This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses XHTML/Unicode to format the display. If you think special symbols are not displaying correctly, see our guide Displaying Special Characters.
last substantive content change

The Equivalence of Mass and Energy

Einstein correctly described the equivalence of mass and energy as "the most important upshot of the special theory of relativity" (Einstein, 1919), for this result lies at the core of modern physics. According to Einstein's famous equation E = mc2, the energy (E) of a physical system is numerically equal to the product of its mass (m) and the speed of light (c) squared. It is customary to refer to this result as "the equivalence of mass and energy," or simply "mass-energy equivalence," because one can choose units in which c = 1, and hence E = m. An important consequence of E = mc2 is that a change in the rest-energy of a physical system is accompanied by a corresponding change to its inertial mass. (This is discussed further in Section 1.) This has led many philosophers to argue that mass-energy equivalence has profound ontological consequences. ( Philosophical interpretations of E = mc2 are discussed further in Section 2.) Recently, the history of E = mc2 has also attracted the attention of some philosophers. This is primarily, though not exclusively, because this history shows that E = mc2 is a direct consequence of changes to the structure of spacetime brought about by Special Relativity. (This is discussed further in Section 3.)

1. Mass-Energy Equivalence: The Result

The equation E = mc2 has two distinct physical consequences. To see this, one needs first to distinguish between the rest-mass and the relativistic mass of a physical system. Let us suppose the physical system we are considering consists of an ordinary, mid-sized object. In mature classical physics, the inertial mass of such an object is a measure of that body's resistance to acceleration. This is the notion of mass one uses in everyday life when one talks about, for example, 1 kg. of salt. Furthermore, in classical physics, the inertial mass of a body is independent of its relative state of motion. Because this is no longer the case in relativistic physics, one can identify two notions of mass in Special Relativity (SR). The rest-mass of a body is the inertial mass of that body when it is at rest relative to an inertial frame. The term m in the equation E=mc2 does not represent rest-mass; it represents relativistic mass, which is the inertial mass of a body when it is in a state of motion relative to an inertial frame. If we use mo to designate the rest-mass of a body, then we can re-write Einstein's equation in the following way:


These equations entail that:

(I) In the frame of reference in which a body is at rest, its energy (in this case called the rest-energy) is equal to the product of its rest-mass mo and the speed of light squared. This is because in this case v = 0, so the Lorentz factor is one.

(II) In a frame of reference in which a body moves with velocity v, the energy of the body is equal to the product of its rest-mass, the speed of light squared, and the Lorentz factor.

From (I) it follows that if there is a change in the rest-energy of a body, there must be a corresponding change in its rest-mass. For example, if a body is heated, and thereby absorbs a small amount of energy ΔE (as measured in the frame of reference in which the body is at rest), its rest-mass will increase by a very small amount equal to ΔE/c2. This increase is tiny because of the high numerical value of the speed of light. Indeed, for mid-sized objects, such an increase in mass would be too small to measure with even the most accurate balance. For example, if a 1 kg block of gold is heated so that its temperature increases by 10 °C, then, ceteris paribus, its mass would increase by as much as 1.4 × 10-14 kg; a cube of gold of this additional tiny mass would have sides smaller than one one-thousandths of a millimeter. Similarly, if a body emits an amount of energy ΔE, say in the form of light or heat, its rest-mass will decrease by a tiny amount ΔE/c2. In both cases, the important and novel claim made by SR is that the inertial mass of a body can change depending on whether it absorbs or emits energy. This is true, of course, not just for isolated mid-sized objects but for any physical system. For example, as Einstein (1907) first showed, if we consider a physical system composed of point-particles, such as an ideal gas, the entire system can be considered as a single point-particle whose inertial mass increases as the kinetic energies of the component particles increase.

(I) also entails that there are physical interactions in which masses no longer combine by simple addition, as they do in pre-relativistic physics. For example, suppose two bodies A and B collide to produce a single, more massive body AB. Suppose further that a net amount of energy E is emitted in this inelastic collision, say in the form of heat. (I) entails that the rest-mass of AB will be less than the rest-mass of A plus the rest-mass of B by an amount equal to E/c2. This stands in sharp contrast to the pre-relativistic prediction that the rest-mass of AB will be equal to the rest-mass of A plus the rest-mass of B. So, for example, suppose a meteor (A) struck the earth (B). After the crash, the earth (AB) would have a mass that is a tiny bit less than the mass of the meteor plus the mass of the earth prior to the crash. This is because during the collision the meteor loses part of its kinetic energy as heat radiation. This energy loss corresponds to a loss of mass. It is worth emphasizing that, according to SR, it is the inertial mass of bodies that is no longer simply added in collisions such as these. In other words, SR predicts that the resulting body AB will resist acceleration a tiny bit less than one would have predicted according to pre-relativistic physics. There is an analogous result for cases where a single body disintegrates into two or more bodies.

