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Intersections Between Analytic and Continental Feminism

Analytic and continental approaches to feminism intersect at three points at least. Both approaches investigate the ideas of sex and gender; both are concerned with issues of justice; and both are interested in the possible contribution of psychoanalytic perspectives to feminist interests.

1. Ideas of Sex and Gender: The Analytic Tradition

In analytic philosophy, investigation of the ideas of sex and gender has focused on the ontological and linguistic status of these categories. Following a line of thought in the philosophy of race, some feminists question whether the categories of sex and gender are coherent. K. Anthony Appiah (1996) argues that racial ascriptions are problematic whether one adopts an ideational or a referential theory of language. According to an ideational theory, we learn what a word like ‘race’ means when we learn the rules for applying it. The theory supposes that, while different people can possess some different beliefs about race, they share certain criterial beliefs and these serve to define the concept. A strict ideational theory requires that all the criterial beliefs be satisfied in the correct application of the concept. The beliefs, in other words, must be individually necessary and jointly sufficient. Yet, as Appiah insists, there is no set of criterial beliefs that satisfies this condition in the case of race. Suppose the set is comprised by the beliefs (1) that people with very different skin colors are always of different races and (2) that one's race is determined by the race of one's parents. Neither of these beliefs is necessary to a particular racial ascription since (not-1) the so-called black race includes individuals of strikingly different colors and (not-2) one's parents may themselves belong to different so-called races; because in the United States, the one-drop rule has meant that one is black if any of one's ancestors are black, one can be black even though one or, presumably, even both of one's parents are white. Nor are the two beliefs sufficient together to define race since they can conflict: one may be of a different color than one's parents even if they themselves are of the same color; and one can be the same color as one's parents although they are defined as belonging to different races.

Suppose we loosen the theory so that race has only to satisfy a good number of our criterial beliefs. In this case, we shall be able to retain the concept of race only by allowing for a vagueness and even confusion in what we mean by it. In order to retain a concept of race despite this problem, Lucius Outlaw (1995) has suggested that we view race as a cluster concept. On this definition, we can divide the elements of race into heritable physical characteristics, shared practices, linked histories and traditions and, finally “a common site of origin which accounts, in significant part, for the shared physical features.” If individuals share these groups of features in “a limited number of patterned combinations,” then what is required for the constitution of a race is “necessarily one feature,” for example, heritable physical characteristics “plus several others,” for example, linked histories and a common site or origin (p. 101, note 29). Yet, suppose, for example, that a South African of mostly Dutch ancestry and a South African of mostly Xhosan ancestry share certain heritable physical characteristics. They are both large, possess curly hair and share certain other morphological features. Further they share a history, although at least some their ancestors hold different places in that history and they share a common origin in the region of South Africa. Are they then members of the same race? Suppose a pinkish individual shares practices, traditions, and a common site of origin with people whose skin is tawny. Is he or she of the same race as they? Even if we can answer these questions, the definition still runs into the problem of conflicting beliefs. Sometimes in applying the term we will give priority to ancestry in spite of color (as in the one-drop rule) and sometimes we will give priority to color in spite of a mixed ancestry.

Similar consequences follow from a referential theory of language. On this view, race is whatever in the world corresponds to or causes our talk of race. But, here, scientists have come up either completely empty handed, with regard to racial genes for example (Appiah 1996, 72-74) or with very little: recent research correlates certain short segments of DNA known as markers with broad geographical groups that sometimes but not always correspond with the groups that count socially as races. Furthermore, the long history of population mixing between people from different continents (for both conquest and other reasons) means that we need to select a necessarily arbitrary date for linking markers with groups; the date currently in use is 1492.

What if we transfer this analysis to categories of sex and gender? We can begin by looking at sex. On a strict ideational theory, when we speak of different sexes we should have a definitive set of criterial beliefs that define the concept and its application. But what are the beliefs that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for the ascription of sex? State courts have sometimes held that the criterion for belonging to a specific sex is the possession of either XX or XY chromosomes. Thus, courts in Kansas and Texas have denied the validity of marriages between men and male-to-female transsexuals on the grounds that these marriages violate the states’ prohibition against same-sex marriages (Kansas Supreme Court 2002). Yet, courts in other states and countries have defined sex differently, in terms of anatomy, and the surgical practice of a great many hospitals seems to agree. Infants born with ambiguous genitalia are often assigned a sex, not according to their chromosomes, but according to the shape and size of their genitals and the prospects for surgically remodeling them to correspond to a “normal” male or a female appearance (see, for example, Kessler (2000), 27). We seem unclear, then, as to which belief about sex is individually necessary. Is it the one that equates sex with chromosomes or the one that equates it with anatomy? Nor are the two criteria sufficient together since they can conflict. To take just one example: individuals with XY chromosomes and a condition called androgen insensitivity syndrome that makes their bodies insensitive to testosterone can be what Natalie Angier calls “mama mia women,” women whose tall stature, thick hair and luminous complexions often make them super models (Angier 2000, 34).

A similar problem seems to hold for gender. Suppose that we define gender as a set of stereotypical behaviors and roles and claim (1) that people with very different sets of behaviors are of different genders and (2) that one's gender is determined by one's role in the bearing and rearing of children. A strict ideational theory will require beliefs about gender that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient. Yet, if neither of the beliefs just stated is individually necessary since (not-1) the so-called feminine gender includes individuals of strikingly different behaviors and (not-2) one's role in bearing and rearing children can be quite complex: one may bear but not raise the children; not bear but raise them, do neither or both. Nor, then, will the ideas be jointly sufficient: one may be socially defined as a woman although one engages in “masculine” behaviors and has no role in the raising of one's children. Similar ambiguities will arise for any set of beliefs thought to be individually necessary and jointly sufficient for gender. Defining women in terms of a set of attitudes toward marriage, careers, and child rearing will inevitably exclude some so-called women while including some so-called men.

At issue here are what Sally Haslanger calls the commonality and normativity problems (2000, 37) which are often grouped as issues in intersectionality. In the first place, it may be that women hold no feature in common. In the second place, if we look for commonalities that allow for a useful employment of the category of women we may not only overlook differences between so-called women but also define certain women out of the category. Thus, if feminists ignore differences in women due to race and class, for example, they risk overgeneralizing from the experiences of white, middle-class American and European women, marginalizing others and militating against the possibility of meeting their very different concerns. As Kimberlie Crenshaw explains, this is a problem not only for feminism but for antiracism as well:

Among the most troubling political consequences of the failure of antiracist and feminist discourses to address the intersections of race and gender is the fact that, to the extent they can forward the interests of “people of color” and “women,” respectively, one analysis often implicitly denies the validity of the other. The failure of feminism to interrogate race means that the resistance strategies of feminism will often replicate and reinforce the subordination of people of color, and the failure of antiracism to interrogate patriarchy means that antiracism will frequently reproduce the subordination of women. (Crenshaw 1991, 1252).

If we look instead to a referential theory of language, we shall have to maintain that the meaning of women is whatever it is that the members of the extension have in common. In examining the ideational theory, we have already raised some problems with an attempt to refer gender back to a set of common behaviors or roles. If the referential account maintains that the meaning of gender is whatever it is that the members of the extension have in common, there seems to be no social commonality given the differences in race, class, individuality and so on. There also seems to be no way to get from the biological level of chromosomes, hormones or brain functions to the characteristics we associate with gender. Mama mia women and other intersexuals indicate the difficulty in correlating gender with sex chromosomes and feminists such as Anne Fausto-Sterling have raised problems with attempts to correlate ambition or aggressiveness with “male” hormones or math ability with the shape of the corpus callosum.

Take the latter apparent correlation. In the first place, the corpus callosum is a part of the brain that is very difficult to isolate, divide or measure in ways that could lead to meaningful comparisons between brains. In the second place, meta-analyses that pool the data from a large number of smaller studies find “no gender difference in either absolute or relative size or shape of the CC as a whole or of the splenium (Fausto-Sterling 2000, 131–135). Finally, whatever differences are found or thought to be part of the corpus callosums of men and women seem to turn up in adults and older children, rather than in young children. Hence, it remains unclear how we ought to measure the relative effects of biology and environmental causes. Since we know that the brain continues to develop through a human life, there are at least two alternatives to the claim that differences in the brain cause differences in gender: first, the lived experiences of men and women could help shape their brains and do so in societies already differentiated by gender or, second, brain structure and culturally specific gender differences might interrelate in some as yet unraveled way. In either case, a referential theory of language that claims that we know what a gender is when we know what in the world corresponds to or causes our talk of gender would seem to be in trouble. Not only do we not know what corresponds to or causes or talk of gender; it may well be that our talk of gender causes differences in the world.

Not all analytic feminists agree with all parts of this sort of analysis. Naomi Zack explicitly rejects the analogy between race and gender: "While there are genes for morphology perceived or judged to be racial, such as hair texture and skin color, there are no chromosomal markers for black race or white race (or any other race) no genes for race per se, and, indeed, nothing which is analogous to XY, XX, or to any of the borderline sexual-type combinations of X and Y, for instances of mixed race (1997, 37). Others hold open the possibility of providing a definition of gender that can be sensitive to commonality and normativity problems. Haslanger, for example, suggests that although the unity that is meant to encompass women as part of the same definition may be overly generalized or badly characterized, it may nonetheless mark a real unity. Taking what she calls a materialist position, she argues that if gender cannot be defined in terms of intrinsic or psychological characteristics common to members of a particular gender, it can nonetheless be defined “in terms of how one is socially positioned, where this is a function of, e.g., how one is viewed, how one is treated, and how one's life is structured socially, legally, and economically.” On this account, gender categories represent hierarchical relations in which one group maintains a subordinate relation to another and the difference between the two groups is marked by “sexual difference.” Thus:

S is a woman iffdf S is systematically subordinated along some dimension (economic, legal, political, social, etc.) and S is “marked” as a target for this treatment by observed or imagined bodily features presumed to be evidence of a female's biological role in reproduction.


S is a man iffdf S is systematically privileged along some dimension (economic, legal, political, social, etc.) and S is “marked” as a target for this treatment by observed or imagined bodily features presumed to be evidence of a male's biological role in reproduction (Haslanger 2000, 38).

The merit of these definitions, Haslanger thinks, is that they allow for differences in the sorts of subordination different women can suffer in different cultures, historical periods, classes and races at the same time that they allow for the visibility or imagined visibility of sex and gender. If, in contrast, we were to employ difficulties in the category of women to deny any unity in observed or imagined bodily features, it would be unclear how or who might continue feminist struggles against gender oppression. The key, then, according to Haslanger, is to define women in such a way that the definition can be sensitive to differences between women while allowing them to work towards common goals.

2. Ideas of Sex and Gender: The Continental Tradition

Feminists who appeal to the resources of the Continental tradition are also concerned with the status of the category of women. Ever since Simone de Beauvoir (1953), defined women as the “Other”, French feminists have pursued a complex train of thought with regard to what this characterization entails. De Beauvoir's starting point is philosophy's definition of the subject, a definition that De Beauvoir thinks generalizes from the experiences and concerns of men. If women are the “other” of men, they are non-subjects who, instead of acting, wait for the actions of authentic subjects, namely men. Luce Iragaray and Julia Kristeva argue that, consequently, we can define what the feminine gender is only in terms of the gender it is not. Men are subjects of discourse and agents of history. Women are whatever is not that: the excluded gender. “Their exclusion is internal to an order from which nothing escapes: the order of (man's) discourse,” Iragaray writes. “To the objection that this discourse is perhaps not all there is, the response will be that it is women who are ‘not-all’”(Iragaray 1985, 88). “A woman cannot be,” according to Kristeva; “it is something which does not even belong in the order of being” (Kristeva 1981, 137). For her part, another French feminist, Monique Wittig looks to a materialist analysis similar to Haslanger's. Taking up the analysis of race provided by Collette Guilllaumin, one that sees it as an “imaginary formation,” she makes the same point about sex: both are the results of a mythic construction “which reinterprets physical features (in themselves as neutral as any others but marked by the social system) through the network of relationships in which they are perceived. (They are seen black, therefore they are black; they are seen as women, therefore, they are women. But before being seen that way, they first had to be made that way.)” (1997, 266).

What does it mean that they are “made that way?” Analyses in the Continental tradition often combine De Beauvoir with Michel Foucault's analysis of power. For Foucault, the most important site of power does not lie in the state or economy but, instead, in everyday social practices such as social work, medicine and psychiatry, in scientific and social scientific disciplines that type individuals and create categories of identity, and in institutions such as prisons, schools and hospitals. Such power is productive: social institutions and practices create modern identities such as homosexuals, “blacks,” and manic-depressives and it enforces distinctions between the normal and the abnormal. Gender identity falls under this rubric. Whereas all cultures and societies have distinguished between men and women, they have not done so in the same way. Rather, pursuing a Foucaultian analysis, Denise Riley (1988) has tried to show the different ways different historical eras have constructed women. The discourse of medieval theology, for example, constructs women as bodies only, whose souls remain ungendered and therefore capable of divine grace. The eighteenth century, however, constructs them as wholly, even in their souls, parts of the natural world while the nineteenth century makes them part of a new social world, distinct from a political world. Riley's point is not merely that conceptions of women change but that the substratum changes. Medieval women and nineteenth century women are distinct entities because of the complexes of discourse and disciplinary practices in which they are constructed.

Other feminists in the Continental tradition suggest that the most basic disciplinary practice in this regard is that of a compulsory heterosexuality. If women are the other of men, then they exist only in relation to men, in “a specific social relation called servitude,” according to Wittig (1997, 271). Hence, she thinks one can escape being a woman by refusing that relation to a man, in effect, by being a lesbian. Judith Butler, on the other hand, thinks that the discourse of compulsory heterosexuality cuts deeper into identity. It divides human populations into two genders that are in turn supposed to be connected to two sexes with two directions of sexual desire. Thus, one is a man with a male body and a desire for women or one is a woman with a female body and a desire for men. No other match-ups constitute intelligible identities. “The heterosexualization of desire,” she writes, “requires and institutes the production of discrete and asymmetrical oppositions between ‘feminine’ and ‘masculine,’ where these are understood as expressive attributes of ‘male’ and ‘female.’”(1990, 17).

3. Possibilities for Social Justice: The Continental Tradition

As Haslanger's definitions of gender already indicate, feminists in both analytic and Continental traditions are concerned with possibilities for social justice. Indeed, Martha Nussbaum, working from a largely Anglo-American perspective and Nancy Fraser, working from a largely German and French one, have raised similar questions with regard to the sort of Foucaultian feminist analysis in which Riley and others are engaged: first, does Foucault's conception of power allow for important distinctions between legitimate and illegitimate exercises of power and, hence, between points or directions of resistance; second, does this conception of power eliminate capacities of critical reflection?

Foucaultians are skeptical of the Enlightenment notions of agency and critical reflection to which Marxists and other social critics have traditionally appealed in efforts to overcome oppression. If the subject, as a homosexual or woman for example, is already an effect of discourses of power, it cannot serve as the starting point for emancipatory agency. The disciplinary practices and institutions that construct identifiable subjects eliminate other possibilities and the subjects who are meant to act as emancipatory agents are therefore already the result of an exclusionary and suspect power. Instead of appealing to critical agency, then, Foucault looks to a genealogical analysis that suspends the project of distinguishing between legitimate and illegitimate operations of power and seeks, instead, simply to trace them, to trace, for example, the route by which we are constituted as subjects. Some feminists in this tradition contend, however, that these subject-producing discursive practices are on going. Construction is not a one-time affair but continues so that we are produced and reproduced as subjects, females, women and so on. This constant production and reproduction of ourselves serves Butler as the opening to what she calls resignifications. While we cannot free ourselves of the exclusionary identities we are, we can engage in “resignification, redeployment, subversive citation from within, and interruption and inadvertent convergences with other [power/discourse] networks” (1995, 135).

Fraser (1989) appreciates the Foucaultian conception of power and its recognition of the “capillaries” of power in social practices, institutions and disciplinary discourses. Nevertheless, she is concerned with its lack of normative standards, a lack, she thinks carries over to Butler's conception of resignification. “Why,” she asks, “is resignification good? Can’t there be bad (oppressive, reactionary) resignifications?” (215). If all subjectivity is a construction of power/discourse networks, why should we not simply be content with the subjects that our current disciplinary practices enforce? Or, if some resignifications are good, which ones? How do we determine which sort we should endorse? Why not, Nussbaum echoes Fraser, “engage in the subversive performances of making fun of feminist remarks in class, or ripping down the posters of the lesbian and gay law student's association.” As she continues, “These things happen. They are parodic and subversive. Why then aren't they daring and good?” (Nussbaum 1999a, 42).

Fraser (1997, 219) has suggested that in order to respond to objections of this general kind, a feminism inspired by Foucault might integrate its emphasis on social construction with an analysis that allows for both social criticism and “utopian hope”. What is required is, first, a move beyond a simply deconstructive anti-essentialism (1997a, 183), an account of the structural deformations of liberal institutions and practices of justice. Fraser gestures toward a Habermasian account, one that looks to procedures for rationally justifying norms and can use rationally justified principles as a foothold for social criticism. Second, Fraser calls for articulating a vision of the future that is “sufficiently compelling to persuade other women – and men – to reinterpret their interests.” (1997, 218). Part of this model involves overcoming constructed gender oppositions between breadwinning and care giving work and, moreover, easing the strain of both. “The trick,” Fraser contends, “is to imagine a social world in which citizens’ lives integrate wage earning, care giving, community activism, political participations, and involvement in the associational life of civil society – while also leaving time for some fun …. Unless we are guided by his vision now, we will never get any closer to achieving it.

4. Possibilities for Social Justice: The Analytic Tradition

Nussbaum's critique is more adamant. She thinks a postmodern feminism is a self-involved one that needs to be rejected in favor of the kind of theoretical and practical work that can change laws, feed the hungry, and oppose oppressive practices and institutions. To this end, she looks to Amartya Sen's development of Rawlsian liberalism into what she calls the human capabilities approach. Following Rawls, this approach focuses on the distribution of resources and opportunities within a country or political entity. It adds to Rawls’ view, first, the question of what individuals’ needs for resources are and, second, the question of how they are able to convert these resources into human functioning (Nussbaum 1999, 34). By human functioning, Nussbaum means both the basic functioning without which we would not regard a life as human or fully human and the less basic functioning without which we would not regard a human life as flourishing. The “we” here is not meant to be ethnocentric. The idea is, rather, that a just society provides individuals with the capabilities for human functioning where the idea of a basic and flourishing functioning is one to which people from different traditions with different conceptions of the good could agree as necessary to the pursuit of their conception.

This idea provides a checklist against which to measure forms of oppression and discrimination in particular countries. Thus, inequalities based on gender hierarchies as well as practices such as female genital mutilation will be precluded and a defense of such practices as part of the cultural tradition will not work. If cultural tradition confines women to the house, even if widowed and without means of support, then such practices are to be condemned as violating capabilities for even basic functioning. Indeed, if egregious practices such as female genital mutilation and female confinement violate capabilities for life, nutrition and bodily integrity, all inequalities based on gender hierarchies, in Nussbaum's view, undermine capabilities for self-respect and emotional development that are part of human functioning.

To look to human capabilities is not to look to actual functioning. Nussbaum does not deny that one might choose a life of celibacy, for instance. The human capabilities approach argues, instead, that justice requires the capability for sexual pleasure so that if one chooses celibacy, this choice is really a choice. As Nussbaum writes, “A person who has opportunities for play can always choose a workaholic lifeÉthere is a great difference between that chosen life and a life constrained by insufficient maximum hour protections and/or the “double day” that makes women in many parts of the world unable to play.” (1999, 44). Ultimately, then, her concerns are the same as Fraser's: that a postmodern focus on genealogy and resignification cannot do the work of undoing the social, political and economic discrimination that women suffer in far too many cultures and countries.

5. The Appropriation of Psychoanalytic Theory: The Analytic Tradition

A third intersection between analytic and continental approaches in feminism occurs with their joint appropriation of Freudian psychoanalysis. While English-speaking feminists and those that are associated with them have drawn on work that revises Freud in the direction of object-relations theory, French-speaking feminists and the English-speaking feminists who follow them have by and large focused on revising Freud in terms of Lacan. Some analytic feminists have looked to the work of psychologist, Nancy Chodorow who follows object-relations theory in seeing the breast, and by extension, the mother, as the most important object for the infant. In addition, the circumstance that it is women that typically do the work of mothering leads to importantly different consequences for little boys and little girls. Mothers experience their daughters as identical to themselves and stress these similarities in their nurturing activities. Hence, their daughters grow up in the context of an identifying relationship with their primary caregiver. In contrast, mothers experience their sons as different from themselves and emphasize these differences in their care giving. Boys therefore grow into their gender identity by accepting their differences from their primary caregiver and by associating themselves with a largely absent father. As Chodorow writes, “Because they are parented by a person of the same gender … girls come to experience themselves as less differentiated than boys, as more continuous with and related to the external object world, and as differently oriented to their inner object-world as well.” (Chodorow 1999, 167). These differences in their relation to their primary care giver have other implications as well. As schoolchildren, girls excel in literature while schoolboys excel in mathematics and science; girls are more likely to rely on adults to settle disputes and to take relationships more seriously than competition while boys focus on more complex, competitive and rule-governed games. College-age boys fear attachment and a loss of autonomy while college-age girls fear success and a loss of connection. As adults, women tend to value relationships over independence and to devote themselves to the care of others; in contrast, men tend to value their autonomy and to focus on questions of rights and duties over emotions and sensitivity to others.

