of intuition) (A239-240/B298-299). By contrast, a concept is objectively valid if and only if either it applies to some actual or possible objects of empirical intuition (this accounts for the objective validity of empirical concepts) or else it represents a necessary condition of empirical concepts (this accounts for the objective validity of pure concepts) (A239-240/B298-299, A240-242/B299-300).

A necessary but not sufficient condition of the objective validity of a judgment is its logico-syntactic well-formedness (grammatical correctness) and logico-semantic well-formedness (sortal correctness) (A73/98, A240-248/B300-305). So a judgment is objectively valid if and only if it is logically well-formed and all of its constituent intuitions and concepts are objectively valid (A155-156/B194-195). Otherwise put, the objective validity of a judgment is its anthropocentric empirical referential meaningfulness. Kant also sometimes uses the notion of “objective reality” (objektive Realität) to characterize objectively valid representations that apply specifically to actually or really existing objects, and not to merely possible objects (A242 n.). True judgments are thus objectively real propositions. Objective validity, in turn, is a necessary but not sufficient condition of truth, and hence of objectively real propositions, for false judgments are also objectively valid (A58/B83). In this way the objective validity of a judgment is equivalent to its propositional truth-valuedness, but not equivalent to its propositional truth.

By contrast, all judgments that are not objectively valid are “empty” (leer) or truth-valueless. Nevertheless it must be noted that for Kant empty judgments can still be rationally intelligible and not nonsensical, if all the concepts contained within them are at least logically consistent or “thinkable” (Bxxvi n.) In this way, e.g., some judgments containing concepts of noumenal objects (things-in-themselves, or real essences) or noumenal subjects (rational-agents-in-themselves, or persons) are anthropocentrically empirically referentially meaningless and truth-valueless, hence empty, yet also are rationally intelligible and even essential both to Kant's theoretical metaphysics (A254-255/B309-310, A650-654/B678-682) and to his metaphysics of freedom and morality (A530-558/B566-586).

So much for truth-valuedness: but what is truth? According to Kant, truth is a predicate of whole judgments, and not a predicate of the representational proper parts of judgments (A293/B350). Furthermore we already know that objective validity is a necessary but not sufficient condition of the truth of a judgment. Kant also holds that logical consistency is a necessary but not sufficient condition of the truth of a judgment (A60/B85). Most importantly however, according to Kant the “nominal definition” of truth is that it is the “agreement” or “correspondence” (Übereinstimmung) of a cognition (i.e., a judgment) with its object (A58/B82). Now a Kantian nominal definition is a special type of analytic definition that picks out the “logical essence” of that concept — i.e., the generic and specific intensional criteria for bringing things under that concept — but without also picking out the “inner determinations” or real essences of the things falling within the comprehension of that concept, which would be the job of a real definition (9: 142-143). So this means that for Kant truth just is agreement or correspondence, which can then be further unpacked as a relation between a judgment and an object such that (i) the form or structure of the object is isomorphic with the logico-syntactic and logico-semantic form of the proposition expressed by the judgment, (ii) the judger cognitively orients herself in the world by projecting the object under specific “points of view” (Gesichtspunkte) or modes of presentation that would also be typically cognitively associated with the constituent concepts of the judgment by any other rational human animal in that context (8: 134-137) (9: 57, 147) (24: 779), and (iii) the object represented by the judgment really exists (Hanna 2000b). Another way of putting this is to say that truth is nothing but the objective reality of the total propositional form-and-content of the judgment: that is, nothing but the real existence of that which is precisely specified by the logico-syntactic and logico-semantic features of the judgment taken together with the judger's intersubjectively rationally communicable cognitive orientation. Or in still other words, true judgments are nothing but ways of rationally projecting ourselves onto truth-makers. This is not what is nowadays called a “deflationist” conception of truth however, because Kant is not saying that truth is nothing but asserting the corresponding actual facts. On the contrary, for Kant truth is irreducible to merely asserting the facts, because for him the concept of truth also inherently expresses both the judger's fundamental rational interest in “getting it right” (whether theoretically via true judgment or practically via good intentional action) and her intersubjectively rationally communicable cognitive orientation.

In any case, the nominal definition of truth must be sharply distinguished from the real definition of truth, i.e., the “criterion” (Kriterium) of truth, which is a rule for determining the truth or falsity of judgments in specific contexts (A58/B82). According to Kant there is no all-purpose or absolutely general criterion of truth (A58-59), such as the “clarity-and-distinctness” criterion of the Cartesians. Nevertheless there are special criteria of truth for each of the basic classes of judgments: analytic judgments, synthetic a posteriori (or empirical) judgments, and synthetic a priori judgments (for more details about this threefold distinction and the special truth-criteria, see section 2).

The truth of empirical judgments is the bottom-level sort of truth for Kant, in that all of the other kinds of truth presuppose it. In turn, the proper object of an empirical judgment is an actual or possible “object of experience” (Gegenstand der Erfahrung), which is an empirical state-of-affairs, or a really possible individual material object insofar as it has macroscopic physical or “phenomenological” (in the Newtonian sense) properties and can enter into causal or otherwise dynamical relations in the spatiotemporal material world according to necessary laws of nature (A176-218/B218-265). By the nominal definition of truth as agreement or correspondence, this entails that actual objects of experience are the truth-makers of empirical judgments. It also leads to what Kant calls “the criterion of empirical truth” which states that since the objectively valid propositional content of an empirical judgment can be specified as a necessary conceptual rule of sensory appearances, then if that rule is effectively applied to the temporal succession of our sensory representations of the phenomenal material world, and that rule coheres with the causal-dynamic laws of nature, then that judgment is true (A191/B236, A451/B479) (4: 290) (18: 234) (Hanna 1993).

1.3.1 The togetherness principle and Kant's nonconceptualism

One of the best-known and most widely-quoted texts of the Critique of Pure Reason is this pithy slogan: “thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A51/B76). This slogan encapsulates what can be called the togetherness principle. The “togetherness” here is the necessary cognitive complementarity and semantic interdependence of intuitions and concepts:

Intuition and concepts … constitute the elements of all our cognition, so that neither concepts without intuition corresponding to them in some way nor
intuition without concepts can yield a cognition.

Thoughts without [intensional] content (Inhalt) are empty (leer), intuitions without concepts are blind (blind). It is, therefore, just as necessary to make the
mind's concepts sensible — that is, to add an object to them in intuition — as to make our intuitions understandable — that is, to bring them under concepts.
These two powers, or capacities, cannot exchange their functions. The understanding can intuit nothing, the senses can think nothing. Only from their
unification can cognition arise. (A50-51/B74-76)

What does the togetherness principle mean? The famous texts just quoted have led many readers and interpreters of Kant — e.g., Sellars 1963, Sellars 1968, McDowell 1994, and Abela 2002 — to deny the cognitive and semantic independence of intuitions: intuitions without concepts either simply do not exist or else are wholly meaningless (i.e., neither objectively valid nor rationally intelligible) even if they do exist. And this denial appears to be supported by at least one other text:

The understanding cognizes everything only through concepts; consequently, however far it goes in its divisions [of lower concepts] it never cognizes through mere intuition but always yet again through lower concepts. (A656/B684).

But even so, this cannot be a correct interpretation of the famous texts at A50-51/B74-76, because of what Kant says in these texts:

Objects can indeed appear to us without necessarily having to be related to functions of the understanding. (A89/B122. emphasis added)
Appearances can certainly be given in intuition without functions of the understanding. (A90/B122, emphasis added)
Appearances might very well be so constituted that the understanding would not find them in accordance with the conditions of its unity…. [and] in the series of appearances nothing would present itself that would yield a rule of synthesis and so correspond to the concept of cause and effect, so that this concept would be entirely empty, null, and meaningless. Appearances would none the less present objects to our intuition, since intuition by no means requires the functions of thought. (A90-91/B122-123, emphasis added)
The manifold for intuition must already be given prior to the synthesis of the understanding and independently from it. (B145, emphasis added)

In other words, according to these last four texts, intuitions are nonconceptual cognitions, that is, cognitions that both exist and are objectively valid without requiring concepts. But now we are in a dilemma. How then can these two apparently contradictory sets of texts be reconciled?

The answer is that what Kant is actually saying in the famous texts at A50-51/B74-76 is that intuitions and concepts are cognitively complementary and semantically interdependent for the specific purpose of constituting objectively valid judgments. This in turn corresponds directly to a special, narrower sense of ‘cognition’ that Kant highlights in the B edition of the first Critique, which means the same as ‘objectively valid judgment’ (B xxvi, Bxxvi n.). But from this it does not follow that there cannot be “empty” concepts or “blind” intuitions outside the special context of objectively valid judgments. ‘Empty concept’ for Kant does not mean either “bogus concept” or “wholly meaningless concept”: rather it means “concept that is not objectively valid,” and as we have seen in section 1.3, for Kant there can be very different sorts of concepts that are not objectively valid, including rationally intelligible concepts of noumenal objects or noumenal subjects. Similarly, ‘blind intuition’ for Kant does not mean either “bogus intuition” or “wholly meaningless intuition”: rather it means “anthropocentrically empirically referentially meaningful nonconceptual intuition.” Therefore, despite its being true for Kant, according to the togetherness principle, that intuitions and concepts must be combined with one another in order to generate objectively valid judgments, nevertheless intuitions can also occur independently of concepts and still remain objectively valid. And in particular, to the extent that intuitions are cognitively and semantically independent of concepts, and also objectively valid, they contain nonconceptual representational mental contents. So Kant's togetherness principle is also perfectly consistent with what we would nowadays call his “nonconceptualism” about mental content (Bermúdez 2003a).

1.4 Judging, believing, and scientific knowing

As Kant points out in a famous letter to his student Marcus Herz (10: 129-130), the leading question of his Critical philosophy in general and of (what eventually would become) the Critique of Pure Reason in particular is: “what is the ground of the reference of that in us which we call ‘representation’ (‘Vorstellung’) to the object?” In other words: how are objectively valid (and in particular, a priori) mental representations possible? This is the fundamental topic of Kant's “theory of cognition” (Erkenntnistheorie). The theory of cognition in Kant's sense however should not be confused with epistemology or theory of knowledge in the contemporary sense, the special theory of justified true belief (or justified true belief plus X, to allow for the Gettier problem) with special reference to skepticism. Thus the first Critique is a treatise in cognitive semantics, not a treatise in epistemology. But within his overarching cognitive-semantic framework, Kant also has a theory of justified true belief. As noted in section 1.2, belief for Kant is a defeasible rational pro-attitude arising from and presupposing an act of judgment and its propositional content; and as noted in section 1.3, truth is the agreement or correspondence of a judgment with its object, i.e., the actual existence of that which is precisely specified by the total propositional form-and-content of the judgment. Justified true belief, in turn, is “scientific knowing” (Wissen) (A820-822/B848-850) (9: 65-72), which connects epistemology in Kant's sense directly with his conception of a “science” (Wissenschaft) as a systematically unified body of cognitions based on a priori principles (A832-836/B860-864). So unlike Descartes, who notoriously holds that true belief constitutes scientific knowing only if justification guarantees truth, or is infallible, Kant holds that a belief constitutes scientific knowing if and only if the judgment underlying that belief is not only subjectively sufficient for believing but is also objectively sufficient for believing, and coherent with a suitably wide set of other beliefs (A60/B85), and also true, although it still remains fallible. The objective sufficiency of a judgment for Kant is the intersubjectively rationally communicable conscious state of “conviction” (Überzeugung), which is also the same as “certainty” (Gewißheit). Conviction or certainty, in turn, arises necessarily from either the intuitional “self-evidence” (Evidenz) or the discursive clarity-and-distinctness of the constituent representations within the propositional content of a judgment, as accessible via apperception or reflection (9: 62-64, 66, 70-71). So for Kant a judgment counts as scientific knowing if and only if (1) the self-evident or clear-and-distinct character of the propositional content of that judgment necessitates the cognizer's belief in that proposition, (2) the belief is coherent with a suitably wide set of other beliefs, and (3) that proposition is also true. But in principle that proposition could be false and yet the believer still be in an “aesthetically perfected” (i.e., intuitionally ideal) or “logically perfected” (i.e., discursively ideal) cognitive state of conviction or certainty (9: 33-38). So conviction or certainty for Kant does not entail truth. In this way, truth is a relatively external and extrinsic factor in relation to justification: truth is irreducibly something the world gives to us, not something we can make for ourselves, due to “the fact that the manifold for intuition must already be given (gegeben)” (B145). On the Cartesian view, human knowledge mimics the invulnerability of divine cognition; but for Kant, scientific knowing expresses the embodied finitude of the human condition, and the uncompelled contribution of the world: the gift of the given.

2. Kinds of Judgments

One of the most controversial, influential, and striking parts of Kant's theory of judgment is his multiple classification of judgments according to kinds of logical form and kinds of semantic content. Indeed the very importance of Kant's multiple classification of judgments has sometimes led to the misconception that his theory of judgment will stand or fall according to the fate of, e.g., his analytic-synthetic distinction, or the fate of his doctrine of synthetic a priori judgments. Important as these classifications are however, it is crucial to remember that the core of Kant's theory of judgment consists in the centrality thesis and the priority-of-the-proposition thesis, both of which can still hold even if some of his classifications of judgments are rejected.

2.1 Kinds of logical form

The modern conception of logical form — as found, e.g., in the symbolic and mathematical logic of Gottlob Frege's Begriffsschrift (“Conceptual Notation”) (Frege 1972), Bertrand Russell's and A.N. Whitehead's Principia Mathematica (Whitehead and Russell 1962), and Ludwig Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (Wittgenstein 1922) — owes much to Kant's conception of logical form, if not so very much to his particular conception of logic, which from a contemporary point of view can seem “terrifyingly narrow-minded and mathematically trivial,” as Allen Hazen has drily put it (Hazen 1999). On the other hand however, it is clearly true that Kant's conception of mathematical form, which is found in his theory of pure or formal intuition, substantially influenced Wittgenstein's view of logical form in the Tractatus (Wittgenstein 1922, props. 2.013, 5.552, 5.61, and 6.13). There is an ongoing scholarly debate about whether Kant's conception of mathematical form is a direct expression of the narrow-mindedness of his logical theory, or instead a direct expression of the striking originality of his philosophy of mathematics (Friedman 1992, Hanna 2002, Parsons 1983). But even more importantly, Kant's deep idea that logic and logical form can exist only in the context of the judging activities and judging capacities of rational human animals, has heavily influenced some heavily influential philosophers of logic, linguists, philosophers of language, and cognitive scientists from Boole and Wilhelm von Humboldt (Von Humboldt 1988), to the later Wittgenstein (Wittgenstein 1953, 1969) and Noam Chomsky (Chomsky 1975).

