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There has never been a generally accepted definition of the “gene” in genetics. There exist several, different accounts of the historical development and diversification of the gene concept as well. Today, along with the completion of the human genome sequence and the beginning of what has been called the era of postgenomics, genetics is again experiencing a time of conceptual change, voices even being raised to abandon the concept of the gene altogether. Both philosophers and philosophically minded scientists have variously attempted to reduce the proliferation of gene concepts, either ‘vertically’ to a fundamental unit, or ‘horizontally’ by subsuming them under a general term. As a consequence, the gene has become a hot topic in philosophy of science around which questions of reduction, emergence, or supervenience of concepts and theories (along with the epistemic entities they refer to) are lively debated. So far, however, all attempts to reach a consensus regarding these questions have failed. The concept of the gene emerging out of a century of genetic research has been and continues to be, as Raphael Falk has reminded us, a “concept in tension” (Falk 2000).

Yet, despite this apparently irreducible diversity, “there can be little doubt that the idea of ‘the gene’ has been the central organizing theme of twentieth century biology,” as Lenny Moss recently put it (Moss 2003, xiii; see also Keller 2000). The layout of the following article will be largely historical. We will look at genes as epistemic objects, i.e., as objects subjected to past and current research. This means that we will not only relate established definitions of ‘the’ gene, but rather analyze the processes in the course of which they became and still are being determined by changing experimental practices and experimental systems. After having thus established a rich historical panorama of gene concepts, some more general philosophical themes will be addressed, for which the gene has served as a convenient handle in discussion, and which revolve around the topic of reduction.

1. Prehistory of the Gene

Before dealing with the historical stages of the gene concept's tangled development, we will have to see how it came into being. It is only in the nineteenth century that heredity became a major problem to be dealt with in biology (Gayon 2000). With the rise of heredity as a biological research area the question of its material basis and of its mechanism took shape. In the second half of the nineteenth century, two alternative frameworks were proposed to deal with this question. The first one conceived of heredity as a force whose strength was accumulated over generations, and which, as a measurable magnitude, could be subjected to statistical analysis. This concept was particularily widespread among nineteenth-century breeders (Gayon & Zallen 1998) and influenced Francis Galton and the so-called ‘biometrical school’ (Gayon 1998, 105-146). The second saw heredity as residing in matter that was transmitted over the generations. Two major trends are to be differentiated here. One of them regarded hereditary matter as particulate and amenable to breeding analysis. Charles Darwin called the presumed hereditary particles gemmules; Hugo de Vries, pangenes; Gregor Mendel, elements. None of these nineteenth century authors, however, thought of associating these particles with a particular hereditary substance. They all thought that they consisted of the stuff that the body of the organism is made of. They were seen as microscopic entities which, if accumulated en masse, would make the particular traits visible for which they stood. A second category of biologists in the second half of the nineteeenth century, to whom Carl Naegeli and August Weismann belonged, distinguished the body substance, the trophoplasm or soma, from a specific hereditary substance, the idioplasm, or germ plasm, which was assumed to be responsible for intergenerational hereditary continuity. However, they took this idioplasmic substance as being not particulate, but highly organized, something that extended, in the case of Naegeli at least, even from cell to cell and throughout the whole body, a capillary hereditary system analogous to the nervous system (Robinson 1979, Churchill 1987).

Mendel stands out among these biologists. He is generally considered as the precursor to twentieth-century genetics (see, however, Olby 1979 and Orel & Hartl 1997). As Jean Gayon has argued, his 1865 paper attacked heredity from a wholly new angle, interpreting it not as a measurable magnitude, as the biometrical school did at a later stage, but as a “structure in a given generation to be expressed in the context of specific crosses,” “a certain level of organization.” This is why Mendel applied a “calculus of differences,” i.e., combinatorial mathematics to the resolution of hereditary phenomena (Gayon 2000, 77-78). With that, he also introduced a new formal tool for the analysis of hybridization experiments that were based on a new experimental regime: the selection of discrete character pairs.

2. The Gene in Classical Genetics

The year 1900 is generally considered as the annus mirabilis that gave birth to a new discipline that soon came to be called genetics. During that year, three botanists, Hugo de Vries, Carl Correns, and Erich Tschermak, reported on their breeding experiments of the late 1890s and claimed to have confirmed the regularities in the transmission of characters from parents to offspring that Mendel had already presented in his seminal paper of 1865 (Olby 1985, 109-37). Basically, in their experimental crosses with Zea mays, Pisum, and Phaseolus, they observed that the elements responsible for pairs of alternative traits, ‘allelomorphs’ in the later terminology of William Bateson (1902), which soon came into general use under the abbreviation of ‘alleles,’ segregated randomly in the second filial generation (Mendel's law of segregation), and that these elements were transmitted independently from each other (Mendel's law of independent assortment). The additional observation that sometimes several elements behaved as if they were linked, contributed to the assumption soon promoted by Walter Sutton and by Theodor Boveri that these elements were located in groups on the different chromosomes of the nucleus. Thus the chromosome theory of inheritance assumed that the regularities of character transmission were grounded in the givens of cytomorphology, in particular the nuclear morphology with its individual chromosomes keeping their identity over the generations (Coleman 1965, Martins 1999).

Despite initial resistance from the biometrical school (Provine 1971, Mackenzie & Barnes 1979) awareness rapidly grew that the possibility of an independent assortment of discrete hereditary factors, based on the laws of probability, was to be seen as the very cornerstone of a new ‘paradigm’ of inheritance (Kim 1994). This went together, after an initial period of conflation by what Elof Carlson called the “unit-character fallacy” (Carlson 1966, ch. 4), with the establishment of a categorial distinction between genetic factors on the one hand and characters on the other hand. The masking effect of dominant traits over recessive ones and the subsequent reappearance of recessive traits were particularly instrumental in stabilizing this distinction (Falk 2001). Furthermore, it resonated with the earlier concept of the two substances, one germinal and one bodily, already promoted by Naegeli and Weismann. Yet if, as Correns for instance stated in his first review on the new Mendelian literature in 1901, “we cannot uphold the idea of a permanent fixation (dauernd feste Bindung) [of the hereditary factors] in the germ plasm, but have to assume, because of their miscibility, some mobility at least at certain times,” and if chromosomal coupling was a possible, but not a necessary and general mechanism of conveying structure to inheritance, how then explain the successive and regular physiological deployment of the dispositions (Anlagen) in the orderly development of the organism? To resolve this difficulty, Correns came up with the following, as he put it, “heresy”:

I propose to have the locus of the Anlagen, without permanent fixation, in the nucleus, especially in the chromosomes. In addition I assume, outside the nucleus, in the protoplasm, a mechanism that cares for their deployment. Then the Anlagen can be mixed up as they may, like the colored little stones in a kaleidoscope; and yet they unfold at the right place (quoted from Correns 1924, 279).

