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Feminist History of Philosophy

The past two decades have seen an explosion of feminist writing on the philosophical canon, a development that has clear parallels in other disciplines like literature and art history. Since most of the writing is, in one way or another, critical of the tradition, a natural question to ask is: Why does the history of philosophy have importance for feminist philosophers? This question assumes that the history of philosophy is of importance for feminists, an assumption that is warranted by the sheer volume of recent feminist writing on the canon. This entry explores the different ways that feminist philosophers are interacting with the Western philosophical tradition.

Feminist philosophers engaged in a project of re-reading and re-forming the philosophical canon have noticed two significant areas of concern. The first is the problem of historical exclusion. Feminist philosophers are faced with a tradition that believes that there are no women philosophers and, if there are any, they are unimportant. Of course, women are not entirely absent from the history of philosophy, and that brings us to the second challenge we face. Canonical philosophers have had plenty to say about women and what we are like. In general terms, we often find that philosophical norms like reason and objectivity are defined in contrast to matter, the irrational or whatever a given philosopher associates with women and the feminine. Our tradition tells us, either implicitly through images and metaphors, or explicitly in so many words, that philosophy itself, and its norms of reason and objectivity, exclude everything that is feminine or associated with women.

In response, feminist philosophers have criticized both the historical exclusion of women from the philosophical tradition, and the negative characterization of women or the feminine in it. Feminist historians of philosophy have argued that the historical record is incomplete because it omits women philosophers, and it is biased because it devalues any women philosophers it forgot to omit. In addition, feminist philosophers have argued that the philosophical tradition is conceptually flawed because of the way that its fundamental norms like reason and objectivity are gendered male.[1] By means of these criticisms, feminist philosophers are enlarging the philosophical canon and re-evaluating its norms, in order to include women in the philosophical "us".

The following entry contains 3 major sections. Section 1 ("Feminist Criticisms of the Canon as Misogynist") describes feminist readings of the philosophical canon that challenge its derogatory characterizations of women. These are of three kinds: (a) readings that record the explicit misogyny of great philosophers (like Aristotle's description of a female as a deformed male); (b) readings that argue for gendered interpretations of theoretical concepts (like matter and form in Aristotle); (c) synoptic interpretations of the canon (like the view that, historically, reason and objectivity are gendered male). The third category of feminist criticisms of the canon diagnoses where philosophy as a whole went most deeply wrong, and, in doing so, it constructs a negative canon of philosophy. The negative canon exposes the ways in which the views of canonical philosophers throughout the history of philosophy are explicitly or implicitly misogynist or sexist. Section 2 ("Feminist Revisions of the History of Philosophy") discusses the response of feminist philosophy to the myths that there are no women philosophers and, in any case, no important ones. One response has been the retrieval of women philosophers for the historical record. A related development is the elevation to the canon of women philosophers like Mary Wollstonecraft, Hannah Arendt and Simone de Beauvoir. Section 3 ("Feminist Appropriation of Canonical Philosophers") examines the way that feminist philosophers have been engaged in rereading the canon looking for antecedents to feminist philosophy in the work of those philosophers (e.g. Hume) and those theories (e.g. Arisotle's virtue ethics) that are most congenial to current trends in feminism or which provide most fuel for feminist thought. This is to use the canon as other movements have done--as a resource, and as confirmation that a feminist perspective or problem is securely rooted in our philosophical culture.

