## Frege's ‘Derivation’ of Hume's Principle in the *Grundgesetze*

In **Gg**, Fregean extensions do *not* contain
concepts as members but rather objects. So Frege had to find another
way to express the explicit definition of #*F*. His technique
was to let extensions go proxy for their corresponding concepts. We may
describe Frege's technique as follows. (What follows is an adaptation
and simplification of the strategy Frege outlines in
**Gg** I, §34ff.) Instead of defining the number of
*F*s as the extension consisting of all those first-order
concepts that are equinumerous to *F*, he defined it as the
extension consisting of all the extensions of concepts equinumerous to
*F*. Here is a formula which says: *x is an extension of a
concept that is equinumerous to F*:
∃*H*(*x* = ε*H*
& *H* ≈ *F*)

We can name this concept using our λ-notation as follows:
[λ*x* ∃*H*(*x* =
ε*H* & *H* ≈
*F*)]

Instead of writing out this lengthy expression *being an x which is
an extension of a concept equinumerous to F*, let us abbreviate our
λ-notation for this concept as
‘*F*^{≈}’. Note that the extension of
this concept, ε*F*^{≈}, contains only
extensions as members.
Now Frege's explicit definition of ‘the number of
*F*s’ can be given as follows:

#*F* =_{df}
ε*F*^{≈}

This definition identifies the number of *F*s as the extension
that contains all and only those extensions of concepts that are
equinumerous to *F*.
We can complete our preliminary work for the proof of Hume's
Principle by formulating and proving the following Lemma (derived from
Basic Law V), which simplifies the proof of Hume's Principle:

**Lemma for Hume's Principle**:

ε*G* ∈ #*F* ≡
*G* ≈ *F*
(Proof of the Lemma for Hume's Principle)

This Lemma tells us that an extension such as εG will be a
member of #*F* just in case *G* is equinumerous to
*F*. Clearly, since *F* is equinumerous to itself, it
follows that #*F* contains ε*F* as a member. From
these facts, one can get a sense of how Frege derived Hume's Principle
Basic Law V in **Gg**. Here is a reconstruction of the
argument.
Proof of Hume's Principle from Basic Law V

Return to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic