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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Harriet Taylor Mill
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1. Eliza Flower.

2. For purposes of comparison, note that Alexander Bain convinced Helen Taylor, who prepared the manuscript of Mill's Autobiography for publication after his death, to strike some passages about her that were almost as laudatory. When the book was first published, the lines in question were replaced by strings of asterisks; they have been replaced in most contemporary editions (see Robson and Stillinger 1981, xxix n55). Bain also urged Helen to delete some parts of JSM's description of HTM, but she decided against this.

3. In The Subjection of Women JSM writes:

Hardly anything can be of greater value to a man of theory and speculation who employs himself not in collecting materials of knowledge by observation, but in working them up by processes of thought into comprehensive truths of science and laws of conduct, than to carry on his speculations in the companionship, and under the criticism, of a really superior woman. There is nothing comparable to it for keeping his thoughts within the limits of real things, and the actual facts of nature. A woman seldom runs wild after an abstraction. The habitual direction of her mind to dealing with things as individuals rather than in groups, and (what is closely connected with it) her more lively interest in the present feelings of persons, which makes her consider first of all, in anything which claims to be applied to practice, in what manner persons will be affected by it—these two things make her extremely unlikely to put faith in any speculation which loses sight of individuals, and deals with things as if they existed for the benefit of some imaginary entity, some mere creation of the mind, not resolvable into the feelings of living beings. Women's thoughts are thus as useful in giving reality to those of thinking men, as men's thoughts in giving width and largeness to those of women. In depth, as distinguished from breadth, I greatly doubt if even now, women, compared with men, are at any disadvantage (1984, 306).

It is not exactly clear what of this nature JSM thinks that HTM added to his social and political thought, however. John Robson writes of the passage from the Autobiography that:

Perhaps he means nothing more unusual than that one can quickly see whether one's actions fulfill one's intentions in the daily concerns of life. He may also be merely referring to his pronounced inability to manage such practical matters as ordering groceries and dealing with difficult neighbors, for here his reliance on her was unusual, and will become notorious…. (1966, 179).

4. JSM prepared a comprehensive bibliography of his publications, in which a number of works are described as “joint productions” with HTM—of some of these he even notes that “very little” in them was his, or that he “acted chiefly as amanuensis to my wife”). Many of these are newspaper articles, most of which concern domestic violence. The Principles of Political Economy is also described as a joint production. Interestingly, Mill's bibliography does not list On Liberty as a joint production.

Copyright © 2002
Dale E. Miller

Notes to Harriet Taylor Mill
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy