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Folk Psychology as Mental Simulation

The simulation (or, "mental simulation") theory (ST) is a theory of everyday human psychological competence: that is, of the skills and resources people routinely call on in the anticipation, explanation, and social coordination of behavior. ST holds that we represent the mental activities and processes of others by mentally simulating them, or generating similar activities and processes in ourselves: thus, for example, anticipating another's solution to a theoretical or practical problem by solving the problem ourselves (with adjustments for evident disparities, e.g., in skill level). The basic idea is that if the resources our own brain uses to guide our own behavior can be modified to work as representations of other people, then we have no need to store general information about what makes people tick: We just do the ticking for them. Simulation is thus said to be process-driven rather than theory-driven (Goldman 1989).

What initially sparked philosophical interest in ST was that it seemed to challenge the assumption that a theory (a "folk" psychology) underlies psychological competence. Without this assumption, what had been a major issue in the philosophy of mind would be baseless: namely, the debate between psychological realists, who thought folk psychology a fundamentally sound foundation for cognitive science, and eliminativists, who deemed it a fundamentally flawed theory.

Unlike earlier controversies concerning the role of empathetic understanding and historical reenactment in the human sciences, the current debate between the simulation theory and the "theory" theory appeals to empirical findings, including experimental results concerning children's development of psychological competence and recent discoveries in cognitive neuroscience (see Section 4).

1. What is Meant by "Simulation"?

In recent discussions of everyday "folk" psychology, the term "simulation" has, like the term "theory," come to be used broadly and in a variety of ways. Simulation is usually equated with role-taking, or imaginatively "putting oneself in the other's place." This metaphor is understood to embrace adoption of different spatial and temporal perspectives as well as other shifts in indexically specified situations (e.g., in social role, office, or kinship relations); and further, adoption of alternative character traits and similar exercises of dramatic impersonation. However, one may also conceive simulation as including simple "projection," without adjustments in imagination; e.g., where there is no need to put oneself in the other's place, as one is, in all relevant respects, already there: e.g., the tornado is approaching not just you or me but us.

Along with this person-level characterization of simulation, simulation is also conceived by most proponents in cognitive-scientific terms. It is assumed that in role-taking, one's own behavior control system is employed as a manipulable model of other such systems. (This is not to say that the "person" who is simulating is the model; rather, only that one's brain can be manipulated to model other persons.) The system is first taken off-line, so that the output is not actual behavior but only predictions or anticipations of behavior, and inputs and system parameters are accordingly not limited to those that would regulate one's own behavior. Although this sometimes results in vicarious decision-making, more typically it stops at the more modest goal of establishing which options would be attractive (so that one would not be surprised to find the other pursuing one of them) and which unattractive (so that one would be surprised to find the other pursuing any of them).

In cognitive neuroscience, the term "simulation" is used to denote the (usually automatic and unconscious) activation, in response to the observed behavior of another, of neural mechanisms associated with the production of like behavior in oneself. (See Section 4.)

Stephen Stich and Shaun Nichols, whose critical papers have clarified the issues and helped refine ST, urge that the term "simulation" be dropped in favor of a finer-grained terminology. However, important as precision is in formulating testable hypotheses, there may also be value in a broad, open-ended inquiry that asks how implementations of the top-down imaginative procedures that philosophers and psychologists describe might mesh with the bottom-up mechanisms that neuroscientists have recently discovered (Gallese 2001; Hurley 2004).

2. Varieties of Simulation Theory

Alvin Goldman and the psychologist Paul Harris conceive simulation differently from Robert Gordon and Jane Heal, the philosophers who, working independently, introduced the theory (Gordon 1986, Heal 1986). (Heal's term "replication" and Gordon's "simulation" were generally taken to refer to the same putative process.) According to Goldman (1989) and, less clearly, Harris (1989), to ascribe mental states to others by simulation, one must already be able to ascribe mental states to oneself on the basis of introspection, and thus must already possess the relevant mental state concepts. The introspectionist account would suggest that simulation can only be justified by an argument from analogy. According to a classic version of this argument,

I am conscious in myself of [a] uniform sequence, of which the beginning is modifications of my body, the middle is feelings, the end is outward demeanour. In the case of other human beings I have the evidence of my senses for the first and last links of the series, but not for the intermediate link…by supposing the link to be of the same nature…I bring other human beings…under the same generalizations…. (J.S. Mill, An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy. 6th edition. London, 1869)