In this way Correns, at the beginning of the first decade of the twentieth century, distinguished a hereditary space with an independent logic and metrics from another, physiological and developmental space represented by the cytoplasm and standing for the organism. Toward the end of the first decade of the twentieth century, after Bateson had coined the term genetics for the emerging new field of transmission studies in 1906, Wilhelm Johannsen codified this distinction by introducing the notions of genotype and phenotype, respectively, for these two spaces (which he, in contrast to Correns, considered as abstract spaces, not confining them to certain cellular spaces). In addition, for the elements of the genotype, he proposed the notion of gene. This terminology was gradually taken up by the genetics community. Johannsen's codification, which was based on breeders' practices of separating ‘pure lines’ and Richard Woltereck's notion of an innate ‘norm of reaction’, has profoundly marked all of twentieth century genetics (Allen 2002). We can safely say that it instituted the gene as an epistemic object to be studied within its proper epistemic space, and with that an “exact, experimental doctrine of heredity” (Johannsen 1909, 1) which concentrated on transmission only and not on the function and development of the organism in its environment. Some historians have spoken of a ‘divorce’ of genetical from embryological concerns with regard to this separation (Allen 1986, Bowler 1989). Others hold that this separation was itself an expression of the embryological interests of early geneticists in their search for ‘developmental invariants’ (Gilbert 1978, Griesemer 2000). Be that as it may, the result was that the relations between the two spaces, once separated by abstraction, were now experimentally elucidated in their own right (Falk 1995). Michel Morange judged this “rupture to be logically absurd,” — from hindsight — “but historically and scientifically necessary” (Morange 1998, 22).

Johannsen himself stressed that the genotype had to be treated as independent of any life history and thus, at least within the bounds of time in which research operated, as an “ahistoric” entity amenable to scientific scrutiny like the objects of physics and chemistry (see Churchill 1974, Roll-Hansen 1978). “The personal qualities of any individual organism do not at all cause the qualities of its offspring; but the qualities of both ancestor and decendant are in quite the same manner determined by the nature of the sexual substances,” Johannsen claimed (Johannsen 1911, 130). Unlike most Mendelians, however, he remained convinced that the genotype would possess an overall architecture — as expressed in the notion of ‘type’. He therefore had reservations with respect to its particulate character, and especially warned that the notion of “genes for a particular character” should always be used cautiously if not altogether be omitted (Johannsen 1911, 147). As Moss put it: “What Johannsen called for in distinguishing between the genotype and the phenotype was a separation of the inheritance of Mendelian units from development, thereby constituting the study of genetics as an independent discipline. [Heredity] was not about the passing on of properties, which were always historically acquired and developmentally contingent, but rather about the presence of identical genes in ancestor and descendent” (Moss 2003, 29). Johannsen also remained consciously agnostic with respect to the material constitution of the genotype and its elements. He clearly recognized that the experimental regime of Mendelian genetics, although scientific in its character like physics or chemistry, did neither require nor allow any definite supposition about the material structure of the genetic elements. For him, the gene remained a concept “completely free of any hypothesis” (Johannsen 1909, 124).

On this account, genes were taken as abstract elements of an equally abstract space whose structure, however, could be explored through the visible and quantifiable outcome of breeding experiments based on mutations of model organisms. This became the research program of Thomas Hunt Morgan and his group. From the early 1910s right into the 1930s, the growing community of researchers around Morgan and their followers used mutants of the fruit fly Drosophila, constructed in ever more sophisticated ways, in order to produce a map of the fruit fly's genotype in which genes, and alleles thereof, figured as genetic markers occupying a particular locus on one of the four homologous chromosome pairs of the fly (Kohler 1994). The basic assumptions that allowed the program to operate were that genes were located in a linear order along the different chromosomes, and that the frequency of recombination events between homologous chromosomes, that is, the frequency of crossovers during reduction division, gave a measure of the distance between the genes, at the same time defining them as units of recombination (Morgan et al. 1915). In this practice, identifiable aspects of the phenotype, assumed as determined directly by genes in a consciously black-boxed manner, were used as indicators or ‘windows’ for an outlook on the formal structure of the genotype. This is what Moss has termed the “Gene-P” (P standing for phenotype). Throughout his career, Morgan remained aware of the formal character of his program. As late as 1933, on the occasion of his Nobel address, he declared: “At the level at which the genetic experiments lie it does not make the slightest difference whether the gene is a hypothetical unit, or whether the gene is a material particle” (Morgan 1935, 3). In particular, it did not matter if one-to-one, or more complicated relationships reigned between genes and traits. Morgan and his school were well aware that, as a rule, many genes were involved in the development of a particular trait as, e.g., eye-color, and that one gene could affect several characters. To accommodate this difficulty and in line with their experimental regime, they embraced a differential concept of the gene. What mattered to them, was the relationship between a change in a gene and a change in a trait, rather than the nature of these entities themselves. Thus the alteration of a trait could be causally related to a change in (or a loss of) a single genetic factor, even if it was plausible in general, that a trait like eye-color was, in fact, determined by a whole group of variously interacting genes (Roll-Hansen 1978, Schwartz 2000).

The fascination of this approach consisted in the fact that it worked, if properly conducted, like a precision instrument. Thus population geneticists like Ronald A. Fisher, J. B. S. Haldane, and Sewall Wright could make use, at the same time and with equal rigor, of that same abstract gene and its mutant alleles in developing elaborate mathematical models describing the effects of evolutionary factors like selection and mutation on the genetic composition of populations. As a consequence, evolution became re-defined as a change of gene frequencies in the gene pool of a population in what is commonly called the ‘evolutionary,’ ‘neo-Darwinian’ or simply ‘modern synthesis’ of the late 1930s (Dobzhansky 1937). Considered as a ‘developmental invariant’ (Griesemer 2000) in reproduction, solely obeying the Mendelian laws in its transmission from one generation to the next, the gene provided a kind of inertia principle against which the effects of both developmental (epistasis, inhibition, position effects etc.) and evolutionary factors (selection, mutation, recombination etc.) could be measured with utmost accuracy (Gayon 1995).

Nevertheless, it became the conviction of many geneticians in the 1920s, among them Morgan's student Herman J. Muller, that genes had to be material particles. Muller saw genes as fundamentally endowed with two properties: that of autocatalysis and that of heterocatalysis. Their autocatalytic function allowed them to reproduce as units of transmission and thus to connect the genotype of one generation to that of the next. Their concomitant capability of reproducing mutations faithfully once they had occurred, gave rise, on this account, to the possibility of evolution. Their heterocatalytic capabilities connected them to the phenotype, as units involved in the expression of a particular character. With his own experimental work, Muller added a significant argument for the materiality of the gene, pertaining to the third aspect of the gene as a unit of mutation. In 1927, he reported on the induction of Mendelian mutations in Drosophila by using X-rays. The conclusion was at hand that the X-rays must have altered some molecular structure, like spontaneous mutations, in a permanent fashion. But the experimental practice of X-raying, which eventually gave rise to a whole ‘industry’ of radiation genetics in the 1930s and 1940s, did by itself not open the path to the material characterization of genes as units of heredity. On the occasion of the fiftieth anniversary of the rediscovery of Mendel's work in 1950, Muller thus had to confess: “[T]he real core of gene theory still appears to lie in the deep unknown. That is, we have as yet no actual knowledge of the mechanism underlying that unique property which makes a gene a gene — its ability to cause the synthesis of another structure like itself, [in] which even the mutations of the original gene are copied. [We] do not know of such things yet in chemistry” (Muller 1951, 95-96).

Meanwhile, cytological work had also added credence to the materiality of genes-on-chromosomes. At the same time, however, it further complicated the notion of the gene. During the 1930s, the cytogeneticist Theophilus Painter correlated formal patterns of displacement of genetic loci on Morganian chromosome maps with corresponding visible changes in the banding pattern of giant salivary gland chromosomes of Drosophila. Barbara McClintock was able to follow with her microscope the changes — translocations, inversions and deletions — induced by X-rays in the chromosomes of Zea mays (maize). Simultaneously, Alfred Sturtevant, in his experimental work on the Bar eye effect in Drosophila at the end of the 1920s, had shown what came to be called a position effect: the expression of a mutation was dependent on the position at which the corresponding gene became inserted in the chromosome. This finding stirred wide-ranging discussions about what Muller had called the heterocatalytic aspect of a gene, namely, its association with a particular phenotypic function. If a gene's function depended on its position on the chromosome, it became questionable whether that function was stably connected to that gene at all, or as Richard Goldschmidt assumed later, whether physiological function was not altogether a question of the organization of the genetic material as a whole rather than of particulate genes (Goldschmidt 1940, see also Dietrich 2000).

Thus far, all experimental approaches to the new field of a science of genetics and its presumed elements, the genes, had remained silent with respect to the two basic Mullerian aspects of the gene: its autocatalytic and its heterocatalytic function. Toward the end of the 1930s, Max Delbrück had the intuition that the question of autocatalysis, that is, replication, could be attacked through the study of phage. But the phage system, which he established throughout the 1940s, remained as formal as that of classical Drosophila genetics. Around the same time, Alfred Kühn and his group, as well as Boris Ephrussi with George Beadle, by effecting organ transplantations between mutant and wild type insects, were able to open a window on the space between the gene and its presumed physiological function. Studying the pigmentation of insect eyes, they realized that genes did not directly give rise to physiological substances, but that they obviously first initiated what Kühn termed a “primary reaction” leading to ferments or enzymes, which in turn catalyzed particular steps in metabolic reaction cascades. Kühn summarized the perspective of this kind of “developmental-physiological genetics” in 1941 with the following words:

We stand only at the beginning of a vast research domain. [Our] apprehension of the expression of hereditary traits is changing from a more or less static and preformistic conception to a dynamic and epigenetic one. The formal correlation of individual genes mapped to specific loci on the chromosomes with certain characters has only a limited meaning. Every step in the realization of characters is, so to speak, a node in a network of reaction chains from which many gene actions irradiate. One trait appears to have a simple correlation to one gene only as long as the other genes of the same action chain and of other action chains which are part of the same node, remain the same. Only a methodically conducted genetic, developmental and physiological analysis of a great number of single mutations can gradually disclose the driving action of the hereditary dispositions (das Wirkgetriebe der Erbanlagen) (Kühn 1941, 258).

Kühn viewed his experiments as the beginning of a reorientation of what he perceived as the new preformationism of transmission genetics of his day. He pleaded for an epigenetics that would combine genetic, developmental and physiological analyses to define heterocatalysis, that is, the expression of a gene, as the result of an interaction of two reaction chains, one leading from genes to particular ferments, and the other, leading from one metabolic intermediate to the next by the intervention of these ferments, thus resulting in complex epigenetic networks. But his own experimental practice throughout the 1940s led him to stay with the completion of the pathway of eye pigment formation in Ephestia (the flour-moth). He did not try to develop experimental instruments to attack the gene-enzyme relations themselves implicated in the process. On the other side of the Atlantic, George Beadle and Edward Tatum, working with cultures of Neurospora crassa, codified the latter connection into the one gene-one enzyme hypothesis. But to them, too, the material character of genes and the way these putative entities gave rise to primary products remained elusive and beyond the reach of their own biochemical analysis.

The gene in classical genetics was already far from being a simple notion corresponding to a simple entity. Conceiving of the gene as a unit of transmission, recombination, mutation, and function, classical geneticists combined various aspects of hereditary phenomena whose interrelations were, as a rule, not simple one-to-one relationships. Due to the lack of knowledge about the material nature of the gene, gene conceptions remained largely formal and operationalist, i.e., were substantiated indirectly by the successes achieved in explaining and predicting experimental results. This lack notwithstanding, however, the mounting successes of the various research strands associated with classical genetics led to a “hardening” of the belief in the gene as a discrete, material entity (Falk 2000, 323-26).

3. The Gene in Molecular Genetics

The enzyme view of gene function, as envisaged by Kühn and by Beadle and Tatum, though with cautious reservation, gave the idea of genetic specificity a new twist and helped to pave the way to the molecularization of the gene to which this section will be devoted. The same can be said about the findings of Oswald Avery and his colleagues in the early 1940s. They purified the deoxyribonuleic acid of one strain of bacteria, and demonstrated that it was able to transmit the infectious characteristics of that strain to another, harmless one. Yet the historical path that led to an understanding of the nature of the molecular gene was not a direct follow-up of classical genetics. It was rather embedded in an over-all molecularization of biology driven by the application of newly developed physical and chemical methods and instruments to problems of biology, including those of genetics. Among these methods were ultracentrifugation, X-ray crystallography, electron microscopy, electrophoresis, macromolecular sequencing, and radioactive tracing. At the biological end, it relied on the transition to new, comparatively simple model organisms like unicellular fungi, bacteria, viruses, and phage. A new culture of physically and chemically instructed in vitro biology ensued that in large parts did no longer rest on the presence of intact organisms in a particular experimental system (Rheinberger 1997).

For the development of molecular genetics in the narrower sense, three lines of experimental inquiry proved to be crucial. They were not connected to each other when they gained momentum in the late 1940s, but they happened to merge at the beginning of the 1960s, giving rise to a grand new picture. The first of these developments was the elucidation of the structure of deoxyribonucleic acid (DNA) as a macromolecular double helix by Francis Crick and James D. Watson in 1953. This work was based on chemical information about base composition of the molecule provided by Erwin Chargaff, on data from X-ray crystallography produced by Rosalind Franklin and Maurice Wilkins, and on mechanical model building as developed by Linus Pauling. The result was a picture of a nucleic acid double strand whose four bases (Adenine, Thymine, Guanine, Cytosine) formed complementary pairs (A-T, G-C) that could be arranged in all possible combinations into long linear sequences. At the same time, that molecular model suggested an elegant mechanism for the duplication of the molecule. Opening the strands and synthesizing two new strands complementary to each of the separated threads respectively would suffice to create two identical helices from one. This indeed turned out to be the case, although the duplication process would come to be seen as relying on a complicated molecular replication machinery. Thus, the structure of the DNA double helix had all the characteristics that were to be expected from a molecule serving as an autocatalytic hereditary entity (Chadarevian 2002).

The second line of experiment that formed molecular genetics was the in vitro characterization of the process of protein biosynthesis to which many biochemically working researchers contributed, among them Paul Zamecnik, Mahlon Hoagland, Paul Berg, Fritz Lipmann, Marshall Nirenberg and Heinrich Matthaei. It started in the 1940s largely as an effort to understand the growth of malignant tumors. During the 1950s, it became evident that the process required an RNA template that was originally thought to be part of the microsomes on which the assembly of amino acids took place. In addition it turned out that the process of amino acid condensation was mediated by a transfer molecule with the characteristics of a nucleic acid and the capacity to carry an amino acid. The ensuing idea that it was a linear sequence of ribonucleic acid derived from one of the DNA strands that directed the synthesis of a linear sequence of amino acids, or a polypeptide, and that this process was mediated by an adaptor molecule, was soon corroborated experimentally. The relation between these two classes of molecules was found to be ruled by a nucleic acid triplet code: three bases at a time specified one amino acid (Rheinberger 1997, Kay 2000). Hence, the sequence hypothesis and the central dogma of molecular biology, which Francis Crick formulated at the end of the 1950s:

In its simplest form [the sequence hypothesis] assumes that the specificity of a piece of nucleic acid is expressed solely by the sequence of its bases, and that this sequence is a (simple) code for the amino acid sequence of a particular protein. [The central dogma] states that once ‘information’ has passed into protein it cannot get out again. In more detail, the transfer of information from nucleic acid to nucleic acid, or from nucleic acid to protein may be possible, but transfer from protein to protein, or from protein to nucleic acid is impossible. Information means here the precise determination of sequence, either of bases in the nucleic acid or of amino acid residues in the protein (Crick 1958, 152-153).

With these two fundamental assumptions, a new view of biological specificity came into play. In its center stands the transfer of molecular order from one macromolecule to the other. In one molecule the order is preserved structurally; in the other it becomes expressed and provides the basis for a biological function carried out by a protein. This transfer process became characterized as molecular information transfer. Henceforth, genes could be seen as stretches of deoxyribonucleic acid (or ribonucleic acid in certain viruses) carrying the information for the assembly of a particular protein. Both molecules were thus thought to be colinear, and this indeed turned out to be the case for many bacterial genes. In the end, both fundamental properties that Muller had required of genes, namely autocatalysis and heterocatalysis, were perceived as relying on one and the same stereochemical principle respectively: The base complementarity between nucleic acid building blocks C/G and A/T (U in the case of RNA) was both responsible for the faithful duplication of genetic information in the process of replication, and, via the genetic code, for the transformation of genetic information into biological function through transcription and translation. The code turned out to be nearly universal for all classes of living beings, as were the mechanisms of transcription and translation. The genotype was thus reconfigured as a universal repository of genetic information, sometimes also addressed as a genetic program. Talk of DNA as embodying genetic ‘information,’ as being the ‘blueprint of life’ which governs public discourse until today, emerged from a peculiar conjunction of the physical and the life sciences during World War II, with Erwin Schrödinger's What is Life? as a source of inspiration (Schrödinger 1944), and cybernetics as a discipline engaged in the study of complex systems. It needs to be stressed, however, that initial attempts to ‘crack’ the DNA code by purely cryptographic means soon ran into a dead end. In the end it were biochemists, who unraveled the genetic code by the advanced tools of their discipline (Judson 1996, Kay 2000).