1. Feminist Criticisms of the Canon as Misogynist

Women are capable of education, but they are not made for activities which demand a universal faculty such as the more advanced sciences, philosophy and certain forms of artistic production. ... Women regulate their actions not by the demands of universality, but by arbitrary inclinations and opinions.
(Hegel 1973: 263)
The idea that the gender of philosophers is important or even relevant to their work is a thought that runs counter to the self-image of philosophy. So, it is interesting to explore how and why feminist philosophers came to the realization that gender is a useful analytic category to apply to the history of philosophy. We can distinguish two aspects to this process although, in many cases, the two aspects merge into a single project. The first stage of realizing the importance of gender consisted of the cataloguing of the explicit misogyny of most of the canon. The second stage consisted of probing the theories of canonical philosophers in order to uncover the gender bias lurking in their supposedly universal theories. The second stage, the discovery that a philosopher's supposedly universal and objective theories were gender specific, raised the further question of whether or not the theoretical gender bias was intrinsic to the theory or extrinsic to it. Let me illustrate these points with Aristotle.

1.1 Explicit Statements of Misogyny in Philosophical Texts

There is no doubt that Aristotle's texts are misogynist; he thought that women were inferior to men and he said so explicitly. For example, to cite Cynthia Freeland's catalogue: "Aristotle says that the courage of a man lies in commanding, a woman's lies in obeying; that "matter yearns for form, as the female for the male and the ugly for the beautiful;" that women have fewer teeth than men; that a female is an incomplete male or "as it were, a deformity": which contributes only matter and not form to the generation of offspring; that in general "a woman is perhaps an inferior being"; that female characters in a tragedy will be inappropriate if they are too brave or too clever"(Freeland 1994: 145-46). However dispiriting or annoying this litany is, and whatever problems it presents to a woman studying or teaching Aristotle, it can be argued that Aristotle simply held a mistaken view about women and their capacities (as did most Athenians of his time). But, if this is so, then Aristotle's theories, or most of them, are not tarnished by his statements about women, and we can ignore them, since they are false.

I have chosen Aristotle as my example, but similar feminist critiques are available chronicling the explicit misogyny of other canonical figures like Plato and Kant. Feminist criticisms of Plato's theories stress dialogues (like the Timaeus and Laws) that characterize women as inferior to men rather than the egalitarian Republic. Kant's writings, like Aristotle's, provide the ideal target for feminist criticism because they contain both overt statements of sexism and racism, and a theoretical framework that can be interpreted along gender lines.[2]

1.2 Gendered Interpretations of Philosophical Concepts

If we consider Aristotle's theory of hylomorphism we find a connection between form and being male, and matter and being female. That is, we find that matter and form are gendered notions in Aristotle (Witt 1998). By a gendered notion I mean a notion that is connected either overtly or covertly, either explicitly or metaphorically with gender or sexual difference.[3] Furthermore, matter and form are not equal partners in Aristotle's metaphysics; form is better than matter. And since hylomorphism is the conceptual framework that underlies most of Aristotelian theory from metaphysics and philosophy of mind to biology and literary theory, it looks as if his supposedly universal and objective theories are gendered, and it looks as if his negative charactization of women tarnishes his philosophical theories.

Are Aristotle's theories intrinsically gendered and sexist, so that gender cannot be removed without altering the theories themselves? Several feminist philosophers have developed this thesis. For example, in "Woman Is Not a Rational Animal", Lynda Lange argues that Aristotle's theory of sex difference is implicated in every piece of Aristotle's metaphysical jargon, and she concludes that "it is not at all clear that it [Aristotle's theory of sex difference] can simply be cut away without any reflection on the status of the rest of the philosophy"(Harding and Hintikka 1983: 2). Elizabeth Spelman has argued that Aristotle's politicized metaphysics is reflected in his theory of soul, which, in turn, is used to justify the subordination of women in the Politics (Spelman 1983). And, finally, Susan Okin has argued that Aristotle's functionalist theory of form was devised by Aristotle in order to legitimate the political status quo in Athens, including slavery and the inequality of women (Okin 1979: ch. 4).