2.1.1 Pure general logic and the table of judgments

As mentioned in section 1, every judgment for Kant has an intrinsic logical form. The total set of such logical forms is the “table of judgments,” which Kant also describes as “the functions of unity in judgments” (A69/B94, emphasis added). He does this in order to draw special attention to the fact that for him logical form is essentially judgment-based: logical form is nothing but the intrinsic logico-syntactic and logico-semantic form of and in a proposition. So for Kant the propositional content of a judgment is more basic than its logical form.The table of judgments, in turn, captures a fundamental part of the science of pure general logic: pure, because it is a priori, necessary, and without any associated sensory content; general, because it is both universal and essentially formal, and thereby abstracts away from all specific objective representational contents and from the differences between particular represented objects; and logic because, in addition to the table of judgments, it also systematically provides normative cognitive rules for the truth of judgments (i.e., the law of non-contradiction or logical consistency) and for valid inference (i.e., the law of logical consequence) (A52-55/B76-79) (9: 11-16). In this way pure general logic is absolutely binding on any rational human cognizer and provides an unconditional logical ought. Like the unconditional moral ought, or Categorical Imperative, the logical ought is rarely correctly obeyed in the real world by finite flawed cognizers like us, who commit logical fallacies and moral sins with comparable frequency: sadly, ought does not entail is. Still, Kant's pure general logic is irreducible to all contingent facts and especially to all empirical psychological facts; hence his logic is thoroughly anti-psychologistic, which exploits the flip-side of unconditional obligation, whether logical or moral: happily, is does not entail ought.

Kant's table of judgments lays out a (putatively) exhaustive list of the different possible logical forms of propositions under four major headings, each major heading containing three sub-kinds, as follows.

Table of Judgments
  1. Quantity of Judgments: Universal, Particular, Singular.
  2. Quality: Affirmative, Negative, Infinite
  3. Relation: Categorical, Hypothetical, Disjunctive
  4. Modality: Problematic, Assertoric, Apodictic (A70/B95)

Given Kant's “privileging of predication,” it is not surprising that his logical forms are all either modifications or else truth-functional compounds of simple monadic (i.e.,1-place) categorical (i.e., subject-predicate) propositions of the general form “Fs are Gs.”

In this way, e.g., the three kinds of quantity of judgments are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which the comprehensions of the two constituent concepts of a simple monadic categorical proposition are logically combined and separated. So Kant says that universal judgments are of the form “All Fs are Gs”; that particular judgments are of the form “Some Fs are Gs”; and that singular judgments are of the form “This F is G” or “The F is G.”

By contrast, the three kinds of quality of judgments are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which the constituent concepts of a simple monadic categorical judgment can be either existentially posited or gesetzt, or else existentially cancelled or aufhebe, by respectively assigning non-empty actual extensions to concepts, or null actual extensions to concepts (A594-595/622-623). So Kant says that affirmative judgments are of the form “it is the case that Fs are Gs” (or more simply: “Fs are Gs”), negative judgments are of the form “no Fs are Gs”; and infinite judgments are of the form “Fs are non-Gs.”

By contrast again, the three kinds of relation of judgments are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which simple 1-place subject-predicate propositions can be either atomic (elementary) or molecular (compound) in respect of their truth-values. So Kant says that categorical judgments repeat the simple atomic 1-place subject-predicate form “Fs are Gs”; molecular hypothetical judgments are of the form “If Fs are Gs, then Hs are Is” (or: “If P then Q”); and molecular disjunctive judgments are of the form “Either Fs are Gs, or Hs are Is” (or: “Either P or Q”).

By contrast yet again and finally, the three kinds of modality of a judgment are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which the copula of a simple 1-place subject-predicate proposition “contributes nothing to the content of the judgment … but rather concerns only the value of the copula in relation to thinking in general” (A74/B99-100). This doctrine might seem to confuse the three propositional attitudes of tentative entertainment or “opining” (Meinen), assertoric belief, and certainty (A820-823/B848-851), with the genuinely modal notions of possibility, actuality, and necessity. Or even worse, it might seem to psychologize modality.

And this in turn raises in a pointed way a general difficulty in the common interpretation of Kant's theory of judgment: the tendency to hold that his logic and theory of judgment are at bottom epistemological or empirical psychological theories. But this common interpretation, as specifically applied to Kant's view of the modality of judgments, should be rejected for four reasons. First, he explicitly isolates and discusses the doxic propositional attitudes in the context of his epistemology of judgment, so it is obvious that he does not confuse logical modality with propositional attitudes. Second, he firmly rejects logical psychologism, as we have already seen. Third, the notion of “value” (Wert) here clearly means the truth-value of a whole proposition, not its propositional content, which explains why a modal predicate “contributes nothing to the content of a judgment.” Fourth and most importantly, the notion of “thinking in general” for Kant is the conceptual equivalent of Leibnizian logically possible worlds (Bxvii n., A573/B601). Thus the three kinds of modality of a judgment for Kant are, at bottom, the three basic ways in which truth can be assigned to simple 1-place subject-predicate propositions across logically possible worlds--whether to some worlds (possibility), to this world alone (actuality), or to all worlds (necessity). So Kant says that problematic judgments are of the form “Possibly, Fs are Gs” (or: “Possibly P”); assertoric judgments are of the form “Actually, Fs are Gs” (or: “Actually P”); and apodictic judgments are of the form “Necessarily, Fs are Gs” (or: “Necessarily P”).