For the further development of the notion of DNA as a ‘program,’ we have to consider an additional third line of experiment, aside from the elucidation of DNA structure and the mechanisms of protein synthesis. This line of experiment came out of a fusion of bacterial genetics with the biochemical characterization of an inducible system of sugar metabolizing enzymes. It was largely the work of François Jacob and Jacques Monod and led, at the beginning of the 1960s, to the identification of messenger RNA as the mediator between genes and proteins, and to the description of a regulatory model of gene activation, the so called operon model, in which two classes of genes became distinguished: One class were the structural genes. They were presumed to carry the ‘structural information’ for the production of particular polypeptides. The other class were the regulatory genes. They were assumed to be involved in the regulation of the expression of structural information. A third element of DNA involved in the regulatory loop of an operon was a binding site, or signal sequence that was not transcribed at all. These three elements, structural genes, regulatory genes, and signal sequences provided the framework for viewing the genotype itself as an ordered, hierarchical system, as a ‘genetic program,’ as Jacob contended, not without immediately adding that it was a very peculiar program, namely one that needed its own products for being executed: “There is only the incessant execution of a program that is inseparable from its realization. For the only elements being able to interpret the genetic message are the products of that message” (Jacob 1976, 297). If we take that view seriously, although the whole conception looks like a circle and has been criticized as such (Keller 2000), it is in the end the organism which interprets or ‘recruits’ the structural genes by activating or inhibiting the regulatory genes that control their expression.

The operon model of Jacob and Monod marked thus the precipitous end of the simple, informational concept of the molecular gene. Since the beginning of the 1960s, the picture of gene expression has become vastly more complicated (for the following, compare Rheinberger 2000). Moreover, most genomes of higher organisms appear to comprise huge DNA stretches to which no function can as yet be assigned. The ‘non-coding,’ but functionally specific, regulatory DNA-elements have proliferated: There exist promoter and terminator sequences; upstream and downstream activating elements in transcribed or non-transcribed, translated or untranslated regions; leader sequences; externally and internally transcribed spacers before, between, and after structural genes; interspersed repetitive elements and tandemly repeated sequences such as satellites, LINEs (long interspersed sequences) and SINEs (short interspersed sequences) of various classes and sizes. Given all the bewildering details of these elements, it comes as no surprise that their molecular function is still far from being fully understood (for an overview see Fischer 1995).

As far as transcription, i.e., the synthesis of an RNA copy from a sequence of DNA, is concerned, overlapping reading frames have been found on one and the same strand of DNA, and protein coding stretches have been found to derive from both strands of the double helix in an overlapping fashion. On the level of modification after transcription, the picture has become equally complicated. Soon it was realized that DNA transcripts such as transfer RNA and ribosomal RNA had to be trimmed and matured in a complex enzymatic manner to become functional molecules, and that messenger RNAs of eukaryotes underwent extensive posttranscriptional modification both at their 5′-ends (capping) and their 3′-ends (polyadenylation) before they were ready to go into the translation machinery. In the 1970s, to the surprise of everybody, molecular biologists had to acquaint themselves with the idea that eukaryotic genes were composed of modules, and that, after transcription, introns were cut out and exons spliced together in order to yield a functional message. The gene-in-pieces was one of the first major scientific offshoots of recombinant DNA technology, and this technology has since continued to be good for unanticipated vistas on the genome and the processing of its units. A spliced messenger sometimes may comprise a fraction as little as ten percent or less of the primary transcript. Since the late 1970s, molecular biologists have become familiar with various kinds of RNA splicing: Autocatalytic self-splicing, alternative splicing of one single transcript to yield different messages; and even trans-splicing of different primary transcripts to yield one hybrid message. In the case of the egg-laying hormone of Aplysia, to take just one example, one and the same stretch of DNA finally gives rise to eleven protein products involved in the reproductive behavior of this snail. Finally, yet another mechanism, or rather, class of mechanisms has been found to operate on the level of RNA transcripts. It is called messenger RNA editing. In this case, which meanwhile has turned out not just to be an exotic curiosity of some trypanosomes, the original transcript is not only cut and pasted, but its nucleotide sequence is systematically altered after transcription. The nucleotide replacement happens before translation starts, and is mediated by various guide RNAs and enzymes that excise old and insert new nucleotides in a variety of ways to yield a product that is no longer complementary to the DNA stretch from which it was originally derived, and a protein that is no longer co-linear with the DNA sequence in the classical molecular biological definition.

The complications with the molecular biological gene continue on the level of translation, i.e., the synthesis of a polypeptide according to the sequence of triplets of the mRNA molecule. There are findings such as translational starts at different start codons on one and the same messenger RNA; instances of obligatory frameshifting within a given message without which a nonfunctional polypeptide would result; post-translational protein modification such as removing amino acids from the amino terminus of the translated polypeptide. There is another observation called protein splicing, which has been made within the last years. Here, portions of the original translation product have to be cleaved and joined together in a new order before yielding a functional protein. And finally, a recent development from the translational field is that a ribosome can manage to translate two different messenger RNAs into one single polypeptide. François Gros, after a life in molecular biology, has come to the rather paradoxically sounding conclusion that in view of this perplexing complexity, the ‘exploded gene’ — le gène éclaté — could be specified, if at all, then only by “the products that result from its activity,” that is, the functional molecules to which they give rise (Gros 1991, 297). But it appears difficult, if thought through, to follow Gros' advice of such a reverse definition, as the phenotype would come to define the genotype.

In conclusion, it can be said, as Falk (2000) reminds us, that on the one hand, the autocatalytic property once attributed to the gene as a unit has been relegated to the DNA at large. It can no longer been taken as being specific for the gene as such. After all, the process of DNA replication is not punctuated by the boundaries of coding regions. On the other hand, as many observers of the scene have remarked (Kitcher 1982, Gros 1991, Morange 1998, Portin 1993, Fogle 2000), it has become ever harder to define clear-cut properties of a gene as a heterocatalytic entity. It has become a matter of choice as to which sequence elements are to be included and which ones to be excluded. There have been different reactions to this situation.

Scientists like Thomas Fogle and Michel Morange concede that there is no longer a precise definition of what could count as a gene. But they do not worry much about this situation and are ready to continue to talk about genes in a contextual, generic and pragmatic manner (Fogle 2000, Morange 2000). Elof Carlson and Petter Portin have as well concluded that the present gene concept is abstract, general, and open, despite or just because present knowledge on the structure and organization of the genetic material has become so comprehensive and so detailed. But they, like Richard Burian (1985), take open concepts with a large reference potential not as a deficit to live with, but as a potentially productive tool in science. Such concepts offer options and leave choices open (Carlson 1991, Portin 1993). Philosopher Philip Kitcher, as a consequence of all the molecular input concerning the gene, already some 20 years ago drew the ultraliberal conclusion that “there is no molecular biology of the gene. There is only molecular biology of the genetic material” (Kitcher 1982, 357).

Jürgen Brosius and Stephen Jay Gould have thought along similar, but more constructive lines and some time ago came up with a new terminology. They proposed to abandon the gene concept altogether and to call ‘nuon’ any segment of DNA that has a recognizable structure and/or function (such as a coding segment, a repetitive element, a regulatory element). By duplication, amplification, recombination, retroposition, and similar mechanisms, nuons can give rise to ‘potonuons,’ that is, entities potentially recruitable as new nuons. These in turn have either the chance of being transformed into ‘naptonuons,’ that is, dissipate their non-adaptive former information without acquiring new one, or else into ‘xaptonuons,’ that is, elements adapted to a new function (Brosius and Gould 1993). This would at least make sense for the autocatalytic and evolutionary dimension of the genetic material. It would take seriously the fact that the reproductive function ascribed to genes has turned out to be a function of the whole genome. The replication process, that is, the transmission aspect of genetics as such has revealed itself to be a complicated molecular process whose versatility, far from being restricted to gene shuffling during meiotic recombination, constitutes a reservoir for evolution and is run by a highly complex molecular machinery including polymerases, gyrases, DNA binding proteins, repair mechanisms, and more. Genomic differences, targeted by selection, then can, but must not become ‘compartmented into genes’ during evolution, as Peter Beurton has put it (Beurton 2000, 303).

On the other hand, there are those who take the heterocatalytic variability of the gene as an argument to treat the genetic process as a whole, hence genes as well, no longer as fundamental units in their own right, but rather as a developmental resource. They claim that time has come, if not to dissolve, then at least to embed genetics in development and even development in reproduction — as James Griesemer suggests (Griesemer 2000) — and pick up the thread where Kühn and others left it half a century ago. Consequently, Moss defines ‘gene-D’ as a “developmental resource (hence the D), which in itself is indeterminate with respect to phenotype. To be a gene-D is to be a transcriptional unit on a chromosome, within which are contained molecular template resources” (Moss 2003, 46). On this view, these templates constitute only one reservoir on which the developmental process draws and are not ontologically privileged as hereditary molecules.

With molecular biology, the classical gene “went molecular” (Waters 1994). Ironically, the initial idea of genes as simple stretches of DNA coding for a protein was dissolved in this process. Together with the material structure, which the classical gene acquired through molecular biology, biochemical mechanisms accounting for the transmission and expression of genes proliferated. The development of molecular biology itself, that enterprise so often described as an utterly reductionist conquest, has made it impossible to think of the genome any longer simply as a set of pieces of contiguous DNA co-linear with the proteins derived from them and each of them endowed with a specific function. At the beginning of the twenty-first century, when the results of the Human Genome Project were timely presented on the fiftieth anniversary of the double helix, molecular genetics seems to have accomplished a full circle, readdressing reproduction and inheritance no longer from a purely genetic, but from an evolution cum development perspective.

4. The Gene in Evolution and Development

One of the more spectacular events in the history of twentieth-century biology as a discipline, triggered by the rise of genetics (mathematical population genetics in particular), was the so-called ‘modern evolutionary synthesis.’ In a whole series of textbooks, published by evolutionary biologists like Theodosius Dobzhansky, Ernst Mayr and Julian S. Huxley, the results of population genetics were used to re-establish Darwinian, selectionist evolution. After the ‘eclipse of Darwinism’, which had reigned around 1900 (Bowler 1983), neo-Darwinism once again provided a unifying, explanatory framework for biology that also included the more descriptive, naturalist disciplines like systematics, biogeography, or paleontology (Provine 1971, Mayr & Provine 1980).

Scott Gilbert (2000) has singled out six aspects of the notion of the gene as it had been used in population genetics up to the modern evolutionary synthesis. First, it shared with the classical gene in the Morganian sense that it was an abstraction, an entity that had to fulfill formal requirements, but that did not need to be and indeed was not materially specified. Second, the evolutionary gene had to result in or had to be correlated with some phenotypic difference that could be ‘seen’ or targeted by selection. Third, and by the same token, the gene of the evolutionary synthesis was the entity that was ultimately responsible for selection to occur and last between organisms. Fourth, the gene of the evolutionary synthesis was largely equated with what molecular biologists came to call ‘structural genes.’ Fifth, it was a gene expressed in an organism competing for reproductive advantage. And finally, it was seen as a largely independent unit. Richard Dawkins has taken this last argument to its extreme by defining the gene as a ‘selfish’ replicator competing with its fellow genes and using the organism as an instrument for its own survival (Dawkins 1976).

Molecular biology, with higher organisms moving center stage during the past three decades, has made a caricature of this kind of evolutionary gene, and has moved before our eyes genes and whole genomes as complex systems not only allowing for evolution to occur, but being themselves subjected to a vigorous process of evolution. The genome in its entirety has taken on a more and more flexible and dynamic configuration. Not only have the mobile genetic elements, characterized by McClintock more than half a century ago in Zea mays, gained currency in the form of transposons that regularly and irregularly can become excised and inserted all over bacterial and eukaryotic genomes. There are also other forms of shuffling that occur at the DNA level. A gigantic amount of somatic gene tinkering and DNA splicing, for instance, is involved in organizing the immune response. It gives rise to the production of potentially millions of different antibodies. No genome would be large enough to cope with such a task if not the parceling out of genes and a sophisticated permutation of their parts had been invented during evolution. Gene families have arisen from duplication over time, containing silenced genes (sometimes called pseudogenes). Genes themselves appear to have largely arisen from modules by combination. We find jumping genes; and multiple genes of one sort giving rise to a genetic polymorphism on the DNA itself coding for different protein isoforms. In short, there appears to be a whole battery of mechanisms and entities that constitute what could be called a respiratory, or breathing genome.