If these scholars are right, then Aristotle's theories are intrinsically biased against women, and it is unlikely that they can have any value for feminists beyond the project of learning about the ways in which the philosophical tradition has devalued women. Alternatively, I have argued that the suspect gender associations with Aristotelian matter and form are extrinsic tothese concepts, and therefore removable from Aristotle's theories without substantially altering them (Witt 1998). The argument that Aristotle's gender associations are not intrinsic to his concepts of matter (female) and form (male) turns on the incompatibility of the position that matter is intrinsically female, and form intrinsically male with the position that every composite substance is a unity of matter and form. If every composite substance is a complex of matter and form, then each would be a hermaphrodite, rather than a male or a female as is the case with animals. Moreoever,whatever plausibility gender associations with matter and form might have with regard to animals, is lost entirely when we consider artifacts, like shoes and beds. If intrinsic gender associations with matter and form are incompatible with Aristotle's theory of substance and extrinsic gender associations are compatible with that theory, then the principle of charity dictates that we opt for the consistent interpretation.

Sometimes, as in the case of Descartes, the feminist argument in favor of a gendered theory is subtle since, unlike Aristotle, he expresses both a personal and a theoretical committment to equality. Further, his theories are not stated using gendered notions. Yet, some feminists have argued that his theory of mind-body dualism, and his abstract characterization of reason resonate with gender implications-- on the assumption that women are emotional and bodily creatures (e.g. Scheman 1993; Bordo 1987; Lloyd 1993b, ch. 3).

1.3 Synoptic Interpretations of the Philosophical Canon

The philosophical canon can allow the luster some of its members to be tarnished by feminist criticism, just as it has weathered criticisms from analytic or continental perspectives. The most radical feminist critics, however, have urged that the canon's central philosophical norms and values, like reason and objectivity, are gendered notions. The synoptic approch considers the Western philosophical tradition as a whole, and argues that its core concepts are gendered male. But, if this is so, then the Western philosophical tradition as a whole, and the central concepts that we have inherited from it, requires critical scrutiny by feminists. Moreover, philosophy's self-image as universal and objective, rather than particular and biased, is mistaken.

Feminist synoptic interpretations of the canon take several forms. The first, exemplified by Genevieve Lloyd's Man of Reason, argues that reason and objectivity in the history of philosophy are gendered male.[4] The way that reason and objectivity are gendered male varies as philosophical theory and historical period varies, but the fact that they are gendered is a constant. From Aristotle to Hume, from Plato to Sartre, reason is associated with maleness. Therefore, the notion of reason that we have inherited, whether we are empiricists or existentialists, requires critical scrutiny.

The second form of synoptic interpretation, exemplified by Susan Bordo's The Flight to Objectivity, argues that the modern period in philosophy, and, in particular, the philosophy of Descartes, is the source of our ideals of reason and objectivity that are gendered male. In other words, this story chronicles a turn in philosophy coincident with the rise of modern science, which generated ideals of reason and objectivity that are deeply antagonistic to women and feminism.[5] Cartesian rationalism and the norms of modern science mark a decisive break with a philosophical and cultural tradition that was more accommodating of female characteristics and powers.

It is important to note that Lloyd and Bordo differ not only with regard to the historical story they tell concerning the maleness of reason, but also with regard to the way they understand that maleness. For Lloyd, the maleness of reason is symbolic and metaphorical rather than cultural or psychological. Lloyd does not intend the maleness of reason to refer to either a socially constituted gender category or a psychological orientation shared by males. "This book is not a direct study of gender identity. It seeks rather to contribute to the understanding of how the male-female distinction operates as a symbol in traditional philosophical texts, and of its interactions with explicit philosophical views of reason".[6] In understanding the maleness of reason as symbolic rather than as psychological or social, Lloyd avoids making a theoretical committment to any particular psychology of sex differences or any particular account of the social formation of gender identity. What she gains in flexibility, however, she loses in content, since it is difficult to specify exactly what metaphorical maleness is, and how it is related to psychological or social maleness. Other feminists have attempted to develop an account of how male metaphors and symbols undermine philosophical arguments (Rooney 1991).