These consequences of (I) also illustrate how the classical conservation principles are modified by SR. According to Newtonian physics, all physical interactions are separately governed by the principles of conservation of mass and conservation of energy. So, for example, according to pre-relativistic physics the mass of the block of gold discussed above must remain the same as it is heated. However, as we have seen, this is not the case in relativistic physics, because the energy absorbed by the block of gold contributes to an increase in its rest-mass. Similarly, Newtonian physics predicts that mass is conserved when the meteor crashes into the earth in the above example. However, according to relativistic physics, some of the mass is radiated away as energy in the form of heat. In both of these examples, it is the total mass and energy of the entire system that is conserved in these interactions. In general, in SR physical interactions no longer satisfy the two classical conservation principles separately. Instead, these two principles are fused into a single principle: the principle of conservation of mass-energy. It is these consequences of (I), and indirectly the fusing of the two classical conservation principles, that have motivated different philosophical interpretations of E = mc2 (see Section 2, Philosophical Interpretations of Mass-Energy Equivalence).

From (II) it follows that no bounded amount of energy is sufficient to accelerate a body to the speed of light. This is because as the speed of a body approaches the speed of light its relativistic mass increases without bound. But this means that the body's resistance to acceleration, as measured in the inertial frame relative to which it is moving, also increases without bound. In practice, this means that it takes more and more energy to achieve proportionally smaller increases in the speed of a body. For example, suppose an electron requires an amount of energy E to reach 50% of the speed of light. The electron requires twice that amount of energy to reach 90% of the speed of light, roughly six times E to reach 99% of the speed of light, and nearly two hundred times E to reach 99.999% of the speed of light! This consequence of E = mc2 is thus crucial in the design and operation of particle accelerators, and it is often emphasized in the popular media (e.g., in popular science books and films). However, its philosophical import is relatively minor because the increase in relativistic mass does not result in a change to the body. In the frame of reference in which the body is at rest, its inertial mass continues to be mo.

A common misconception surrounding E = mc2 is that it entails that the entire rest-mass of a body can become energy. Strictly speaking, mass-energy equivalence only entails that a change in the rest-energy of a body is invariably accompanied by a corresponding change in the rest-mass of the body. For example, a body may lose a bit of its mass because it radiates a bit of energy. The stronger claim that a body may lose all of its rest-mass as it radiates energy is not a consequence of SR. However, this stronger claim is very well confirmed by experiments in atomic physics. Many particle-antiparticle collisions have been observed, such as collisions between electrons and positrons, where the entire mass of the particles is radiated away as energy in the form of light. Nevertheless, SR leaves open the possibility that a form of matter exists whose mass cannot become energy. This is significant because it emphasizes that mass-energy equivalence is not a consequence of a theory of matter; it is instead a direct consequence of changes to the structure of spacetime imposed by SR (see Section 3, Derivations of Mass-Energy Equivalence: History).

2. Philosophical Interpretations of Mass-Energy Equivalence

There are two main philosophical interpretations of mass-energy equivalence. According to one common interpretation, E = mc2 implies that mass and energy, which are treated as distinct properties in Newtonian physics, are actually the same. I will refer to this view, which is the weaker of the two, as the same-property interpretation hereafter. The second interpretation of mass-energy equivalence is that it entails that there is only one fundamental stuff in the world. I will call this view the one-stuff interpretation hereafter.

2.1 The Same-Property Interpretation of E = mc2

Most physicists and philosophers regard the terms "mass" and "energy" as designating properties of physical systems. Thinkers such as Eddington (1929), and more recently Torretti (1983), argue that since mass and energy are numerically equivalent according to Einstein's famous equation, the properties mass and energy are the same. For example, Eddington states that "it seems very probable that mass and energy are two ways of measuring what is essentially the same thing, in the same sense that the parallax and distance of a star are two ways of expressing the same property of location" (1929, p. 146). According to Eddington, the distinction between mass and energy is artificial. We treat mass and energy as different properties of physical systems because we routinely measure them using different units. However, one can measure mass and energy using the same units by choosing units in which c = 1, i.e., units in which distances are measured in units of time (e.g., light-years). Once we do this, Eddington claims, the distinction between mass and energy disappears.

Torretti (1983) argues along similar lines when he responds to the opposing view, which is held by a minority (e.g., Bunge, 1967; Sachs, 1981). This minority holds that the numerical equivalence of mass and energy is not sufficient to conclude that the two properties are the same. However, according to Torretti, "If a kitchen refrigerator can extract mass from a given jug of water and transfer it by heat radiation or convection to the kitchen wall behind it, a trenchant metaphysical distinction between the mass and the energy of matter does seem far fetched" (1983, p. 307, fn. 13). Like Eddington, Torretti points out that mass and energy seem to be different properties because they are measured in different units. But the units of mass and energy are different only if one uses different units for space and time, which one need not do. For Torretti, the apparent difference between mass and energy is thus an illusion that arises from "the convenient but deceitful act of the mind by which we abstract time and space from nature" (1983, p. 307, fn. 13). Unfortunately, Torretti does not elaborate on the nature of this "deceitful act of the mind." However, he seems to be suggesting that in our perception of the world spatial and temporal dimensions merely appear to be distinct. We perceive spatial intervals as different in kind from temporal intervals. Consequently, we use different types of units to measure spatial and temporal intervals, which has the consequence that mass and energy have different types of units. Since it is customary to regard quantities measured in different types of units as measuring different properties, we conclude that mass and energy are different properties of physical systems. Thus, for Torretti, our mistaken judgment that mass and energy are distinct properties arises from the peculiar way in which we, as humans, perceive space and time.