Molecular evolutionary biologists have scarcely scratched the surface and barely started to understand this flexible genetic apparatus. It has become evident that the genome is a dynamic body of ancestrally tinkered pieces and forms of genetic iteration (Jacob 1977). Genome sequencing combined with intelligent sequence data comparison may bring out more of this structure in the near future. If there is a chance to understand evolution beyond the classical, itself largely formal, evolutionary synthesis, it is from the perspective of learning more about the genome as a dynamic and modular configuration. The purported elementary events on which this complex machinery operates, such as point mutations, nucleotide deletions, additions, and oligonucleotide inversions, are no longer the only elements of the evolutionary process, but solely one component in a much wider arsenal of DNA tinkering. Peter Beurton (2000) concludes from all this that the gene is no longer to be seen as the unit of evolution, but rather as its late product, the eventual result of a long history of genomic condensation. Likewise, the comparatively simple arrangement of genes in the bacterial chromosome may not reflect a primitive simplicity, but may rather be the byproduct of some billion years of streamlining.

We have come a long way with molecular biology from genes to genomes. But there is still a longer way to go from genomes to organisms. The developmental gene as it acquired contours over the last twenty years form the early work of Ed Lewis and Antonio Garcia-Bellido, and from later work by Walter Gehring, Christiane Nüsslein-Volhard, Eric Wieschaus, Peter Gruss, Denis Duboule, and others, allows us possibly to go a step along on this way. As Gilbert (2000) argues, it is the exact counterpart to the gene of the evolutionary synthesis. But we need to be more specific and direct attention to what has been termed ‘developmental genes’ proper. As it turned out, largely from an exhaustive exploitation of mutation saturation and genetic engineering technologies, fundamental processes in development such as segmentation or eye formation in such widely different organisms as insects and mammals are decisively influenced by the activation and inhibition of a class of regulatory genes that to some extent resemble the regulator genes of the operon model. But in distinction to these long known regulatory genes, whose function rests on their ability to being reversibly switched on and off according to the requirements of actual metabolic and environmental situations, developmental genes initiate irreversible processes. They code for so-called transcription factors which can bind to control regions of DNA and thus influence the rate of transcription of a particular gene or a whole set of genes at a particular stage of development. Among them are what we could call developmental genes of a second order which appear to control and modulate the units gated by the developmental genes of the first order. They act as a veritable kind of master switches and have been found to be highly conserved throughout evolution. An example is a member of the pax-gene family that can switch on a whole complex process such as eye formation from insects to vertebrates. Most surprisingly, the homologous gene isolated from the mouse can replace the one present in Drosophila, and when placed in the fruit fly, switch on, not mammalian eye formation, but insect eye formation. Many of these genes or gene families, like the homeobox family, are thought to be involved in the generation of spatial patterning during embryogenesis as well as in its temporal patterning.

Morange (2000) distinguishes two central “hard facts” that can be retained from this actually highly fluid and contested research field. The first is that the regulatory genes appear to play a central role in development as judged from the often drastic effects resulting from their inactivation. And second, it appears that not only particular homeotic genes have been highly conserved between distantly related organisms, but that they tend to come in complexes which have themselves been structurally conserved throughout evolution, thus once more testifying to genomic higher order structures. Another class of such highly conserved genes and gene complexes is involved in the formation of components of pathways that bring about intracellular and cell-to-cell signaling. These processes are of obvious importance for cellular differentiation and for embryonic development of multi-cellular organisms.

One of the big surprises of the extensive use of the technology of targeted gene knockout has been that genes thought to be indispensable for a particular function, when knocked out, did not alter or at least not significantly alter the organism's performance. This made developmental molecular biologists aware, that the networks of development appear to be largely redundant, and that certain parts can compensate for eventually missing parts. These networks are obviously highly buffered and thus robust to a considerable extent with respect to changing external and internal conditions. Gene products are of course involved in these networks and their complex functions, but these functions are by no means defined by the genes alone. Another result, coming from embryonic gene expression studies with recently developed chip technologies, was that one and the same gene product can be expressed at different stages of development and in different tissues, and that it can be implied in quite different metabolic and cellular functions. Again, this multi-functionality of genes may help to rethink what genetic and biological determination means.

These recent results seriously call into question the further applicability of straightforward ‘gene-for’ talk. Highly conserved in evolution, yet highly redundant and variable in function, developmental genes rather look like molecular building blocks with which evolution tinkers in constructing organisms (Jacob 1977, Morange 2000) than like the pieces of DNA with a determinate function as originally envisioned by molecular genetics. The discovery of developmental genes throws light on the way in which the genome as a whole is organized as a dynamic, modular, and robust entity.

5. The Question of Reduction

As we argued in the preceding sections, the history of twentieth century genetics is characterized by a proliferation of methods for the individuation of genetic components, and, accordingly, by a proliferation of gene definitions. These definitions appear to be largely technology-dependent. Major conceptual changes did not precede, but followed experimental breakthroughs. Especially the contrast of the ‘classical’ and the ‘molecular’ gene, the latter succeeding the former chronologically, has raised issues of how such alternative concepts relate semantically, ontologically, and epistemologically. Understanding these relations might offer a chance to convey some order to the bewildering variety of meanings inscribed in the concept of the gene in the course of a long century.

In a now classical paper, Kenneth Schaffner argued that molecular biology — the Watson-Crick model of DNA in particular — effected a reduction of the laws of (classical) genetics to physical and chemical laws (Schaffner 1969, 342). The successes of molecular biology in identifying DNA as the genetic material — as Watson's and Crick's discovery of the DNA structure or the Meselson-Stahl experiment — lend empirical support, according to Schaffner, “for reduction functions involved in the reduction of biology as: gene1 = DNA sequence1.” Schaffner's account was severely criticized by David Hull, who pointed out that relations between Mendelian and molecular terms are “many-many,” not “one-one” or “many-one” relations as assumed by Schaffner, because “phenomena characterized by a single Mendelian predicate term can be reproduced by several types of molecular mechanisms […and] conversely, the same type of molecular mechanism can produce phenomena that must be characterized by different Mendelian predicate terms” (Hull 1974, 39). “To convert these many-many relations,” Hull concluded, “into the necessary one-one or many-one relations leading from molecular to Mendelian terms, Mendelian genetics must be modified extensively. Two problems then arise — the justification for terming these modifications ‘corrections’ and the transition from Mendelian to molecular genetics ‘reduction’ rather than ‘replacement’” (Hull 1974, 43). To account for this difficulty and accommodate the intuition (which Hull shared) that there should be at least some way in which it makes sense to speak of a reduction of classical to molecular genetics, Alexander Rosenberg adopted the notion of supervenience (coined by Donald Davidson and going back to George Edward Moore) to describe the relation of classical to molecular genetics. Supervenience implies that any two items that share the same properties in molecular terms, also have the same properties in Mendelian terms, without, however, entailing a commitment that Mendelian laws must be deducible from the laws of biochemistry (Rosenberg 1978). This recalls the way in which classical geneticists related gene differences and trait differences in the differential gene concept, where trait differences were used as markers for genetic differences without implying a deducibility of trait behavior, the dominance or recessivity of traits in particular, from Mendelian laws (Schwartz 2000, Falk 2001). Interestingly, Kenneth Waters has argued on this basis, and against Hull, that the complexity that was revealed by molecular genetics was simply the complexity already posited by classical geneticists. (Waters 1994, 2000).

