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Intentionality in Ancient Greek Philosophy

Philosophical inquiry into intentionality – that feature of beliefs, desires, and other mental states, in virtue of which they are of or about something – begins long before recent debates about mental content or even the work of phenomenologists towards the beginning of the twentieth century. According to the received view, widespread in the literature, it can be traced back past figures such as Edmund Husserl and Franz Brentano to late medieval discussions in the Latin West; and from these, in turn, to earlier Arabic philosophy. But at this point, the trail is supposed to peter out. Nothing in Greek or Roman philosophy, allegedly, corresponds.

But in fact this narrative rests on questionable assumptions. Once the investigation is properly framed, it is clear that philosophical interest in intentionality can be traced back to the very origins of ancient philosophy. Intentionality is treated as involving serious problems already in the early- to mid-fifth century B.C.E., arguably first by Parmenides of Elea, but indisputably by sophists such as Gorgias and Protagoras. Plato thematizes the difficulties and discusses them at length in several dialogues. In later philosophers, we find various theoretical solutions, including appeals to internal representations (Aristotle), to nonexistent objects of thought (early Stoics), and to propositions and other semantic entities (later Stoics). The terminology of intentionality itself can be traced back, through Augustine, to the Stoic theory of vision.

1. The history of the term

The received view traces back to an article by the phenomenologist Herbert Spiegelberg, originally published in 1933 (for a translation of a revised version, see Spiegelberg 1976). It turns entirely on philosophical terminology: it only considers texts that use the term ‘intention’ (Latin ‘intentio’) or its cognates, in a specific technical sense, that of a mental act's being directed at or referring to something, in contrast with a usage that applies exclusively to practical contexts, where an agent intends or strives to do something. Spiegelberg claims that before the high scholastic period, uses of the Latin ‘intentio’ were exclusively practical and therefore have no bearing on the problem of the intentionality of mental states, as such. The closest antecedents, he claims, are the Arabic ‘ma'na’ and ‘ma'qul’, which were translated into Latin in the high scholastic period by ‘intentio’.

This account, even when considered simply a history of the terminology, is seriously mistaken. Late scholastic discussions often cite Augustine, in particular Book XI of his On the Trinity, in which ‘intentio’ plays a central role. And while Augustine does identify this with will (uoluntas) and even love (amor) – thus suggesting a purely practical application of the term – he does not have such concerns primarily in mind. On the contrary, his use of ‘intentio’ belongs to his analysis of cognition, starting with vision and continuing on with memory, thought, and self-knowledge. He argues that analyses of perception (such as Aristotle’s) that only refer to the perceptual object and the sense-faculty are inadequate. They leave out a third element, which he identifies with some basic form of striving or will, that directs the sense to the object and keeps it fixed on it. It is precisely because of this trio of factors that he believes psychology can be useful to Trinitarian theology. Since humans, and in particular the “inner man,” are made in God's image, a human must also replicate God’s triune structure. In particular, the role ‘intentio’ plays in cognition will be parallel to that of the Holy Spirit, mediating between the Father and the Son. It mediates between the object and the cognitive faculty. Augustine thus plays a crucial role in the later history of what Spiegelberg called “extra-practical” intentionality, independently of the contributions of Arabic philosophy.

Augustine, moreover, is adapting and developing earlier Greek views. In Book XII of his Literal Commentary on Genesis, he offers an extensive analysis of vision that relies heavily on Stoic theory. According to both, visual experience depends on the extension of pneuma (‘spirit’, ‘breath’) – for Augustine, something immaterial, but for the Stoics a gaseous body – through passages such as the optic nerve to the eye, where it either reaches out through the pupil to the object (Augustine) or tenses the intervening air into a cone with its base at the object (the Stoics). Vision takes place when the object and the eye or the sense of sight are connected by this means. The word that the Stoic Chrysippus uses for this extending of the “visual cone” to the object is the Greek ‘enteinein’ (noun ‘entasis’), cognate with Latin‘ intendo’, ‘intentio’ (Diogenes Laertius VII 157). So if we were looking not only for a continuous transmission of terminology, but even more specifically for cognates of ‘intentio’, we could trace it back at least to the third century B.C.E., if not to still earlier extromission theories of vision.

