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Personal Identity

Personal identity deals with questions about ourselves qua people (or persons). The most common question is what it takes for us to persist from one time to another. What is necessary, and what is sufficient, for some past or future being to be you? But there are other questions of equal interest and importance. Many are familiar thoughts that occur to everyone at some time: What am I? When did I begin? What will happen to me when I die? Philosophical discussions of personal identity go right back to the origin of the discipline, and most major figures have had something to say about it.

I will first survey the main philosophical questions that go under the heading of personal identity. Most of the entry will then focus on the question of personal identity over time: what it means and the main proposed answers. I will try to show how these answers relate to some of the other questions about personal identity, and to more general questions in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind.

1. The Problems of Personal Identity

There is no one problem of personal identity, but a range of loosely related problems. Discussions that go by the name of personal identity are most often about questions like these:

Who am I? We often speak of one's "personal identity" as what makes one the person one is. Your identity in this sense consists roughly of those attributes that make you unique as an individual and different from others. Or it is the way you see or define yourself. Your individual psychological identity is a property that you might have for a while and then lose. You could acquire a new identity, or perhaps carry on without one.

Persistence. What does it take for a person to persist--for the same person to exist at different times? What sorts of adventures could you possibly survive? What sort of thing would necessarily bring your existence to an end? What determines which future being, or which past one, is you? You point to a girl in an old photograph and say that she is you. What makes you that one--rather than, say, one of the others? What is it about the way she relates to you as you are now that makes her you? For that matter, what makes it the case that you existed at all back then? An answer to this question is an account of our persistence conditions, or a criterion of personal identity over time (a constitutive rather than an evidential criterion: see the Evidence Question below).

Historically this question often arises out of the hope that we might continue to exist after we die. Whether this is in any sense possible depends on whether biological death is the sort of thing that one could survive. Imagine that after your death there really will be someone, in the next world or in this one, who is a bit like you. How would that being have to relate to you as you are now in order to be you--rather than me, say, or a new person who didn't exist before? What would the Higher Powers have to do in order to resurrect you? Or is there anything they could do?

Evidence. How do we find out who is who? What evidence bears on the question whether the person here now is the one who was here yesterday? What ought we to do when different kinds of evidence support opposing verdicts? One source of evidence is memory: if you can remember doing something, or at least seem to remember it, it was probably you who did it. Another source is physical continuity: if the person who did it looks just like you, or even better if she is in some sense physically or spatio-temporally continuous with you, that is reason to think she is you. Which is more fundamental? Does memory supply evidence all by itself, for instance, or does it count as evidence only insofar as it can be checked against third-person, "bodily" evidence?

This question dominated the philosophical literature on personal identity from the 1950s to the 1970s (Penelhum 1970 is a good example). Though it is sometimes confused with the Persistence Question, the two are not the same. What it takes for you to persist through time is one thing; how we find out whether you have is another. If the criminal had fingerprints just like yours, the courts may conclude that he is you. But even if it is conclusive evidence, having your fingerprints is not what it is for some past or future being to be you.

Population. If we think of the Persistence Question as having to do with which of the characters introduced at the beginning of a story have survived to become the characters at the end of it, we can also ask how many characters are on the stage at any one time. What determines how many of us there are now, or where one person leaves off and someone or something else begins?

You may think that the number of people is simply the number of human animals--members of the primate species Homo sapiens (perhaps discounting those in a defective state that don't count as people). But this is disputed. Surgeons sometimes cut the nerve bands connecting one's cerebral hemispheres (commissurotomy), resulting in such peculiar behavior as simultaneously pulling one's trousers up with one hand and down with the other. Does this give us two people--two thinking, conscious beings? (See e.g. Nagel 1971. Puccetti 1973 argues that there are two people within the skin of every normal human being.) Could a human being with split personality literally be the home of two, or three, or seven different thinking beings? (Wilkes 1988: 127f.)

This is sometimes called the problem of "synchronic identity", as opposed to the "diachronic identity" of the Persistence Question (and the "counterfactual identity" of the How could I have been? Question below). But we shouldn't take this to imply that identity comes in two kinds, synchronic and diachronic. There are, rather, two kinds of situations where questions about the identity and diversity of people and other concrete things arise: synchronic situations involving just one time and diachronic ones involving several times.

Personhood. What is it to be a person? What is necessary, and what is sufficient, for something to count as a person, as opposed to a non-person? At what point in your development from a fertilized egg did there come to be a person? What would it take for a chimpanzee or a Martian or an electronic computer to be a person, if they could ever be?

What am I? What sort of things, metaphysically speaking, are you and I and other human people? What metaphysical category, if you like, do we fall under? For instance, are we material or immaterial? Are we substances, attributes, events, or something different still? Are we made of matter, or of thoughts and experiences, or of nothing at all?

Here are some possible answers to this question. We might be human animals. Surprisingly, most philosophers reject this answer. We will return to it in Sections 6 and 7. We might be partless, immaterial souls (or, alternatively, compound things made up of an immaterial soul and a material body: see Swinburne 1984). Hume said that each of us appears to be "a bundle or collection of different perceptions, which succeed each other with an inconceivable rapidity, and are in a perpetual flux and movement" (1888: 252; see also Quinton 1962 and Rovane 1998: 212). A modern descendant of this view says that you are a sort of computer program, a wholly abstract thing that could in principle be stored on magnetic tape (a common idea in science fiction). A popular view nowadays is that we are material objects "constituted by" human animals: you are made of the same matter as a certain animal, but you and the animal are different things because what it takes for you to persist is different (Wiggins 1967: 48, Shoemaker 1984: 112-114, Baker 2000). Another is the idea that we are temporal parts of animals (or in science fiction of more than one animal). There is even the paradoxical view that we don't really exist at all. The existence of human people is a metaphysical illusion. Many philosophers have denied their own existence (e.g. Russell 1985: 50 and Unger 1979).

How could I have been? How different could I have been from the way I actually am? Which of my properties do I have essentially, and which only accidentally or contingently? Could I have had different parents? Frank Sinatra and Doris Day might have had children together. Could I have been one of them? Or could their children only have been people other than me? Could I have died in the womb before I acquired any mental features? Are there possible worlds just like the actual one except for who is who--where people have "changed places" so that what is in fact your career is my career and vice versa? Whether these are best described as questions about personal identity is debatable. (They are not about whether beings in other worlds are identical with people in the actual world: see van Inwagen 1985.) But they are often discussed in connection with the others.

What matters? What is the practical importance of facts about our identity and persistence? Imagine that surgeons are going to put your brain into my head, and that neither of us has any choice about this. Will the resulting person (who will think he is you) be responsible for my actions, or for yours? Or both? Or neither? To whose property will he be entitled? Suppose he will be in terrible pain after the operation unless one of us pays a large sum in advance. If we were both entirely selfish, which of us has a reason to pay?

The answer to these questions may seem to turn entirely on whether the resulting person will be you or I. Only you can be responsible for your actions. The only one whose future welfare you can't ignore is yourself. You have a special, selfish interest in your own future, and no one else's. But many philosophers deny this. They say that someone else could be responsible for your actions. You could have an entirely selfish reason to care about someone else's well-being for his own sake. I care, or ought rationally to care, about what happens to Olson tomorrow not because he is me, but because he is then psychologically continuous with me as I am now (see Section 4), or because he relates to me in some other way that doesn't imply numerical identity. If someone else tomorrow were psychologically continuous with me as I am now, I ought to transfer my selfish concern to him. (See Shoemaker 1970: 284; Parfit 1971, 1984: 215; Martin 1998.)

That completes our survey. Though these questions are related, they are different, and it is important not to run them together. What they have in common that makes them all questions about personal identity is difficult to say.

2. Understanding the Persistence Question

Identity over time is a tricky concept, and the Persistence Question is often stated in a misleading or tendentious way.

The question is what is necessary and sufficient for a past or future being to be you. This is about numerical identity. To say that this and that are numerically identical is to say that they are one and the same: one thing rather than two. This is different from qualitative identity. Things are qualitatively identical when they are exactly similar. Identical twins may be qualitatively identical--there may be no telling them apart--but they are not numerically identical, for there are two of them. (That's what makes them twins.) A past or future person needn't be exactly like you are now in order to be you--that is, to be numerically identical with you. You don't remain qualitatively the same throughout your life: you change in size, appearance, and in many other ways. Nor does someone's being exactly like you are now guarantee that she is you.

If we point to you now, and then point to or describe someone or something that exists at another time--a certain aged man, say--we can ask whether we are pointing to one thing twice, or pointing once to each of two things. This is a question about the identity of a person over time. (Analogous questions arise about the identity over time of dogs and other objects.) The Persistence Question asks what makes statements about our identity over time true or false.

People sometimes ask what it takes for one to remain the same person from one time to another. The idea is that if I were to alter in certain ways--if I lost most of my memory or my personality changed dramatically or I underwent a radical religious conversion, say--I should no longer be the person I was before. If this were a question about numerical identity, it would answer itself. As long as I continue to exist at all, I necessarily remain numerically the same. Nothing could make me a numerically different person from the one I am now. Nothing can start out as one thing and end up as another, numerically different thing. This has nothing to do with personal identity in particular. It is simply a fact about the logic of identity.

Someone who says that after a certain adventure he would be a different person, or that he is no longer the person he once was, presumably means that that future or past person is numerically identical with him but qualitatively different in some important way. Otherwise it wouldn't be he but someone else who was that way then. People who say these things are usually talking about one's individual identity in the Who am I? sense. This is quite separate from the Persistence Question.

It is unfortunate that the words ‘identity’ and ‘same’ are used to mean so many different things: numerical identity, qualitative identity, individual psychological identity, and more. To make matters worse, some philosophers speak of "surviving" in a way that doesn't imply numerical identity, so that I could "survive" a certain adventure even though I won't exist afterwards. Confusion is inevitable.

Here is a more insidious misunderstanding. The Persistence Question is usually stated like this:

  1. Under what possible circumstances is a person existing at one time identical with (or the same person as) a person existing at another time?
We have a person existing at one time, and a person existing at another time, and the question is what is necessary and sufficient for them to be one person rather than two.

This is the wrong question to ask. We may want to know whether you were ever an embryo or a foetus, or whether you could survive the complete destruction of your mental features as a human vegetable. These are clearly questions about what it takes for us to persist, and any account of our identity through time ought to answer them. Their answers may have important ethical implications.

However, many philosophers define ‘person’ as something that has certain mental features. Locke, for instance, famously said that a person is "a thinking intelligent being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing, in different times and places" (1975: 335). Neurologists say that early-term foetuses and human beings in a persistent vegetative state have no mental features at all. If anything like Locke's definition is right, such beings are not people. And in that case we can't ask whether you were once an embryo or could come to be a vegetable by asking what it takes for a past or future person to be you.

We can see the problem more clearly by considering a particular answer to question 1:

Necessarily, a person who exists at one time is identical with a person who exists at another time if and only if the former person can, at the former time, remember an experience the latter person had at the latter time, or vice versa.
That is, a past or future person is you just in the case that you can now remember an experience she had then, or she can then remember an experience you are having now. This view is also sometimes attributed to Locke, though it is doubtful whether whether he actually held it. Call it the Memory Criterion.

The Memory Criterion may seem to imply that if you were to lapse into a persistent vegetative state, the resulting vegetable would not be you, since it would be unable to remember anything. You would have either ceased to exist or passed on to the next world. But in fact it implies no such thing. That is because we don't have here a person existing at one time and a person existing at another time (assuming that a human vegetable isn't a person). The Memory Criterion tells us which past or future person you are, but not which past or future thing. It tells us what it takes for one to persist as a person, but not what it takes for one to persist without qualification. So it implies nothing at all about this case. For the same reason it says nothing about whether you were ever an embryo. (Olson 1997a: 22-26, Mackie 1999: 224-228).

So question 1 is too narrow. Instead we ought to ask

  1. Under what possible circumstances is a person who exists at one time identical with something that exists at another time (whether or not it is a person then)?
Why, then, do philosophers ask 1 rather than 2? Because they assume that every person is a person essentially: nothing that is in fact a person could possibly exist without being a person. (By contrast, something that is in fact a student could exist without being a student: no student is essentially a student.) If that is true, then whatever is a person at one time must be a person at every other time when she exists. This assumption makes questions 1 and 2 equivalent. Whether it is true, though, is a serious issue (an instance of the How could I have been? Question). If you are a person essentially, you couldn't possibly have been an embryo, or come to be a vegetable (supposing, again, that such things aren't people). In that case, the embryo that gave rise to you is not numerically identical with you. You came into existence only when it developed certain mental capacities. This also rules out our being animals, for no animal is essentially a person: every human animal started out as an unthinking embryo, and may end up as an unthinking vegetable.

Whether we are animals or were once embryos are substantive questions that an account of personal identity ought to answer, and not matters we can settle in advance by the way we frame the issues. So we cannot assume at the outset that we are people essentially. Asking question 1 prejudges the issue by favoring some accounts of what we are and what it takes for us to persist over others. In particular, asking 1 effectively rules out the Somatic Approach described in the next section. It is like asking which man committed the crime before ruling out the possibility that it might have been a woman.

3. Accounts of Our Identity Through Time

Virtually all proposed answers to the Persistence Question fall into one of three categories. The Psychological Approach says that some psychological relation is either necessary or sufficient (or both) for one to persist. You are that future being that in some sense inherits its mental features--personality, beliefs, memories, and so on--from you. You are that past being whose mental features you have inherited. There is dispute over just what sort of "inheritance" this has to be--whether it must be underpinned by some sort of physical continuity, for instance, or whether a "non-branching" requirement is needed. (I will return to these issues.) But most philosophers writing on personal identity since the early 20th century have endorsed some sort of psychological approach. The memory criterion mentioned in the previous section is an example. Advocates of the Psychological Approach include Johnston (1987), Garrett (1998), Lewis (1976), Nagel (1986, 40), Noonan (1989), Nozick (1981), Parfit (1971; 1984, 207), Perry (1972), Shoemaker (1970; 1984, 90; 1987; 1999), and Unger (1990, ch. 5; 2000). Opponents include Ayers (1990: 278-292), Carter (1989), Feldman (1992), Mackie (1999), Olson (1997a), van Inwagen (1997), and Williams (1956-7, 1970).