The literature on genetics and reductionism has meanwhile become as variegated and complex as the field of scientific activities it attempts to illuminate. In his book-length, critical assessment of that literature, Sahotra Sarkar made an interesting move by distinguishing five different concepts of reduction, of which he considers three to be particularly relevant to genetics: “weak reduction,” exemplified by the notion of heritability; “abstract hierarchical reduction,” exemplified by classical genetics; and “approximate strong reduction,” exemplified by the use of ‘information’-based explanation in molecular genetics. The perhaps not so surprising result with which Sarkar comes up is, that “reduction — in its various types — is scientifically interesting beyond, especially, the formal concerns of most philsophers of sciences” in that it constitutes a “valuable, sometimes exciting, and occasionally indispensable strategy in science” and thus needs to be acknowledged as being ultimately “related to the actual practice of genetics” (Sarkar 1998, 190). In a similar vein, Jean Gayon has expounded a “philosophical scheme” for the history of genetics which treats phenomenalism, instrumentalism, and realism not as alternative systems that philosophers have to decide between, but as actual, historically consecutive strategies employed by geneticists in their work (Gayon 2000).

We would finally like to address briefly two issues that are related to the problem of reduction and have occasioned repeated discussion in the philosophical literature. The first point concerns the notion of ‘information’ in molecular genetics. The inflationary early molecular uses of the terms ‘genetic information’ and of ‘genetic program’ have been widely criticized by philosophers and historians of science alike (Sarkar 1996, Kay 2000, Keller 2001). No one less than Gunther Stent, one of the strongest proponents of what has been termed the ‘informational school’ of molecular biology, warned long ago that talk about ‘genetic information’ is best confined to its explicit and explicable meaning of sequence specification, that is, that it is best to keep it in the local confines of ‘coding’ instead of scaling it up to a global talk of genetic ‘programming.’ “It goes without saying,” he contends, “that the principles of chemical catalysis [of an enzyme] are not represented in the DNA nucleotide base sequences,” and he concludes:

After all, there is no aspect of the phenome to whose determination the genes cannot be said to have made their contribution. Thus it transpires that the concept of genetic information, which in the heyday of molecular biology was of such great heuristic value for unraveling the structure and function of the genes, i.e., the explicit meaning of that information, is no longer so useful in this later period when the epigenetic relations which remain in want of explanation represent mainly the implicit meaning of that information (Stent 1977, 137).

However, it appears to us that one should remain aware of the fact that the molecular biological notion of a flow of information, both in terms of storage and expression in the interaction between two classes of macromolecules, has added a dimension of talking about living systems that helps to distinguish them specifically from chemical and physical systems characterized solely by flows of matter and flows of energy (Crick 1958, Maynard Smith 2000). Molecular biology, seen by many historians and philosophers of biology as a paragon of reductionism, did not only introduce physics and chemistry into biology, or even reduce the latter to the former two, but — paradoxically — also helped to find a way of conceiving of organisms in a fundamentally non-reducible manner. In a broader vision, this implies ‘epigenetic’ mechanisms of intracellular and intercellular molecular signaling and communication in which genetic information and its differential expression is embedded and through which it is contextualized. Upon this view, it appears not only legitimate, but heuristically productive to conceive of the functional networks of living beings in a biosemiotic terminology instead of a simply mechanistic or energetic idiom (Emmeche 1999).

The second point concerns the already mentioned “gene-for” talk. Why has talk about genes coding for this and that become so entrenched? Why do genes still appear as the ultimate determinators and executers of life? As we have seen in the preceding two sections, the advances in conceptualizing processes of organismic development and evolution have thoroughly deconstructed the view of genes as it dominated classical genetics and the early phases of molecular genetics. Why is it, to talk with Moss, that genetics is still “understood not as a practice of instrumental reductionism but rather in the constitutive reductionist vein” implying the “ability to account for the production of the phenotype on the basis of the genes” (Moss 2003, 50)? A recent empirical study by Paul Griffiths and Karola Stotz on how biologists conceptualize genes comes indeed to the conclusion “that the classical molecular gene concept continues to function as something like a stereotype for biologists, despite the many cases in which that conception does not give a principled answer to the quesiton of whether a particular sequence is a gene” (Stotz and Griffiths, in press). Waters provides a surprising but altogether plausible epistemological answer to this apparent conundrum (Waters, in press). He reminds us forcefully that in the context of scientific work and research, genes are first and foremost handled as entities of epistemological rather than ontological value. It is on the grounds of their epistemic function in research that they appear so privileged. Waters deliberately goes beyond the question of reductionism or anti-reductionism that has structured so much philosophical work on modern biology, especially on genetics and molecular biology over the past decades. He stresses that the successes of a gene-centered view on the organism are not due to the fact that genes are the major determinants of the main processes in living beings. Rather, they figure so prominently because they provide highly successful entry points for the investigation of these processes. The success of gene-centrism, according to this view, is not ontologically, but first and foremost epistemologically grounded.

From this, two major philosophical claims result: First, that it is the structure of investigation rather than an encompassing system of explanation that has grounded the scientific success of genetics; and second, that the essential incompleteness of genetic explanations, whenever they are meant to be located at the ontological level, calls for the promotion of a scientific pluralism. The message is that complex objects of investigation such as organisms cannot be successfully understood by a single best account or description, and that any experimentally proceeding science is basically advancing through the construction of successful models. Whether and how long these models will continue to be gene-based, remains an open question. In any case, however, it will be contingent on the future research process, not on an ontology of life.


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Hans-Jörg Rheinberger
Staffan Müller-Wille

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