For Bordo, however, the maleness of Cartesian reason is given both a social meaning and a psychological content. First, the social meaning of maleness: "In the seventeenth century it [the feminine orientation toward the world] was decisively purged from the dominant intellectual culture, through the Cartesian ‘rebirthing’ and restructuring of knowledge and the world as masculine"(Bordo 1987: 100). This social meaning is paired with a psychological consequence: "The ‘great Cartesian anxiety,’ although manifestly expresssed in epistemological terms, discloses itself as anxiety over separation from the organic female universe"(Bordo 1987: 5). Cartesian ‘anxiety’ is separation anxiety from mother nature; the rational norms of clarity and distinctness are read as symptoms of this anxiety.[7] Bordo's social-psychological notion of maleness while rich and explicit, provides a large target for critics because it is based on a controversial historical thesis (that the 17th century showed a marked increase in gynophobia) and a disputed psychological theory of the family (Object Relations Theory).

Luce Irigaray takes a radical stance towards the history of philosophy by trying to indicate what is suppressed and hidden in the tradition rather than cataloguing its evident "maleness". Her work, like Bordo's, makes use of psychoanalytic theory in interpreting texts and, like Lloyd's, it explores the symbolic associations of philosophical images and concepts. However, unlike Bordo and Lloyd, Irigaray uses highly unconventional methods of interpreting canonical philosophical texts in order to uncover the ways in which the feminine or sexual difference is repressed in them. For example, Irigaray uses humor and parody rather than straightforward exegesis, and she points to instabilities (contraditions) in philosophical texts as symptoms of patriarchal thinking. According to Irigaray, patriarchal thinking attempts to achieve universality by repressing sexual difference. But, the presence of contradictions or instabilities in a philosophical text is symptomatic of the failure of patriarchal thinking to contain sexual difference. For example, Irigaray might look at the argument I described above for considering gender associations with form and matter in Aristotle to be extrinsic, rather than intrinsic, to those concepts, and argue that the fact that Aristotle's hylomorphism as a universal theory is incompatible with gender associations is a symptom of patriarchal thinking rather than evidence that the proposed interpretation is mistaken.[8]

Despite their different historical stories, and the different ways that they understand the maleness of reason, each of these panoramic visions of the history of philosophy deliver the same moral, which is that the central norms that inform our philosophical culture today are gendered male.[9] Hence, these synoptic narratives of the philosophical tradition provide historical justifications for feminist philosophers who are critical of our central philosophical norms of reason and objectivity. Does the feminist synoptic critical reading of the history of philosophy justify either the conclusion that traditional conceptions of reason ought to be flat-out rejected by feminists or the conclusion that traditional conceptions of reason ought to be subjected to critical scrutiny?

Even if feminist historical arguments are successful in showing that philosophical norms like reason and objectivity are gendered male, this conclusion does not justify a flat-out rejection of either traditional philosophy or its norms of reason and objectivity (Witt 1993). Recall the distinction introduced above between intrinsically and extrinsically gendered notions. An intrinsically gendered notion is one that necessarily carries implications regarding gender, i.e., if one were to cancel all implications concerning gender, one would be left with a different notion than the original. In contrast, an extrinsically gendered notion typically does carry implications concerning gender, but not necessarily so. If the maleness of reason is extrinsic to the traditional concept of reason, then the historical fact that it was a gendered notion does not justify or require its rejection by feminists. If on the other hand, it can be shown that the maleness of reason is intrinsic to it, it still does not follow that reason ought to be rejected by feminists. For, the idea the reason is intrinsically male-biased would justify a rejection of it only if it ought to be other than it is. So, what needs to be argued is that reason and objectivity would be different, and better, if they were not gendered male, but were gender-neutral, gender-inclusive or female. But, if feminist philosophers develop this argument, which they need to buttress the historical argument, then they are reconceptualizing traditional notions of reason and objectivity rather than rejecting them.