A second idea is that our identity through time consists in some brute physical relation. You are that past or future being that has your body, or that is the same animal as you are, or the like. Whether you survive or perish has nothing to do with psychological facts. I will call this the Somatic Approach. It is comparatively unpopular. (It should not be confused with the view that physical evidence has some sort of priority over psychological evidence in finding out who is who. That has to do with the Evidence Question and not the Persistence Question: see Section 1.)

You may think that the truth lies somewhere between the two: we need both mental and physical continuity to survive; or perhaps either would suffice without the other. Views of this sort are usually versions of the Psychological Approach. Here is a test case. Imagine that your cerebrum--the upper brain thought to be chiefly responsible for your mental features--is transplanted into my head. Two beings result: the person who ends up with your cerebrum and your mental features, and the empty-headed being left behind, which may still be alive but will have no mental features. If you would be the one who gets your cerebrum, that is presumably because some relation involving psychology suffices for you to persist, as the Psychological Approach says. If you would be the empty-headed vegetable, your identity consists in something non-psychological, as the Somatic Approach has it.

Both the Psychological and Somatic Approaches agree that there is something that it takes for us to persist--that our identity through time consists in or necessarily follows from something other than itself. A third view denies this. Mental and physical continuity are evidence for identity, but do not always guarantee it, and are not required. No sort of continuity is absolutely necessary or absolutely sufficient for you to survive (at any rate none is both necessary and sufficient). The only correct answer to the Persistence Question is that a person here now is identical with a past or future being if and only they are identical. There are no informative, non-trivial persistence conditions for people. This is sometimes called the Simple View (Chisholm 1976: 108ff., Swinburne 1984, Lowe 1996: 41ff., Merricks 1998). It is often combined with the view that we are immaterial or have no parts, though it needn't be. The Simple View is poorly understood, and deserves more attention than it has received. (For an interesting discussion see Zimmerman 1998.)

It seems that the Persistence Question must have an answer. One of these views, or another that I haven't mentioned, must be true. If there is such a thing as you--if there is anything sitting there and reading this now--then some conditions must be necessary and sufficient for it to persist. Those conditions will involve psychology, or some sort of brute physical continuity, or something else. Or there are no such conditions, as the Simple View has it. In Section 8, however, we will consider the suggestion that our identity conditions are indeterminate in the sense that it is indeterminate which beings we are.

4. The Psychological Approach

Most people (most Western philosophy teachers and students, at any rate) feel immediately drawn to the Psychological Approach. It seems obvious that you would go along with your brain if it were transplanted into a different head, and that this is so because that organ would carry with it your memories and other mental features. Our identity over time must have something to do with psychology. It is notoriously difficult, however, to get from this conviction to a plausible answer to the Persistence Question.

What psychological relation might our identity through time consist in? We have already mentioned memory: a past or future being is you if and only if you can now remember an experience she had then, or vice versa. This faces two well-known problems, discovered in the 18th century by Seargeant and Berkeley (see Behan 1979) but more famously discussed by Reid and Butler (see the excerpts in Perry 1975).

First, suppose a young student is fined for overdue library books. As a middle-aged lawyer, she remembers paying the fine. Still later, in her dotage, she remembers her law career, but has entirely forgotten paying the fine, and everything else she did in her youth. According to the Memory Criterion, the young student is the middle-aged lawyer, the lawyer is the old woman, but the old woman is not the young student: an impossible result. If x and y are one and y and z are one, x and z can't be two. Identity is transitive; memory continuity is not.

Second, it seems to belong to the very idea of remembering that you can remember only your own experiences. To remember paying a fine (or the experience of paying) is to remember yourself paying. That makes it trivial and uninformative to say that you are the person whose experiences you can remember (though it doesn't affect the claim that memory connections are necessary for identity). You can't know whether someone genuinely remembers a past experience without already knowing whether he is the one who had it. We should have to know who was who before applying the theory that is supposed to tell us who is who.

One response to the first problem is to switch from direct to indirect memory connections: the old woman is the young student because she can recall experiences the lawyer had at a time when the lawyer remembered the student's life. The second problem is traditionally met by inventing a new concept, "retrocognition" or "quasi-memory", which is just like memory but without the identity requirement (Penelhum 1970: 85ff., Shoemaker 1970; for criticism see McDowell 1997). But neither solution gets us far, for the Memory Criterion faces a more obvious problem: there are many times in my past that I can't remember or "quasi-remember" at all, even indirectly. I cannot now recall anything that happened to me while I was asleep last night. The Memory Criterion has the absurd implication that I did not exist then: I am not the man who slept in my bed last night.

A better way forward appeals to the notion of causal dependence (Shoemaker 1984, 89ff.). A being at a later time is psychologically connected with someone who exists at an earlier time if the later being has the psychological features she has at the later time in large part because the earlier being had the psychological features she had at the earlier time. A current memory of a past experience is one sort of psychological connection, but there are others. I inherited most of my current beliefs and personality traits from the man who slept in my bed last night. You are psychologically continuous with some past or future being if your current mental features relate to those she has then by a chain of psychological connections. Then we can say that a person who exists at one time is identical with something existing at another time if and only if the former is, at the former time, psychologically continuous with the latter as she is at the latter time.

This still leaves important questions unanswered. Suppose we could electronically copy the mental contents of your brain onto mine, thereby erasing the previous contents of both brains. The resulting being would be mentally like you were before. Whether this would be a case of psychological continuity depends on what sort of causal dependence counts. The resulting person would have inherited your mental properties in a way, but not in the usual way. Is it the right way? Could you literally move from one human animal to another via "brain-state transfer"? Advocates of the Psychological Approach disagree (Unger 1990: 67-71, Shoemaker 1997).

5. Fission

Whatever psychological continuity comes down to in the end, a more serious worry for the Psychological Approach is that you could be psychologically or mentally continuous with two past or future people. If your cerebrum were transplanted, the resulting being would be mentally continuous with you by anyone's lights. The Psychological Approach implies that he would be you. Now the cerebrum has two hemispheres, and if one of them is destroyed the resulting being is also mentally continuous with the original person. (Hemispherectomy--even the removal of the left hemisphere, which controls speech--is considered a drastic but acceptable treatment for otherwise-inoperable brain tumors: see Rigterink 1980.) So the Psychological Approach implies that if we destroyed one of your cerebral hemispheres and transplanted the other, you would be the one who got the transplanted hemisphere.

But now let the surgeons transplant both hemispheres, each into a different empty head. (We needn't pretend, as some authors do, that the hemispheres are exactly alike.) Call the resulting people Lefty and Righty. Both will be mentally continuous with you. If any future being who is mentally continuous with you is you, it follows that you are Lefty and you are Righty. That implies that Lefty is Righty, for two things can't be numerically identical with one thing. But Lefty and Righty are clearly two. So you can't be identical with both. We can make the same point in another way. Suppose Lefty is hungry at a time when Righty isn't. If you are Lefty, you are hungry. If you are Righty, you aren't. If you are Lefty and you are Righty, you are both hungry and not hungry at once: a contradiction.

The Psychological Approach appears to have the impossible consequence that one thing could be identical with two things. Short of giving up that approach altogether, there would seem to be just two ways out. One is to say that, despite appearances, "you" were really two people all along. There are two different but exactly similar people in the same place and made of the same matter at once, doing the same things and thinking the same thoughts. The surgeons merely separate them (Lewis 1976, Noonan 1989: 122-148; Perry 1972 offers a more complicated variant). The "multiple-occupancy view", as this is whimsically called, is implausible for a number of reasons, not least because it means that we can't know how many people there are at a given time until we know what happens later. (It is usually combined with "four-dimensionalism", the controversial metaphysical thesis that all persisting objects are extended in time and made up of temporal parts: see Section 8.)

The other solution is to take back the claim that mental continuity by itself is sufficient for one to persist. You are identical with a past or future being who is mentally continuous with you as you are now only if no one else is then mentally continuous with you. Neither Lefty nor Righty is you. If both your cerebral hemispheres are transplanted, that is the end of you--though you would survive if only one were transplanted and the other destroyed. This is the "non-branching view" (Wiggins 1967: 55, Shoemaker 1984: 85, Unger 1990: 265, Garrett 1998: ch. 4; for criticism see Noonan 1989: 14-18 and 149-168). It too is hard to believe. If you could survive with half your brain, how could preserving the other half mean that you don't survive? For that matter, the non-branching view implies you would perish if one of your hemispheres were transplanted and the other left in place. And if "brain-state transfer" gives us mental continuity, you would cease to exist if your total brain state were copied onto another brain without erasing yours. ("Best-candidate" theories attempt to avoid this: see e.g. Nozick 1981.)

Here is another thought. Faced with the prospect of having one of your hemispheres transplanted, there would seem to be no reason to prefer that the other be destroyed. On the contrary: wouldn't you rather have both preserved, even if they go into different heads? Yet on the non-branching view that is to prefer death over continued existence. This is what leads Parfit and others to say that you don't really want to continue existing. Insofar as you are rational, anyway, you only want there to be someone mentally continuous with you in the future, whether or not he is strictly you. More generally, facts about who is identical with whom have no practical importance. What matters practically is who is mentally continuous with whom. (Lewis 1976 and Parfit 1976 debate whether the multiple-occupancy view can preserve the conviction that identity is what matters practically.)

This threatens to undermine the entire Psychological Approach. Suppose you would care about the welfare of your two fission offshoots in just the way that you ordinarily care about your own welfare, even though neither of them would be you. Then you would care about what happened to the person who got your whole brain in the original transplant case, even if he weren't you. In that case it is doubtful whether our convictions about the brain-transplant story provide any support for the Psychological Approach.

It is sometimes said that fission is not a special problem for the Psychological Approach, but afflicts all answers to the Persistence Question equally, apart (perhaps) from the Simple View. Whether this is so is an interesting question. (It is probably possible to make two human animals out of one. But is it in any sense possible to do this in such a way that we should be happy to identify either offshoot with the original, were it not for the existence of the other?) Even if the fission problem does apply to everyone, though, it looks especially worrying for the Psychological Approach. It threatens the support for that view without affecting the arguments for rival views.

6. The Problem of the Thinking Animal

The Psychological Approach faces another problem (Carter 1989, Ayers 1990: 278-292, Snowdon 1990, Olson 1997a: 80f., 100-109, 2002a). It arises because that view implies that we are not human animals. No sort of mental continuity is either necessary or sufficient for a human animal to persist.

Every human animal starts out as an embryo, and may end up in a persistent vegetative state. Neither an embryo nor a human vegetable has any mental features at all, and so neither is mentally continuous with anything. This shows that a human animal can persist without any sort of mental continuity: mental continuity is not necessary for animal identity. If you need mental continuity to persist, you cannot be an animal.

The brain-transplant story shows that no sort of psychological continuity is sufficent for animal identity. If your cerebrum is transplanted into another head, the one who gets that organ, and no one else, will be mentally continuous with you as you were before the operation. Do the surgeons thereby move a human animal from one head to another? It seems not. They simply move an organ from one animal to another, as they might move a kidney or a liver. The empty-headed thing left behind is still an animal. A detached cerebrum, by contrast, is no more an animal than a detached liver is an animal. We can have continuously physically realized, non-branching psychological continuity between one human animal and another. Mental continuity does not suffice for animal identity. If it suffices for your identity--if you would go along with your transplanted cerebrum and leave your animal behind--then you are not an animal. Not only are you not essentially an animal. Nothing that is even contingently an animal could go along with its transplanted cerebrum.

The problem, then, is that there is a human animal located where you are. That animal would seem to have the same thoughts and other mental features as you have. (It shares your brain.) But the Psychological Approach implies that you are not that animal. So there is a conscious, intelligent being other than you sitting in your chair and thinking your thoughts. How could you ever know which one you are? You may think you are the non-animal--the one with psychological persistence conditions. But the animal has the same reasons for thinking that it has psychological persistence conditions as you have for thinking that you do. Yet it is mistaken. How do you know that you're not the one making the mistake? The Psychological Approach appears to imply that there are twice as many thinking beings as the census-takers report; and we can never know which ones we are.

Three solutions have been proposed. Some say that human animals have psychological persistence conditions (Wiggins 1980: 160, 180; McDowell 1997: 237; for criticism see Olson 1997a: 114-119). The Psychological Approach is compatible with our being animals, and so the problem doesn't arise. The surgeons do not move your cerebrum from one animal to another in the transplant story. Rather, one animal has its parts cut away until it is the size of a cerebrum. It stops being an animal, and is moved across the room and given a new complement of parts, at which point it comes to be an animal once more.

A second solution is to deny that human animals can think in the way that we do. Thinking animals are not a problem for the Psychological Approach because there are none. Why can't human animals think? You would expect the explanation, or part of it, to be that no material object of any sort could think. If any material thing could think, wouldn't it be an animal? But some argue that material non-animals can think even though animals cannot. Shoemaker says that organisms can't think because they have the wrong persistence conditions. The nature of mental properties entails that mental continuity must suffice for the bearers of those properties to persist, and this is not so for organisms. Material things with the right persistence conditions, however, can think. (See Shoemaker 1984: 92-97, 1999. For a related view see Baker 2000: 101-105.) Others say that animals can't think because they're too big. Animals are merely containers for thinking brains. The view that we are brains appears to be no more consistent with the Psychological Approach than the view that we are animals, however (though see Hudson 2001: 143f.).

Noonan (1998) proposes a third solution. He concedes that human animals think as we do, and invokes an unorthodox view of personhood and of first-person reference to explain how we can know that we are not those animals. First, not just any rational, self-conscious being is a person, but only one with psychological persistence conditions. So human animals don't count as people. Second, personal pronouns like ‘I’ always refer to people. So when the animal associated with you says ‘I’, it doesn't refer to itself. Rather, it refers to you, the person who shares in that utterance. When it says, "I am a person," it doesn't express the false belief that it is a person, but the true belief that you are. The animal is not mistaken about which thing it is, and neither are you. You can infer that you are a person from the linguistic facts that you are whatever you refer to when you say ‘I’, and that ‘I’ always refers to a person. (For criticism see Olson 2002b.)