2.1.2 Do the apparent limitations and confusions of Kant's logic undermine his theory of judgment?

From a contemporary point of view, Kant's pure general logic can seem limited in two fundamental ways. First, since his propositions are all either simple 1-place subject-predicate propositions or else truth-functional compounds of these, he apparently ignores relational predicates, the logic of relations, and the logic of multiple quantification. This is directly reflected in the fact that the argument-schemata explicitly considered by him in the Jäsche Logic are all truth-functional, syllogistic, or based on analytic containment. So his pure general logic is at most what we would now call a monadic logic (see Boolos & Jeffrey 1989, ch. 25), although second-order. Second, since Kant's list of propositional relations leaves out conjunction, even his propositional logic of truth-functions is apparently incomplete. The result of these apparent limitations is that Kant's logic is significantly weaker than “elementary” logic (i.e., bivalent first-order propositional and polyadic predicate logic plus identity) and thus cannot be equivalent to a mathematical logic in the Frege-Russell sense, which includes both elementary logic and also quantification over properties, classes, or functions (a.k.a. “second-order logic”).

Again from a contemporary point of view, Kant's logic can also seem confused in at least four basic ways. First, he construes the so-called “A” propositions of the Aristotelian-Scholastic square of opposition — i.e., universal affirmative propositions of the form “All Fs are Gs” — in the Aristotelian manner as carrying existential commitment in the “F” term, and therefore apparently overlooks the correct interpretation of “A” propositions as non-existentially-committed material conditionals of the form “For all x, if Fx then Gx.” Second, he construes the “if-then” or hypothetical conditional as the ground-consequence relation, and therefore apparently confuses strict or formal conditionals (i.e., logically necessary material conditionals) with material conditionals (according to which "if P then Q" is equivalent with "not-P or Q"). Third, in his distinction between negative and infinite judgments he apparently needlessly distinguishes between a “wide scope” negation of whole propositions and a “narrow scope” negation of predicates, thus creating a systematic ambiguity in interpreting propositions of the form “Fs are not Gs,” which can then be construed either as “no Fs are Gs” or as “Fs are non-Gs.” The ambiguity here is that because Kant assumes existential commitment in the “F” term of universal affirmative propositions, and because “Fs are non-Gs” can be construed a special case of an “A” proposition, then “Fs are non-Gs” has existential commitment, whereas “no Fs are Gs” does not. Fourth, he construes disjunction as the “exclusive or,” which implies that if “P or Q” is true then “P and Q” is false, and therefore apparently overlooks the correct interpretation of disjunction as the “inclusive or,” which implies that the truth of “P or Q” is consistent with the truth of “P and Q.” So the joint result of these four apparent confusions is that in this respect Kant's logic is significantly stronger than elementary logic and in fact is not an extensional logic.

Now it is true that for Kant all judgments are inherently a priori constrained by pure general logic, and it is also true that from a contemporary point of view Kant's logic can seem limited and confused in several fundamental ways. But is this actually a serious problem for his theory of judgment? No. To see why it is not, notice that the ascription of limitations and confusions to his logical theory depends almost entirely on taking a special point of view on the nature of logic, namely the viewpoint of Fregean and Russellian logicism, which posits the reducibility of mathematics (or at least arithmetic) to some version of second-order logic. This leads to two Kantian rejoinders. First, while it is quite true that Kant's pure general logic includes no logic of relations or multiple quantification, this is precisely because mathematical relations generally for him are represented spatiotemporally in pure or formal intuition, and not represented logically in the understanding. In other words, he does have a theory of mathematical relations, but it belongs to transcendental aesthetic, not to pure general logic. As a consequence of this, true mathematical propositions for Kant are not truths of logic — which are all analytic truths, or concept-based truths — but instead are synthetic truths, or intuition-based truths (see section 2.2.2). So for Kant, by the very nature of mathematical truth there can be no such thing as an authentically “mathematical logic.” And this is a substantive thesis about logic and mathematics that cannot be simply dismissed, in view of what we now know to be the very problematic status of logicism in relation to Russell's paradox, Alonzo Church's theorem on the undecidability of classical predicate logic, Kurt Gödel's first incompleteness theorem on the unprovability of classical predicate logic plus the Peano axioms for arithmetic, Alfred Tarski's closely related theorem on the indefinability of truth (Boolos & Jeffrey 1989, ch. 15), Frege's “Caesar” problem about uniquely identifying the numbers (Frege 1953), Paul Benacerraf's closely related worry about referential indeterminacy in any attempt to identify the numbers with objects (Benacerraf 1965), and ongoing debates about the supposedly analytic definability of the numbers in second-order logic plus Hume's principle of equinumerosity (Boolos 1998). Second, while it is again quite true that Kant does not include conjunction in his list of logical constants and that he construes disjunction as exclusive, it is also true (i) that he is clearly aware of inclusive disjunction, when he remarks that if we assume the truth of the ground-consequence conditional, then “whether both of these propositions are in themselves true remains unsettled here,” and then immediately distinguishes the “relation of consequence” from exclusive disjunction (A73/B98-99), and (ii) that as Augustus De Morgan and Harry Sheffer later showed, conjunction is systematically definable in terms of negation and inclusive disjunction (De Morgan), and all possible truth-functions (including of course exclusive disjunction) can be expressed as functions of a single truth-function of two propositions involving only negation and inclusive disjunction (Sheffer). So at least implicitly, Kant's propositional logic of truth-functions is complete. Third and finally, while it is yet again quite true that Kant's logic is not extensional, this is precisely because his logic is an intensional logic of non-uniform existential commitments, primitive modalities, and finegrained conceptual structures. So given Kant's conception of logic, his list of logical forms will automatically be in one way much more narrowly restricted (because of his focus on monadic logic) and in another way automatically much more broadly inclusive (because of his focus on intensional logic), than those of elementary logic or second-order logic. But this dual focus also presents a uniquely Kantian conception of logic that cannot be simply dismissed, in view of (a) the important fact that amongst the classical predicate logics monadic logic alone (whether first-order or second-order) is decidable and provable or complete (Boolos & Jeffrey 1989) (Denyer 1992), which well supports a claim to the effect that Kant's pure general logic is the “a priori core” of classical predicate logic, and (b) the equally important fact of the rigorous development and burgeoning of intensional logics — and non-classical logics more generally — since the middle of the 20th century (Priest 2001).

2.2 Kinds of propositional content

For Kant, as we have seen, the propositional content of a judgment is more basic than its logical form. The propositional content of a judgment, in turn, can vary along at least three different dimensions: (1) its relation to sensory content; (2) its relation to the truth-conditions of propositions; and (3) its relation to the conditions for objective validity.

2.2.1 A priori judgments and a posteriori judgments

The notion of “cognitive content” for Kant has two sharply distinct senses: (i) intension or Inhalt, which is objective and representational (semantic content); and (ii) sensory matter or Materie, which is subjective and non-representational, reflecting only the immediate conscious response of the mind to the external impressions or inputs that trigger the operations of the faculty of sensibility (phenomenal qualitative content) (A19-20/B34, A320/B376). To be sure, for Kant just as for the Empiricists, all cognition “begins with” (mit … anfange) the raw data of sensory impressions. But in a crucial departure from Empiricism and towards what might be called a mitigated rationalism, Kant also holds that not all cognition “arises from” (entspringt … aus) sensory impressions: so for him, a significant and unique contribution to both the form and the objective representational content of cognition arises from the innate spontaneous cognitive capacities (B1). This notion of cognition's “arising from” either sensory impressions or innate spontaneous cognitive capacities can best be construed as a strict determination relation (similar to what is nowadays called “strong supervenience”) such that X strictly determines Y if and only if the X-features of something are sufficient for its Y-features, and there cannot be a change in anything's Y-features without a corresponding change in its X-features. This allows us to say that a cognition is a posteriori or dependent on sensory impressions just in case it is strictly determined in its form or in its semantic content by sensory impressions; but a cognition is a priori or absolutely independent of all sensory impressions just in case it is not strictly determined in its form or in its semantic content by sensory impressions and is instead strictly determined in its form or in its semantic content by our innate spontaneous cognitive faculties (B2-3). It should be noted that the apriority of a cognition in this sense is perfectly consistent with all sorts of associated sensory impressions and also with the actual presence of sensory matter in that cognition, so long as neither the form nor the semantic content is strictly determined by those sensory impressions. “Pure” a priori cognitions are those that in addition to being a priori or absolutely independent of all sensory impressions, also contain no sensory matter whatsoever (B3). So in other words, some but not all a priori cognitions are pure.

Applying these notions to judgments, it follows that a judgment is a posteriori if and only if either its logical form or its propositional content is strictly determined by sensory impressions; and a judgment is a apriori if and only if neither its logical form nor its propositional content is strictly determined by sensory impressions and both are instead strictly determined by our innate spontaneous cognitive faculties, whether or not that cognition also contains sensory matter. Kant also holds that a judgment is a priori if and only if it is necessarily true (Axv, B3-4, A76/B101). This strong connection between necessity and apriority expresses (i) Kant's view that the contingency of a judgment is bound up with the modal dependence of its semantic content on sensory impressions, i.e., its aposteriority (B3), (ii) his view that necessity is equivalent with strict universality or strenge Allgemeinheit, which he defines in turn as a proposition's lack of any possible counterexamples or falsity-makers (B4), and (iii) his view that necessity entails truth (A75-76/B100-101). Furthermore Kant explicitly holds that not only do a priori judgments really exist in various sciences, including physics and metaphysics, but also that there really are some pure a priori judgments, e.g., in mathematics (B4-5, B14-18).