Other expressions and figures of speech familiar to us in modern treatments of intentionality can be found in ancient discussions, even though we cannot trace a continuous connection from them to our own usage. Throughout antiquity, for example, we find the antithesis of ‘presence in absence’ (parôn apôn) used to describe the way a mental state can make something “present” to us that is nevertheless absent from our current surroundings or even from reality altogether. Aristotle mentions it explicitly as an aporia or difficulty that must be resolved (On Memory and Recollection 1, 450a25 ff.). Certain Stoics speak of certain objects as immanent, as literally present, “in thought” (what they call ennoêmata), while later thinkers use the phrase “existing in mere thoughts alone” (en psilais epinoiais monais) to characterize merely intentional objects. Even the metaphor of directedness – of aiming the mind at something (intendere animum in), like an arrow – can be found in ancient texts. In Plato’s Cratylus (420b-c), Socrates suggests that the word ‘belief’ (doxa) derives etymologically from ‘bow’ (toxon): it ‘goes toward’ each thing and how it is in reality. Socrates then extends this to deliberative states. (‘Plan’ (boulê), for example, derives from ‘shot’ (bolê).) The metaphor is repeated again in the Theaetetus (194a). One who believes falsely is “like a bad archer who shoots and misses his target and goes wrong”.

2. The history of the problem

But a mere study of terminology, even when done correctly, tracks the wrong items. Over the course of their history, technical terms are often used to express very different concepts: consider the terms ‘substance,’ ‘matter,’ or even ‘concept.’ Conversely, a single concept is often expressed by different terms, some of which may not be technical ones at all – a situation especially likely at the beginning of inquiry into the subject. So even when terminology is used as evidence, more must be brought into consideration. Philosophical interest should focus on the concept of intentionality itself or, better still, the divergent conceptions of intentionality that philosophers have had, and their resulting disagreements. These differences afford us the greatest perspective on our own presuppositions and preoccupations. The best way to approach this is by looking at the history of the problem of intentionality: the difficulty, that is, of providing a philosophically adequate account of the nature of intentionality, in light of its various peculiarities (whatever terms may have been used to refer to it). Such an approach not only allows room for different theories of intentionality, but also includes attempts to dissolve the problem, either by dismissing the phenomenon entirely or by denying that there is any genuine difficulty involved.

The problem of intentionality is the problem of explaining what it is in general for mental states to have content, as well as the particular conditions responsible for specific variations in content. The difficulty of providing such an account lies partially in explaining why mental states often appear to violate certain familiar entailment patterns (whether or not these violations are criterial of intentionality). The content of our mental states, for example, often does not correspond with what is in the world. What we imagine may not exist, our beliefs can be false, our desires vain and unfulfilled. To put it more paradoxically, a mental state may be about something, even if there isn’t any such thing in the world which it is about. This is one of a number of peculiarities that prove difficult to account for, and which are sometimes thought to pose a particular stumbling block for naturalistic approaches to the mind. As Wittgenstein once quipped, you can’t hang a man unless he is there; but you can look for him even if he is not, and even if he does not exist at all (Philosophical Investigations 1.133, §462). There are other peculiarities as well, concerning our ability to focus selectively on certain aspects of objects, without having others in mind. I cannot greet a person, for instance, without greeting a person of some particular height; but I can think of a person, without thinking of a person of any particular height. Worse, I can entertain different attitudes at the same time to the same object, depending on the aspect under which I consider it. Thus, I might believe that the Morning Star is a star and that Venus is not, despite the fact that Venus is the Morning Star; yet we cannot, precisely because they are the same object, land a space probe on one without thereby landing it on the other. These and other difficulties form a loose family of phenomena that give rise to the problem of intentionality. Different solutions may regard these phenomena differently, perhaps isolating some while excluding others, or even eliminating some of these phenomena outright as data to be accounted for. What is important for the history is a philosopher’s sensitivity to the alleged difficulty, whatever solution he chooses to adopt.