7. The Somatic Approach

There appears to be a thinking animal located where you are. It also appears that you are the thinking thing--the only one--located there. If things are as they appear, then that animal is what you are. The view that we are animals is sometimes called Animalism.

Animalism does not imply that all animals, or even all human animals, are people. We may not want to call human embryos or animals in a persistent vegetative state ‘people’. Being a person may be only a temporary property of you, like being a philosopher. Nor does animalism imply that all people are animals. It is consistent with the existence of wholly inorganic people: angels or rational robots. It does not say that being an animal is part of what it is to be a person (a view defended in Wiggins 1980, 171 and Wollheim 1984, ch. 1 and criticized in Snowdon 1996).

If we are animals, we have the persistence conditions of animals. And as we saw, animals appear to persist by virtue of some sort of brute physical continuity. So Animalism seems to be a version of the Somatic Approach.

A few philosophers endorse the Somatic Approach without saying that we are animals. They say that we are our bodies (Thomson 1997), or that our identity through time consists in the identity of our bodies (Ayer 1936: 194). This has been called the Bodily Criterion of personal identity. Its relation to Animalism is uncertain. If a person's body is by definition a sort of animal, then perhaps being identical to one's body is the same as being an animal. Whether this is so depends in part on what it is for something to be someone's body--a surprisingly difficult question (see van Inwagen 1980, Olson 1997a: 144-149).

The Somatic Approach is unpopular. We have already met the main objection to it: when we reflect on the cerebrum-transplant story, it seems obvious that you would go along with your transplanted cerebrum, even though the animal would stay behind. The claim that you would stay behind, and that someone who thinks she is you and has full memories of your life and even has your brain might not be you, is simply incredible (see Unger 2000). This is often taken to be completely decisive. On the other hand, it is also hard to deny that there is a rational human animal with non-psychological identity conditions sitting in your chair.

The Somatic Approach has the advantage of being compatible with our beliefs about who is who in all actual cases. In every actual case, the number of people we think there are is equal to the number of human animals. Every actual case in which we take someone to survive or perish is a case where a human animal survives or perishes. This is not so for the Psychological Approach, or at any rate for the view that psychological continuity is necessary for us to persist. When someone lapses into a persistent vegetative state, his friends and relatives rarely conclude that their loved one no longer exists, even when they believe that there is no mental continuity of any sort between the human vegetable and the person. (They may conclude that his life no longer has any value; but that is another matter.) And most of us believe that we were once foetuses. When we see an ultrasound picture of a 12-week-old foetus, we ordinarily think we are seeing something that, if all goes well, will be born, learn to speak, go to school, and eventually become an adult human person. Yet none of us is in any way psychologically continuous with a 12-week-old foetus. And one might set more store by our opinions about cases we have actually confronted than by our opinions about science-fiction stories.

Friends of the Somatic Approach can also try to account for the attraction of the transplant argument in a way that is consistent with their view. Whenever someone has memories, personality, and other mental traits just like yours, that is strong evidence for his being you. All the more so if he inherited those traits from you. Brute physical continuity is also far less important to the narrative structure of most stories than mental continuity. When we hear a story, we don't much care about which person at the end of the story is the same animal as a certain person at the beginning. We care about who is psychologically continuous with that person. These facts might lead us to think that the one who got your transplanted cerebrum would be you even if, because you are an animal, this is not the case.

This last thought suggests that the Somatic Approach too might imply that identity has no practical importance. The one who got your transplanted cerebrum might have all that matters in identity. You might have a reason, before the transplant, to care selfishly about what will happen to him or her afterwards. He might be responsible for your actions, entitled to your bank account, and so on. Yet on the Somatic Approach he would not be you.

8. Wider Issues

We have compared the virtues of the two main accounts of our identity over time. We saw that the Psychological Approach, despite its strong initial attraction, faces problems with fission. The usual "non-branching" solution is both implausible in itself and suggests that identity has no practical importance, which in turn undermines the original support for the Psychological Approach. And it implies that we are not animals, raising the awkward problem of how we relate to the apparently intelligent animals we call our bodies. The Somatic Approach--in particular the view that we are animals--is also intuitively attractive, and solves the problem of the thinking animal. But it has implausible consequences about our identity over time, and again threatens to make identity unimportant. Is there any way to move the discussion forward?

I believe that the debate will turn in the end on more general issues in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind. For instance, most advocates of the Psychological Approach will hope to solve the problem of the thinking animal by denying that human animals can think. They will need a general metaphysical picture that allows for this. They must say what sort of things we are, if we are not animals--what we are made of, and how we relate to the animals we call our bodies. And they need an account of the nature of mental properties that enables them to explain why human animals cannot think in the way that we can. Or if they accept that human animals can think, they will need an account of how we are able to know that we are the things with psychological persistence conditions, and not the thinking animals.