2.2.2 Analytic judgments and synthetic judgments

Kant's distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments is the historical origin of, and intimately related to, but — crucially — not precisely equivalent, either in intension or extension, with the nowadays more familiar analytic-synthetic distinction, according to which (1) analyticity is truth by virtue of linguistic meaning alone, exclusive of empirical facts, (2) syntheticity is truth by virtue of empirical facts, and (3) the necessary statement vs. contingent statement distinction is formally and materially equivalent to the analytic-synthetic distinction. By 1950 this more familiar distinction was accepted as gospel truth by virtually all analytic philosophers: but in the two decades after the publication of W.V.O. Quine's iconoclastic “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” in 1951 (Quine 1961), it was gradually replaced by the new-and-improved post-Quinean gospel truth that there is no such thing as an acceptable analytic-synthetic distinction. This plain historical fact is closely related to the highly regrettable further fact that Kant's analytic-synthetic distinction is nowadays often wrongly interpreted (i) in terms of the more familiar and now largely discredited analytic-synthetic distinction, and also (ii) as reducible to an epistemic distinction between uninformatively or trivially true a priori judgments and informative judgments. Ironically Frege, the father or grandfather of analytic philosophy, was much nearer the mark in the Foundations of Arithmetic when he correctly construed Kant's theory of analyticity semantically, as a theory about necessary internal relations between concepts; although at the same time he not quite so correctly said that Kantian analyticity boils down to “simply taking out of the box again what we have just put into it” (Frege 1953, 101). Backing away now from Frege, the crucial fact is that Kant's analytic-synthetic distinction concerns two irreducibly different kinds of semantic content within objectively valid propositions (Hanna 2001, chs. 3-4), and this distinction is neither primarily epistemic in character (although it does have some important epistemic implications [Hanna 1998]) nor does it specifically concern the logical form of judgments (4: 266).

Frege regarded Kant's notion of analyticity as trivial. But on the contrary Kant's notion of analyticity is substantive, by virtue of four important ideas: first, Kant's pro-Leibnizian idea that all concepts have intensional microstructures, or what he calls “logical essences” or “conceptual essences” (9: 61); second, his anti-Leibnizian idea that logically possible worlds are nothing but maximal logically consistent sets of concepts, not things-in-themselves (A571-573/B599-601); third, his referentialist idea that all grammatically well-formed, sortally correct, and logically consistent concepts have non-empty cross-possible-worlds extensions (a.k.a. "comprehensions") (A239/B298-299) (9: 95-96); and fourth, his semantic restrictionist idea that all and only objectively valid propositions have truth-values. Then a judgment is analytic if and only if its propositional content is necessarily true by virtue of necessary internal relations between its objectively valid conceptual microstructures or its conceptual comprehensions (Hanna 2001, 153-154). Kant also offers a corresponding semantic criterion for the truth of analytic judgments, namely that a judgment is analytically true if and only if its denial logically entails a contradiction, in a broad sense of “logical entailment” that includes intensional entailment and not merely classical deductive entailment (A151/B190-191). This criterion also directly connects the notion of an analytic truth with the notion of a logical truth in a correspondingly broad sense that is neither restricted to nor reducible (with the addition of “logical definitions” [Frege 1953], whatever they are [Benacerraf 1981]) to truth-functional tautologies and valid sentences of classical predicate logic.

But what about syntheticity? Since for Kant the analytic-synthetic distinction is exhaustive in the sense that every proposition is either analytic or synthetic but not both, his two-part doctrine of analyticity in turn provides him with a two-part negative doctrine of syntheticity: A proposition is synthetic if and only if its truth is not strictly determined by relations between its conceptual microstructures or conceptual comprehensions alone; and a judgment is synthetically true if and only if it is true and its denial does not logically entail a contradiction. But this negative characterization of course does not tell us what the truth of synthetic judgments positively consists in. In order to do this, Kant directly connects the semantics of syntheticity with the semantics of intuitions, just as he directly connects the semantics of analyticity with the semantics of concepts. Then positively put, a judgment is synthetic if and only if its meaning and its truth are strictly determined by its constituent intuitions, whether empirical intuitions or pure intuitions (A8, A154-155/B193-194, A721/B749) (8: 245) (11: 38). This is not to say either that synthetic judgments do not contain any concepts (in fact they always do contain concepts), or even that the conceptual components of a synthetic judgment are irrelevant to its meaning or truth (in fact concepts always are semantically relevant), but only to say that in a synthetic judgment it is the intuitional components that strictly determine its meaning and truth, not its conceptual components. In short, a synthetic judgment is an intuition-based proposition.

2.2.3 Synthetic a priori judgments

Every reader of the Critique of Pure Reason knows that Kant glosses his philosophical project in that book as a complete and systematic answer to the question, “how are synthetic a priori judgments possible?” (B19). Also every reader of the first Critique knows that Kant asserts the existence of synthetic a priori judgments in mathematics, physics, and metaphysics (B14-18, A158/B197). But fewer readers are aware that this assertion, whether right or wrong, is certainly the boldest and perhaps also the most important claim in post-Cartesian metaphysics. This is because it posits the thesis of modal dualism, or the claim that there are two irreducibly different basic types of necessary truth, in the face of the almost universally-held counter-thesis of modal monism, or the claim that there is one and only basic type of necessary truth, i.e., analytically or logically necessary truth. Given Kant's theory of truth, modal dualism also implies the worldly existence of two irreducibly different types of modal facts as truth-makers for analytically and synthetically necessary truths respectively. In short if Kant is right, then there are fundamentally more things in heaven and earth than modal monists are prepared to acknowledge. Moreover Kant holds that all the basic statements of traditional metaphysics are, at least in intention, synthetic a priori judgments (B18). Hence his famous critique of traditional metaphysics in the Transcendental Dialectic is nothing but a deepened and extended investigation of the possibility of synthetic a priori judgments.

But what is a synthetic a priori judgment? Combining the a priori-a posteriori distinction with the analytic-synthetic distinction, Kant derives four possible kinds of judgment: (1) analytic a priori, (2) analytic a posteriori, (3) synthetic a priori, and (4) synthetic a posteriori. By virtue of the fact that analytic judgments are necessarily true, and given Kant's thesis that necessity entails apriority, it follows that all analytic judgments are a priori and that there is no such thing as an analytic a posteriori judgment. By contrast, synthetic judgments can be either a priori or a posteriori. Synthetic a posteriori judgments are empirical, contingent judgments, although they may vary widely as to their degree of generality. Synthetic a priori judgments, by contrast, are non-empirical, non-contingent judgments.

More precisely however, synthetic a priori judgments have three essential features. First, because a synthetic a priori judgment is a priori, its meaning and truth are underdetermined by sensory impressions and it is also necessarily true. Second, because a synthetic a priori judgment is synthetic, not analytic, its truth is not strictly determined by conceptual factors alone, and its denial is logically consistent. Third, as is the case with all synthetic judgments, the meaning and truth of a synthetic a priori judgment is intuition-based. This third factor is the crucial one. For while the meaning and truth of synthetic a posteriori judgments is based on empirical intuitions, the meaning and truth of synthetic a priori judgments is based on pure intuitions or our a priori formal representations of space and time (B73) (8: 245) (11: 38). Now since according to Kant our a priori formal representations of space and time are both necessary conditions of the possibility of human experience and also necessary conditions of the objective validity or anthropocentric empirical referential meaningfulness of judgments, which in turn confers truth-valuedness upon propositions, it then follows that a synthetic a priori judgment is a proposition that is true in all and only the humanly experienceable possible worlds and truth-valueless otherwise (Hanna 2001, 239-245). By sharp contrast, analytic judgments, as logical truths, are true in all logically possible worlds, including those logically possible worlds in which human experience is not possible, i.e., the worlds containing non-phenomenal or non-apparent entities, or the “noumenal worlds.”

So analytic and synthetic a priori judgments sharply differ not only in the nature of their semantic content (concept-based vs. intuition-based) but also in their modal scope (true in all logically possible worlds vs. true in all and only humanly experienceable worlds and truth-valueless otherwise). Nevertheless, despite this sharp difference in modal scope — from which it follows, perhaps surprisingly, that for Kant there are logically possible worlds in which synthetic a priori propositions such as “7+5=12” are thinkably deniable (Hanna 2002) — since synthetic a priori judgments are either true or truth-valueless in every logically possible world, it also follows that they are never false in any logically possible world and thus satisfy Kant's general definition of a necessary truth, i.e., that a proposition is necessary if and only if it is strictly universally true, in that it is true in every member of a complete class of possible worlds and has no possible counterexamples or falsity-makers (Hanna 2001, ch. 5). Less abstractly and gallumphingly put, a synthetic a priori judgment is a necessary truth with a human face.

Kant offers an account of human rationality that is essentially oriented towards judgment, and then in turn works out accounts of the nature of judgment, the nature of logic, and the nature of the various irreducibly different kinds of judgments, that are essentially oriented towards the anthropocentric empirical referential meaningfulness and truth of the proposition. The rest of Kant's theory of judgment is then thoroughly cognitivist (Kitcher 1990) and non-reductive. Propositions are systematically built up out of directly referential terms (intuitions) and attributive or descriptive terms (concepts), by means of unifying acts of our innate spontaneous cognitive faculties, according to pure logical constraints, under a higher-order unity imposed by our faculty for rational self-consciousness. Furthermore all of this is consistently combined by Kant with nonconceptualism about intuition, which entails that judgmental rationality has a pre-rational or proto-rational cognitive grounding in more basic nonconceptual cognitive capacities that we share with various non-human animals (Bermúdez 2003b). In these ways, the inherent philosophical interest, contemporary relevance, and defensibility of Kant's theory of judgment remain essentially intact no matter what one may ultimately think about his controversial metaphysics of transcendental idealism.


Internal references to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason contain page numbers from both the A (1781) and B (1787) German editions. All other internal references to Kant's writings are cited using the relevant volume and page number from the standard “Akademie” edition of Kant's works: Kants gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Königlich Preussischen (now Deutschen) Akademie der Wissenschaften (Berlin: G. Reimer [now de Gruyter], 1902-).

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