3. Before Plato

The first attention paid to intentionality in Greek philosophy is arguably in the early 5th century B.C.E., in Parmenides’ poem (later referred to as On Nature), where it is already taken to be problematic. Indeed, his poem rejects several of the hallmarks of intentionality just mentioned as impossible or even incoherent, as part of its startling revelation about what we can actually think or say. The narrator of the poem is instructed by a goddess that “you cannot grasp or express what is not – it cannot be accomplished” (fr. 2), for “thinking cannot be found apart from what is, upon which its expression depends” (fr. 8, lines 35-6) and “what can be said and thought must be what is” (fr. 6). The phrases ‘what is’ and ‘what is not’ in Greek philosophy are notoriously difficult for us to construe. But if, as many interpreters maintain (see Owen 1960; Furth 1968), it should be construed here either in terms of (a) what does or does not exist, or (b) what is or is not the case, or perhaps (c) some fusion of these two, then the goddess is denying the possibility of thinking or speaking about nonexistent objects, or nonfactual states-of-affairs, or both. If one is to think or express anything at all, there must be something that one is thinking or expressing. But what is not, by hypothesis, is not there to be thought of (cf. fr. 3), since either it does not exist or is not in fact the case; and if there is nothing there to be thought of, then in that case we cannot be thinking of anything either. Parallel problems are supposed to arise in the case of speech, for statements concerning a nonexistent (‘Pegasus is a winged horse’) or for false statements.

Concerns with non-existent objects or non-factual states of affairs are not explicit in Parmenides' poem, however, and this leaves room for other construals of ‘what is not’ (such as the view that it always allows completion or specification as ‘what is not F,’ for some value of F, so that ‘what is not’ raises concerns about negative predication instead, especially in explanatory and cosmological contexts). But whatever Parmenides actually meant, it is clear that his subsequent reception turns precisely on the problem sketched above, concerning what does not exist and what is not the case. Proscriptions similar to Parmenides’ are numerous in the remainder of the 5th century, though offered by philosophers with quite different motivations and agendas, including Protagoras, Gorgias, the author of pseudo-Hippocratic treatise On the Art, Anaxagoras, Metrodorus of Chios, Euthydemus, Cratylus, and Antisthenes. In many of these cases, the denial is explicitly formulated as a rejection of the possibility of falsehood, of thinking or speaking of what is not the case.

The sophists Protagoras and Gorgias are of particular interest. According to Plato, Protagoras held that one cannot believe what is not and that whatever one experiences is true (Theaetetus 167a). This fits snugly with Protagoras’ widely attested doctrine that “(each) human being is the measure of all things,” which, on any interpretation, excludes the possibility of error. But Protagoras’ endorsement reveals an interesting subtlety in the Parmenidean thesis that what is not cannot be thought about – or more positively, the thesis that if something is had in mind, it must be. The goddess in Parmenides’ poem uses this thesis in a negative fashion, moving from the assumption that certain things ‘are not’’ to the paradoxical conclusion that we cannot actually think about them either. But one might equally use it, as Protagoras appears to, in a positive fashion, to move from the assumption that we can in fact think of such things to the conclusion that they must in fact ‘be’, i.e., exist or obtain, after all. In itself, the Parmenidean thesis only makes a conditional claim, and it seems open, prima facie, to employ either modus tollens or modus ponens. Depending on whether one retains commonplace assumptions about what we can think or about what there is in the world, the Parmenidean thesis can lead either to a bloated ontology or a very restricted psychology.

Gorgias challenges the thesis itself in his On Not Being. The treatise (reported in the pseudo-Aristotelian On Melissus, Xenophanes, and Gorgias and in Sextus Empiricus’ Adversus Mathematicos VII 65 ff.) takes aim at Eleatic assumptions, and especially those of Parmenides, by arguing first that there isn’t anything; secondly, even if there is something, it cannot be known; and finally, even if it can be known, one could not inform anyone else of this. The second part is of particular interest, since Gorgias offers a reductio ad absurdum of the Parmenidean thesis, especially when deployed in a positive way. Given that we can obviously have in mind, for example, that a chariot-team is racing on the sea – in fact, just by reading this, we put it in mind – it should follow from the Parmenidean thesis that there is a chariot-team racing on the sea; but (pace Protagoras) plainly there is not; therefore, we must reject this tight linkage between thought and reality. Gorgias goes on to argue for a sceptical conclusion, on the grounds that we have no basis for discerning which mental states correspond to reality and which do not, and so cannot know anything at all. But the thrust of his criticism is that our ordinary intuitions about what we do in fact think about and what does in fact exist together undermine the Parmenidean thesis.