Friends of the Somatic Approach also face hard questions. They will want to say that the only being thinking your thoughts is an animal (or perhaps a brain). If each human animal shares its thoughts with another being--one with psychological persistence conditions, for instance--it will be hard to insist that we are the animals. That implies that there are fewer material objects than many metaphysicians believe. It sits uneasily with a metaphysic of constitution--the view that the same matter can compose two or more different objects at once--and with the usual ontology of temporal parts (see below). The Somatic Approach appears to require a "sparse" ontology of material objects. (Whether it must be as sparse as that of van Inwagen 1990 or Merricks 2001 is an interesting question.)

Some general metaphysical views suggest that there is no unique right answer to the question of what it takes for us to persist. One example is the view that there is no such thing as absolute numerical identity, but only identity relative to a kind (Geach 1967; see also Olson 1997b: 153-156). If your cerebrum is transplanted, the recipient of that organ might be the same person as you, but not the same animal. The empty-headed being left behind would be the same animal as you, but not the same person. Which of them would just plain be you, without qualification, is a meaningless question. Qua people, perhaps, we persist by virtue of some sort of psychological continuity; qua animals, we persist by virtue of brute physical continuity. Or suppose your brain is erased and its contents are imprinted onto another brain (Shoemaker's "brain-state transfer" of Section 4). The resulting being might be the same person as you are in one sense of ‘person’, but not the same person in another sense of the term. The Persistence Question, on this view, is badly put. There are, rather, as many persistence questions as there are relative-identity relations that we could enter into.

Some accounts of the ontology of material objects imply that there are far more material objects than we would ordinarily think. They too suggest that questions of personal identity have no unique right answers. The ontology of temporal parts or "four-dimensionalism" is a good example (see Heller 1990, ch. 1). It says that a thing exists at different times by having different temporal parts located at those times, much as a thing exists in different places--here where my hands are and there where my feet are, say--by having different spatial parts located in those places. All persisting things have earlier and later parts in the way that tennis matches do. For every period of time when you exist, short or long, there is a temporal part of you that exists only then. And for any temporal parts of any objects whatever, there is a larger object made up of just those parts.

Which things are we, on this view? There are many likely candidates. Suppose we know what determines your spatial boundaries--that is, which thing counts as your current temporal part or "stage". That stage is a part of a vast number of temporally extended objects (Hudson 2001: ch. 4). For instance, it is a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological continuity, in the sense defined in Section 4, among its stages. That is, one of the beings thinking your current thoughts is a maximal aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically continuous with each of the others (where a person-stage is a more-or-less momentary temporal part of a person, and such an aggregate is maximal if it is not part of any larger such aggregate). The view that we persist by virtue of psychological continuity suggests that that is what you are.

Your current stage is also a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological connectedness (Section 4 again). One of the beings thinking your thoughts is a maximal aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically connected with each of the others. This may not be the same as the first being, for some stages may be psychologically continuous with your current stage but not psychologically connected with it. The view that psychological continuity is necessary and sufficient for us to persist suggests that we are beings of the second sort (Lewis 1976). Your current stage is also a part of an animal. And it is a part of many bizarre and gerrymandered objects, such as Hirsch's "contacti persons" (Hirsch 1982, ch. 10). Some even say that you are your current stage itself (Sider 1996).

Four-dimensionalism implies that you share your current thoughts with countless beings that diverge from one another in the past or future. This makes it hard to say which things we are, and hence what our identity over time consists in. How could we ever know? We could say that we are the beings we refer to when we say ‘I’, or more generally the beings that our personal pronouns and proper names refer to (van Inwagen 2002). That seems true enough; but it seems unlikely, given a capacious ontology such as four-dimensionalism, that our personal pronouns succeed in referring to just one sort of thing. It is more likely that each utterance of a personal pronoun refers ambiguously to many different candidates: to various sorts of psychologically interrelated aggregates, to an animal, and perhaps to others as well. That would make it indeterminate which things, even which kinds of things, we are. And since the different candidates have different persistence conditions, it would be indeterminate what our identity over time consists in. Some versions of the metaphysic of constitution will have similar implications.

It is doubtful whether these questions about the nature of identity, the ontology of material objects, the ability of organisms to think, and so on, can be settled by thinking about personal identity alone. They are more general than questions about personal identity, since they involve many things other than ourselves. Which view of personal identity one finds attractive is likely to depend on one's general metaphysical beliefs. So there may not be much point in asking about our identity over time without first addressing these underlying issues.


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identity | identity: relative | Locke, John | personal identity: and ethics | temporal parts


Some of the material in this entry also appears in my piece of the same name (‘Personal Identity’) in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind, edited by S. Stich and T. Warfield, Oxford: Blackwell, forthcoming.

Copyright © 2002
Eric T. Olson

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