Even though the work that feminist philosophers have done to show the ways in which traditional conceptions of reason and objectivity are associated with maleness falls short of justifying their rejection, their work has been valuable in two respects. First, it has established that gender is associated with the central norms of philosophy, a conclusion that warrants attention from anyone attempting to understand our philosophical tradition. Second, the historical studies raise questions about reason and objectivity that are valuable areas of inquiry for contemporary philosophers.

2. Feminist Revisions of the History of Philosophy

These women are not women on the fringes of philosophy, but philosophers on the fringes of history.
---Mary Ellen Waithe

Feminist canon revision is most distinctive, and most radical, in its retrieval of women philosophers for the historical record, and in its placement of women in the canon of great philosophers. It is a distinctive project because there is no comparable activity undertaken by other contemporary philosophical movements, for whom canon creation has been largely a process of selection from an already established list of male philosophers. It is a radical project because by uncovering a history of women philosophers, it has destroyed the alienating myth that philosophy was, and by implication is or ought to be, a male preserve.

In A History of Women Philosophers Mary Ellen Waithe has documented at least 16 women philosophers in the classical world, 17 women philosophers from 500-1600, and over 30 from 1600-1900.

And, in the recent feminist series Re-reading the Canon three of the fourteen canonical philosophers are women: Mary Wollstonecraft, Hannah Arendt and Simone de Beauvoir. What is crucial to understand is that none of the three is canonical--if by that you mean included in the history of philosophy as it is told in philosophy department curricula, in histories of philosophy, and in scholarly writing.

Indeed, The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, published in 1967, which contains articles on over 900 philosophers, does not include an entry for any of them. Moreover, if the index is to be believed, de Beauvoir and Wollstonecraft are not mentioned at all in any article, and Hannah Arendt merits a single mention in an article on "Authority". Far from being canonical, these women philosophers are scarcely even marginal, warranting perhaps a passing reference in a survey of existentialism or political philosophy, but little more.[10] Hence, the feminist series Re-reading the Canon is not only engaged in a critical re-reading of canonical figures like Plato and Hegel, but is also, by fiat, changing the contours of the canon.

The project of retrieving women philosophers has a paradoxical relationship with contemporary feminist theory, however. On the one hand, it is clearly a feminist project; its originators were interested in establishing that women have been philosophers throughout the history of the discipline despite their routine omission from standard histories and encyclopedias of philosophy. However, the newly -recovered women philosophers suggest that there is little overlap among three groups: women philosophers, feminine philosophers and feminist philosophers. For most of the newly discovered women philosophers were not feminist thinkers nor did they write philosophy in a feminine voice, different from their male counterparts. Indeed, their breadth of philosophical interests is comparable to that of male philosophers although their domain of application sometimes differs. In her introduction to A History of Women Philosophers Mary Ellen Waithe comments "If we except the Pythagorean women, we find little differences in the ways men and women did philosophy. Both have been concerned with ethics, metaphysics, cosmology, epistemology and other areas of philosophic inquiry"(Waithe 1987-1991 Vol. 1: xxi). And another editor, Mary Warnock, comments "In the end, I have not found any clear "voice" shared by women philosophers (Warnock 1996: xlvii). The women philosophers restored to the tradition by feminist hands are not all proto-feminists nor do they speak in a uniform, and different, voice from their male peers.

Similarly, women philosophers who are candidates for initiation into the philosophical canon--like Mary Wollstonecraft, Hannah Arendt and Simone de Beauvoir--are a diverse crew. According to Elizabeth Young-Bruehl "That Hannah Arendt should have become a provocative subject for feminists is startling" presumably because of Arendt's explicit criticism of feminism. And while Wollstonecraft and de Beauvoir were both feminists, they share neither a common philosophical voice nor common philosophical principles. In The Vindication of the Right's of Women Wollstonecraft argued for the education of women using Enlightenment principles, while Beauvoir's The Second Sex reflects her marxist and existentialist roots.