Following this line of thought, “difference feminism” emphasizes women's concern with issues of relationship, their sensitivity to the particulars of individual circumstances, and their interest in the narrative of concrete individual lives. It thus stresses women's orientation to what Carol Gilligan calls an ethics of care as opposed to an ethics of justice (Gilligan 1982). An ethics of justice concerns itself with guaranteeing individual rights and with adjudications of conflicts between rights based on general principles of liberty and equality. In contrast, an ethics of care is sensitive to the particular case and circumstances, to the specificity of people's lives and life-stories, and to the needs of concrete rather than generalized others (Benhabib 1987). In addition it focuses on the interdependence of people rather than on their individual rights, on possibilities for empathy rather than those of autonomous decision-making (Held 1995), and, as Nell Noddings (1995) stresses, on the our capacity for fulfillment in our commitment to others rather than on our need to justify our actions.

Difference feminists also urge a form of the politics that understands women's gender identity as a source of strength. Thus, Patricia Hill Collins delineates the way community activism can issue from Black women's and especially Black mothers’ experiences of caring. She criticizes the image of super-strong African-American mothers insofar as it obscures the costs of caring for Black women. Yet she also sees Black motherhood as an important model for “ a more generalized ethic of caring and personal accountability.” (Collins 1995, 133). Black communities typically emphasize not only the responsibility of “bloodmothers” for their own children but also of what Collins calls othermothers — grandmothers, sisters, aunts, neighbors and “fictive mothers” who view the children of the community as “our” children (1995, 131). Out of these networks of community childcare develop community organizations, advocacy groups and the like. Other feminists use the value of caring to demand pregnancy and maternity leaves, childcare facilities on workplace grounds, flexible schedules, classroom attention to the needs of girls, including single-sex education if necessary, and career guidance for girls.

6. The Appropriation of Psychoanalytic Theory: The Continental Tradition

What about Continental approaches to psychoanalytic theory? Feminists such as Jacqueline Rose, Juliet Mitchell, Elizabeth Grosz and Jeanne L. Schroeder begin with Lacan's reinterpretation of Freud and go in a different direction. Crucial here is the division of the real, the imaginary and the symbolic. The real is that world that we feel we have lost when we begin to mediate our experience through imagery or language; it is the world of unity with the other or the mother figure (which Continentally oriented feminists often write as (M)Other to emphasize that it is a position of the other from the point of view of the child; typically this position is taken by women.) The imaginary signals the stage of mirror images when the child recognizes itself by seeing itself reflected in the mother. At this stage the infant does not recognize itself as a subject but simply as not-Mother. Only with the transition to the symbolic that corresponds to Freud's Oedipal phase does the child understand itself as a subject.

Schroeder explains the symbolic order by way of Lacan's delineation of three categories of longing that correspond to the three orders of real, imaginary and symbolic: these are, respectively, need, demand, and desire (Schroeder 1998, 73). In the first stage the infant experiences only need whereas in the second stage, it recognizes that it sometimes lacks what it needs and therefore demands it. This demand is part of the retrospective idea in the imaginary that one was once in unity with the (M)Other and is now not so. Demand is not yet conscious language but rather a call to the Other who has what it demands. At the same time, demand signals insecurity: each time that a demand is not immediately gratified, the question arises as to whether the mother loves the infant (1998, 75). Desire is what emerges: “The baby's need can be met, its demand responded to, but its desire only exists because of the initial failure of satisfaction. Desire persists as an effect of a primordial absence and it therefore indicates that, in this area, there is something fundamentally impossible about satisfaction itself” (Mitchell 1985, 6). What the infant desires, according to Grosz's account of Lacan, is to be desired: “Desire is a fundamental lack, a hole in being that can satisfied only by one “thing” – another('s) desire. Each self-conscious subject desires the desire of the other as its object. Its desire is to be desired by the other, its counterpart” (Grosz 1990, 64).

The symbolic order is reached in desire. Lacanian feminists note that Lacan reconstructs this process from the point of view of the son. The child realizes that he is not the object of the mother's desire, that the mother desires the father or whatever person fulfills the role of the father. Moreover, if the mother desires the father, she must desire something he has; this object of desire, Lacan calls the phallus. Having the phallus is the signifier of being a subject. As part of the symbolic order, however, the phallus cannot be seen; instead, the child looks at anatomical fathers and marks how they differ from anatomical mothers, conflating the phallus with the penis. The conflation here is two-fold. First, the child conflates the symbolic phallus with the order of the real he both desires and fears in the imaginary order as a return to unity and, as he sees it, a swallowing up of himself in the mother. Second, the child conflates the real phallus with the physical penis. The father is a subject because of the mother's desire and this desire depends upon his having a penis.

The price the father extracts for the son's becoming a subject is castration. Schroeder explains:

Since the Child imagines that he once had the Phallus (i.e., wholeness, union with the Mother) prior to the mirror stage, he must retroactively explain its loss, but in a way that can deny his loss. He tells himself that the Father threatened to take away the Phallus which the male child conflates with his penis. The Father and son reached an agreement that if the son submitted to castration (the Law of the Father) the Name of the Father will recompense him by allowing him to adopt the Father's name and marry another woman. The son would then be recognized as a speaking subject, a member of the symbolic community, and thereby regain his wholeness. (Schroeder, 1998, 83)

What about the daughter? Women enter this pact between father and son as objects of exchange: the son exchanges his mother for another woman. Grosz writes, “The girl has quickly learned that she does not have the phallus, nor the power it signifies. She comes to accept, not without resistance, her socially designated role as subordinate to the possessor of the phallus, and through her acceptance, she comes to occupy the passive, dependent position expected of women in patriarchy” (1990, 69). Moreover, if men have the phallus, women are the phallus, the object of desire. Men become speaking subjects through the threat of their symbolic castration while women become the objects of exchange. Consequently, any move by women to overturn the terms of their objectification threatens the entire symbolic order. By the same logic, when women speak they do so only by taking up the masculine position (Cornell 1992, 175).

Critics of difference feminism in the English speaking world have argued that it simply reinforces stereotypes about women and their presumed special needs, restricting women to traditional roles and increasing the difficulty of escaping them. As working mothers, women are expected to put their families first in a way that men are not and to give up on high-paying but demanding jobs for the sake of their children. Indeed, as college students they are often motivated to train in the first place for the sort of career that allows them to take time off to bear and rear children. Such actions mean that they typically have less power within the family to make decisions about either their own lives or the lives of their families. Moreover, these circumstances can put them at a disadvantage in no-fault divorce settlements where their contributions to the family cannot be easily measured in monetary terms (Okin 1989, Chapter 7). Indeed, to the extent that stressing gender difference leads to policies that increase the costs of hiring women, trap them at the lower end of the wage scale, and abandon them in divorce settlements, difference feminism arguably renders women more rather than less vulnerable.

A similar stasis seems to arise from Lacanian feminism at least to the extent that it can make solutions to sexism seem overwhelmingly difficult. Lacanian feminists try to stress the space that Lacan opens up for overturning sexual categories. Iragaray is even notable as the representative of a French difference feminism insofar as she is interested in the concept of the feminine that is excluded by a discourse in which women are the other of men. Yet, what seems to be required is nothing less than an overturning of the symbolic order, of language itself.

For this reason, we might rather trace a line of resistance that runs from the challenge to an uncritical conception of sex and gender to the contributions to feminism by liberalism and critical theory. Arguments by analytic philosophers of language and Continental Foucaultians show us that we should not take up the categories of sex and gender uncritically. Even if we ultimately justify their employment, our use of them remains critically informed by recognition of the limits of the terms and the overgeneralizations and exclusions they can foster. Arguments by liberals and critical theorists demand that we not become so involved in the complexities of language that we ignore the poverty and oppression that those identified as women suffer in too many countries. We therefore need action on two fronts: a constant questioning of the gender divisions we have made and constant efforts to right the wrongs to which those positioned as women remain subject.


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Related Entries

feminism, topics: feminist perspectives on reproduction and the family | feminism, topics: feminist perspectives on sexuality | feminist (topics): perspectives on the self

Copyright © 2003
Georgia Warnke
University of California/Riverside

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