According to Gordon's "radical" version of ST (1995), a capacity for simulation is necessary for the very capacity to perceive objects as mind-endowed (and thus for perceiving human beings as persons). Only those who can simulate can understand an ascription of, e.g., belief--that to S it is the case that p. Even though general psychological information may sometimes be called on in our everyday "mind-reading," it is information that would not be fully intelligible to beings that were incapable of simulation — perhaps in the way that information about color would not be fully intelligible to someone incapable of color sensation or imagery. My representation of a particular other (O) is essentially a stored simulation (stored, perhaps, as a set of modifications of myself). Although the particulars of my simulative representation of O are subject to empirical justification, there is no further inference (e.g., based on analogy) from my simulative representation of O to "what O is really like."

While no simulation theorist claims that all our everyday explanations and predictions of the actions of other people are based on role-taking, Heal in particular has been a moderating influence, arguing for a hybrid simulation-and-theory account that reserves simulation primarily for items with rationally linked content, such as beliefs, desires, and actions.

3. The Parsimony Argument

The most important distinguishing feature of folk psychology, according to many theory theorists, is the central and essential role it gives to the semantic content of the states it posits, particularly the propositional or sentential "objects" of propositional attitudes such as beliefs, desires, and intentions. Most theory theorists try to accommodate this feature with the hypothesis that folk psychology comprises laws or principles that quantify over this content, connecting, for example, what x believes and what x desires to what x chooses to do. Moreover, the connections are said generally to mirror the semantic relations that hold among these contents, particularly relations that can be represented abstractly by rules of logic and rational argument such as modus ponens and the practical syllogism. Thus the theory theory posits an internal store of causal laws or principles corresponding to these rules. The following is the sort of principle one might call on to anticipate what a particular person will do, say, upon losing a credit card, given that undesirable consequences would ensue if they did not take action:

If S believes that if p, then (q unless S does x); and S desires that not-q; and S does not believe that if p and S does x, then something r will be the case such that S desires not-r more than S desires that p; etc., etc.; then, ceteris paribus, probably S will do x.

It seems implausible, however, to suppose that we must invoke such principles when we anticipate our own behavior in future contingent or counterfactual situations. To answer the question, "What would you do if your credit card were missing?" one would more likely use a simulative strategy. This is not to say that such a strategy is foolproof, or that we never employ generalizations in our own case. However, the generalizations we do sometimes employ tend to be not theoretical but behavioral descriptions: e.g., "I always become fatalistic in such situations," where "become fatalistic" and "such situations," though highly interpreted culture-bound descriptions, are not theoretical in any sense amenable to the theory theory: They do not describe the inner workings of a cognitive behavior control system, and they certainly do not constitute laws corresponding to rules of logic and reason.

Insofar as the store of causal generalizations mirrors the set of rules our own thinking typically conforms to, the simulation theory appears to render it otiose. For whatever rules our own thinking typically conforms to, our thinking continues to conform to them within the context of simulation, unless, of course, adjustments are made to accommodate evident differences. In short, we can use our own reasoning as a model of the reasoning of beings that reason the way we do. In the light of this alternative, it is argued, the hypothesis that people must be endowed with a special stock of laws corresponding to rules of logic and reason appears unmotivated and unparsimonious.

4. Areas of Empirical Investigation

Four main areas of empirical investigation have been thought especially relevant to the debate:

Some philosophers think the simulation theory may shed light on issues in traditional philosophy of mind and language concerning intentionality, referential opacity, broad and narrow content, the nature of mental causation, Twin Earth problems, the problem of other minds, and the peculiarities of self-knowledge. Several philosophers have applied the theory to aesthetics, ethics, and philosophy of the social sciences. Success or failure of these efforts to answer philosophical problems may be considered empirical tests of the theory, in a suitably broad sense of "empirical."


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folk psychology: as a theory | materialism: eliminative


A portion of this entry is excerpted, with permission, from "Simulation vs Theory Theory", MIT Encyclopedia of Cognitive Science (MIT Press, 1999)

Copyright © 2004
Robert M. Gordon

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