The diversity of women philosophers raises the question why their recovery or re-valuation is an important project for contemporary feminist theory. What the retrieval of women philosophers, and their inclusion in the philosophical canon has done is to challenge the myth that there are no women in the history of philosophy and the fallback position that if there are any women philosophers, they are unimportant. Lovers of wisdom that we all are, we all benefit from the correction of these mistaken beliefs. Moreover, as feminists, we are interested in correcting the effects of discrimination against women philosophers, who were written out of history, unfairly, because of their gender not their philosophical ideas.

However, what is really at issue is not philosophy's past, but its present; its self-image as male. That self-image is created and maintained in part by a tacit historical justification. It is a damaging self-image for women philosophers today, and for women who aspire to be philosophers. The real significance of uncovering the presence of women in our history, and in placing women in our canon is the effect that has on the way we think about the "us" of philosophy.

3. Feminist Appropriation of Canonical Philosophers

Feminist philosophers have also changed the history of philosophy by appropriating its ideas for feminist purposes. From the perspective of negative canon formation, the history of philosophy is a resource only in so far as it describes the theories and thinkers that were most deeply mistaken about women. Other feminist historians of philosophy have found important resources for feminism in canonical philosophers. Indeed, they have found valuable concepts even in the worst offenders of the negative canon, like Aristotle and Descartes.

For example, in The Fragility of Goodness Martha Nussbaum has described the virtues of an Aristotelian ethics with its emphasis on the importance of concrete context, emotion and care for others in an ethical life (Nussbaum 1986). And Marcia Homiak has argued that Aristotle's rational ideal, far from being antithetical to feminists, actually captures some of feminism's deepest ethical insights (Homiak 1993). With regard to Descartes, Margaret Atherton has argued that his concept of reason was interpreted in egalitarian rather than masculinist terms by several women philosophers of the 18th century, and was used in their arguments for equal education for women.[11]

Other feminists have urged the reconsideration of the views of canonical figures, like Hume and Dewey, who have played only a minor role in the negative feminist canon. For example, Annette Baier has argued at length for the value of a Humean perspective in both epistemology and in ethics for feminist theory (Baier 1987; Baier 1993). And, in Pragmatism and Feminism Charlene Seigfried argues for the value of pragmatism for feminism; a position also taken by Richard Rorty (Seigfried 1996; Rorty 1991).

It is interesting to note that some of the very same philosophers who were cast as the villains of the negative canon are also mined by feminist theorists for useful ideas. Indeed, it is likely that every philosopher, from Plato to Nietzsche, who has been condemned to the negative canon also appears in some feminist's positive canon. This is perplexing. After all, if feminists evaluate canonical texts so differently, it raises questions about the coherence of feminist interpretations of texts. Is Aristotle a feminist hero or villain? Are Descartes' ideas dangerous for feminists or useful to them? If feminists have argued both positions, we begin to suspect that there is no such thing as a feminist interpretation of a philosopher. And this might lead us to wonder about the coherence and unity of the project of feminist canon revision.

Why is it that feminist philosophers have reached different, and even sometimes incompatible interpretations of the history of philosophy? In my view, the multiple and contrary readings of the philosophical canon by feminists reflects the contested nature of the "us" of contemporary feminism. The fact that feminist interpretations of canonical figures is diverse reflects, and is a part of, on-going debates within feminism over its identity and self-image. Disagreements among feminist historians of philosophy over the value of canonical philosophers, and the appropriate categories to use to interpret them, are, in the final analysis, the result of debate within feminist philosophy over what feminism is, and what is theoretical committments should be, and what its core values are.


Comprehensive Bibliography

Supplementary Document:
Bibliography of Feminist Philosophers Writing about the History of Philosophy [by Abigail Gosselin]


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

feminism, approaches to | feminism, history of

Copyright © 2000
Charlotte Witt
University of New Hampshire

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