The motivation behind the Parmenidean thesis appears to be the intuition that thought (or indeed any other mental state) consists in a direct relation to what is thought about. For given that a relation cannot obtain unless all its relata exist or obtain, it will follow that we cannot ever think of ‘what is not’ – of what does not exist or obtain. To the extent that this simple relational model has a grip on us, we will be drawn to either Parmenidean or Protagorean conclusions. In fact, we can reformulate these assumptions as an inconsistent triad (using ‘thought’ schematically for mental states more generally, and allowing for the ambiguity between ‘exists’ and ‘obtains’):

  1. Thought consists in a direct relation to what is thought about.
  2. No relation can obtain unless all its relata exist/obtain.
  3. Sometimes we can think about what does not exist/obtain.

Each of these three views possesses a certain intuitive appeal. But taken together, they are formally inconsistent, and so at least one has to be given up. This does not entirely force our hand, however, since any two of the three are mutually consistent. As we have seen, some 5th century thinkers (including Parmenides himself, on some interpretations) chose to accept (A) and (B), and reject (C). Yet if this seems too costly, as it does to most people, we have to reject one of the other two propositions instead. The obvious candidate for rejection is (A) – that is, the direct relational model itself. One might either (i) reject a relational analysis altogether or (ii) accept a relational analysis, but hold that it involves a relation to something other than what the mental state is about. Much of the subsequent discussion in ancient philosophy can be seen as an attempt to pursue the last strategy, (ii), by finding a suitable intermediary: certain Platonists appeal to Forms, for example, while Aristotle appeals to changes within our body that serve as internal representations; later Stoics appeal to abstract semantic objects like propositions; Epicurus appeals to parts of the surfaces of bodies. But one might also retain the direct relational model unchanged, by abandoning (B) instead, as the early Stoics did. Whenever one thinks, they agree, there is something which one thinks about; but it needn’t be something that exists or obtains. There are things, that is, which do not exist or obtain, which can serve as intentional objects.

4. Plato

[Not yet available.]

5. Aristotle

Medieval theories of intentionality – not to mention more recent philosophers influenced by these theories, such as Brentano (1874) – draw their inspiration from Aristotle’s theory of sensation and understanding, in particular his doctrine that in cognition the form of the sensible or intelligible object is “received without the matter” (On the Soul II 12; cf. III 4 and 8) and the doctrine that the object, or more precisely its activity as an object of cognition, is “one and the same” as the activity of cognition and is present in the cognizing subject (III 2). But although sensation and understanding are both intentional states, and Aristotle’s analyses of them are central to his psychological theory as a whole, these passages in fact reveal little direct evidence of a conception of intentionality. Each doctrine applies much more widely than to just intentional states: the impression of signet ring in wax is offered as an example of a form’s being received without the matter (to which later commentators add images in mirrors), while the identity of active and passive factors applies to any agent-patient interaction in general. Each doctrine also fails to apply to paradigmatic cases of intentional states, like dreams or future hopes. Neither doctrine, therefore, provides either a necessary or a sufficient condition for intentionality. They are rather general causal doctrines that apply to a special class of intentional states, like sensation and understanding, where the intentional state is about what brings it about – that is, it is about its own cause – something that is not true of intentional states in general.

Aristotle himself is aware of the special character of these particular states. In fact, he criticizes his predecessors for failing to account for intentional states whose objects are not their causes. In the second chapter of his essay On Memory and Recollection, he rejects the idea that thought extends, like a ray, to its object, because we “think in the same way even when they do not exist”: in such cases a ray will not work, since there will not be anything for it to extend to. He goes further in his polemic On Ideas, when he rejects Platonic theories that take our thoughts to be of Forms, which always exist, whether or not the individuals that fall under them do. Such theories do succeed in avoiding the previous criticism. But they do not work, Aristotle believes, for the full range of thoughts we actually have, since we can think of particular individuals who no longer exist, like Socrates, and mythical creatures that “do not exist in any way at all,” like the hippocentaur. In such cases, there is no Form of the right sort that can serve as the object of thought. Aristotle seems confident that his own theory has the resources to deal with both sets of counterexamples. He believes there are changes in our bodies that represent or model the objects in question, and by undergoing these changes we are able to have thoughts with the relevant contents, whether or not the corresponding objects exist in the world at large.

Aristotle describes such changes as ‘phantasmata,’ a term often translated as ‘images.’ But while such representations are involved in imagistic experiences, such as visualization and dreams, they are also capable of bearing content in the absence of such experience. Aristotle deploys ‘phantasmata’ throughout his psychology, in cognitive states, like thought and memory, as well as in desires, passions, and action. The underlying capacity, which he calls ‘phantasia,’ is formally introduced in On the Soul III 3 in response once again to the problem of intentionality. According to Aristotle, his predecessors are unable to explain how error could ever take place. On their view, all cognition is about what brings it about, such that “like is known by like,” and this, he believes, precludes the possibility of error. To the extent that he explains sensation and understanding along similar lines, Aristotle will be vulnerable to the same criticism. And in line with this, he actually regards both states (at least in their most basic forms) as incapable of falsehood. But unlike his predecessors, Aristotle does not think that all mental states are to be explained on this model. As he immediately goes on to argue, phantasia is a distinct kind of mental state that cannot be reduced to sensation, understanding, belief, or even a combination of belief and perception. It consists in perceptual traces, which are capable of affecting the central organ in the same way that perceptual stimulations do and so capable of producing similar experiences even in the absence of the corresponding external objects. It is this, he claims, that makes falsehood possible and so explains the actions and reactions of animals.

Thought, Aristotle insists, always requires a phantasma. But the content of even the simplest concepts goes beyond that contained in any such quasi-perceptual representations (On the Soul III 7, 8; On Memory 1). At a minimum, in thought we are able to ignore many of the features of such representations, just as we can use a diagram of a triangle for mathematical purposes without being concerned with its particular dimensions (On Memory 1). But we are also capable of using one concept to form the opposite concept and of applying one concept to another to result in a compound propositional thought capable of truth or falsehood (On the Soul III 6; Metaphysics IX 10). The abstract content that results from such operations allows us to use symbols to speak and understand one another (On Interpretation 1).

6. After Aristotle: The Stoics

The early Stoics seem committed to preserving the intuition that whenever we are in a mental state, there is something which our mental state is of or about. But they reject the Parmenidean requirement that this must be something “which is,” that is, something which exists or obtains. On the contrary, they claim, “there are in the nature of things some things that have being and some that do not,” since it includes “anything that comes to mind, such as centaurs, giants or anything else made up by a false thought.” Accordingly, these Stoics regard Something as the highest genus, rather than What is, what has being (Seneca Letter LVIII). When we are appeared to (phantasia), but there isn’t anything existent which is appearing to us, what appears is only an “apparition” (phantasma). But it is nonetheless something and so can serve as the object of our mental state.

One kind of nonexistent intentional object is of particular interest. In addressing the problem of universals, the first two heads of the school – Zeno and Cleanthes – argue that there are no such things as Plato’s Forms. When we form conceptions (ennoiai) of genera and species, such conceptions are of concepts (ennoêmata), which are apparitions that are quite literally “in thought” (en + noêma) – but only there. The precise nature of concepts is controversial, however. According to one source (Stobaeus, Ecl. 1.136.21 ff.), concepts are “not something,” and so not something qualified in a certain way, but only “as if” they were something and “as if” they were qualified; they are only “apparitions” (phantasmata). Most interpretations accordingly take Stoic concepts to be “not-somethings”: fictions or figments that are so beyond the pale, metaphysically speaking, that they do not even count as something. But so understood, the Stoic view is puzzling at best. If they are not something, they cannot be anything, on pain of contradiction. That is why the Stoics think that Something is the highest genus: everything is something. But if there are no such things, what is gained by replacing Platonic Forms with Stoic concepts, by replacing one fiction with another? Why not just declare Platonic Forms to be a useful fiction, and avoid introducing another?

The Stoics do think they have gained something by this move. They appeal to concepts crucially in characterizing the methods of definition and division, which are central to Stoic dialectic. In fact, far from constituting a null set, different concepts are distinguished from one another, as they would have to be for there to be a system of diverse genera and species. The Stoics thus quantify over concepts: there is a distinct concept, in fact, for each number. In referring to concepts as “apparitions” (phantasmata), the Stoics are not eliminating them, but recognizing them as the objects our mind is directed to whenever something general comes to mind or appears (phantasia). For whatever appears to us is something, according to the Stoics, even if it is not something that is, something that exists or obtains. The natural move for the Stoics, then, would be to say that while Platonic Forms aren’t anything at all – there are no such things – concepts are something. There are such things as concepts; they just aren’t anything that is, that exists. A parallel text in Diogenes Laertius can be read in just this way: although a concept is not anything that exists and so does not possess qualities, it is nevertheless “as if” it were something that exists and “as if” it possessed qualities, “like the impression of a horse when none is present” (Diogenes Laertius VII 61). What I imagine is something and indeed something horse-like, but it is not a real horse or anything existent.

Concepts will also be incomplete or indeterminate. It will not be true to say that the “generic man” is Greek, for example, or to say that he is not Greek (even in an “as if” sort of way), since some, but not all, humans are Greek (Sextus Empiricus, Adv. math. VII 246). A generic object will be “as if” it were F if, and only if, all the individuals falling under it are F. This need not violate the Principle of the Excluded Middle: it would still be true of the generic man that he is either Greek or not Greek, since it is true that all humans are either Greek or not Greek. But it would violate the Principle of Bivalence, since it will be neither true nor false, for example, to say that the generic man is Greek.

The third head of the school, Chrysippus, avoids these problems by appealing instead to “that which can be expressed” or “meant” (lekta, lit. ‘sayables’), certain abstract objects that are signified by our words. Like place, void, and time, for the Stoics, they can neither act nor be acted upon, and as such cannot be bodies, which are the only ‘beings’ that they recognize. Instead, ‘sayables’ can be classified, with place, void, and time, as ‘incorporeals’. And they will still be something – since there is something in each case that our words signify. These somethings, the Stoics say, subsist (huphestanai) rather than are, or have being (einai). Rather than serving as the objects of certain mental states, they are the contents that mental states quite generally bear, which can be articulated in language (Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. VIII 11-12, 70, 409; Diogenes Laertius VII 63). There are significations corresponding to predicates, as well as to sentences of all kinds: both simple and molecular propositions (axiômata), but also questions, commands, oaths, suggestions, prayers, and so on (Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. VIII 71-3; Diogenes Laertius VII 66-8). For Chrysippus, moreover, a definition, like ‘man is a rational mortal animal,’ should not be construed as being about a generic object (even in an ‘as if’ sort of way). Rather it has the same meaning as the universal generalization, ‘if something is a man, then that thing is a rational mortal animal’ (Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. XI 8-11). But such a proposition commits us to nothing more than the relevant individuals it applies to (if indeed there are any) and to the significations expressed by its predicates. And significations, unlike generic objects, are not indeterminate. Unlike the generic man, it is simply false to claim that what is expressed by the predicate ‘is a man’ is itself a man. They need not, therefore, pose a threat to the Principle of Bivalence.

So while Chrysippus is committed, like his predecessors, to nonexistent objects, they are not at all like generic objects: they are the contents, rather than the objects, of mental states; they do not in general possess the qualities they express, even in an ‘as if’ sort of way; and while they do not have any being, they nevertheless subsist, like the other incorporeals the Stoics recognize (place, void, and time).


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Aristotle: psychology | Gorgias | intentionality | intentionality: medieval theories of | mental representation | Parmenides | Plato: naming and knowledge | propositions | Protagoras | Stoicism

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Victor Caston
University of California/Davis

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