Interpretations such as Torretti's and Eddington's draw no further ontological conclusions from mass-energy equivalence. For example, neither Eddington nor Torretti make any explicit claim concerning whether properties are best understood as universals, or whether one ought to be a realist about such properties. Finally, by saying that mass and energy are the same, these thinkers are suggesting that the denotation of the terms "mass" and "energy" is the same, though they recognize that the connotation of these terms is clearly different.

2.2 The One-Stuff Interpretation of E = mc2

Interpretations in the second group establish a connection between the terms "mass" and "energy," which are again treated as terms designating properties, and the two basic constituents in the ontology of physics: matter and fields. The equivalence of mass and energy is then taken to show that we can no longer distinguish between matter and fields. Einstein and Infeld (1938) offer a clear articulation of this interpretation. According to Einstein and Infeld, in pre-relativistic physics one can distinguish matter from fields by their properties. Specifically, matter has energy and mass, whereas fields only have energy. Since mass and energy are distinct in pre-relativistic physics, there are physical criteria that allow us to distinguish matter from fields qualitatively. So it is reasonable to adopt an ontology that contains both matter and fields. However, in relativistic physics, the qualitative distinction between matter and fields is lost because of the equivalence of mass and energy. Consequently, Einstein and Infeld argue, the distinction between matter and fields is no longer a qualitative one in relativistic physics. Instead, it is merely a quantitative difference, since "matter is where the concentration of energy is great, field where the concentration of energy is small"(1938, p. 242). Thus, Einstein and Infeld conclude, mass-energy equivalence entails that we should adopt an ontology consisting only of fields.

Strictly speaking, Einstein and Infeld's conclusion concerning the ontology of modern physics does not follow from E = mc2 alone. As we have noted toward the end of Section 1, mass-energy equivalence by itself does not entail that a chunk of what we ordinarily regard as material can be completely converted into energy. Thus, even if E = mc2 is true, it is still logically possible that a theory whose basic ontology consists of both matter and fields might be required. What speaks against this option is a generalized hypothesis concerning the nature of matter based on the empirical observation that some sub-atomic particles can radiate all of their mass. Finally, the development of quantum field theories subsequent to Einstein and Infeld's interpretation lend further support to their view, since these empirically successful theories treat the basic constituents of matter (such as electrons) as quantizations of a field.

Among philosophers, Russell interprets mass-energy equivalence in a way that prima facie seems similar to Einstein and Infeld. According to Russell, "a unit of matter tends more and more to be something like an electromagnetic field filling all space, though having its intensity in a small region" (1915, p. 121). In his later work, Russell continues to hold this view. For example, in Human Knowledge, Its Scope and Limits, he points out that "atoms" are merely small regions in which there is a great deal of energy. Furthermore, these regions are precisely the regions where one would have said, in pre- relativistic physics, that there was matter. For Russell, these considerations suggest that "mass is only a form of energy, and there is no reason why matter should not be dissolved into other forms of energy. It is energy, not matter, that is fundamental in physics" (1948, p. 291). Russell is proposing that mass is reducible to energy in the sense that the world consists only of energy. Thus, for Russell, "mass" and "matter" are otiose in modern physics. Several physicists have held a similar position, though this view is less common now. For example, after a discussion particle-antiparticle annihilation experiments in 1951, Wolfgang Pauli states: "Taking the existence of all these transmutations into account, what remains of the old idea of matter and of substance? The answer is energy. This is the true substance, that which is conserved; only the form in which it appears is changing" (1951, p. 31).

Russell and Pauli's interpretations are, despite the superficial similarity, importantly different from Einstein and Infeld's. Russell (in some places) and Pauli both treat the term "energy" as though it designates a substance, whereas Einstein and Infeld clearly regard energy as a property. This is an important difference. Treating energy as a term designating a substance is now widely regarded as a remnant of an untenable nineteenth century view. Nevertheless, some philosophers have continued to promulgate, albeit inadvertantly at times, the view that energy is a substance. A fairly recent example of this, which is part of an interpretation of mass-energy equivalence, is contained in Zahar's (1989) Einstein's Revolution: A Study in Heuristic.

According to Zahar, energy in pre-relativistic physics occupies a distinct "ontological level" from matter primarily because the former is regarded as dependent on the latter, but not vice versa. In relativistic physics, however, Einstein's famous equation shows that these two ontological levels are in fact identical. According to Zahar, Einstein showed "that ‘energy’ and ‘mass' could be treated as two names for the same basic entity. The stuff which appears to the senses as hard extended substance and the quantity of energy which characterises a process are in fact one and the same thing" (1989, p. 262). For Zahar, the apparent difference between mass and energy arises from the contingent fact that our senses perceive mass and energy differently. On this reading, mass-energy equivalence has the metaphysical implication that what is real, "is no longer the familiar hard substance but a new entity which can be interchangeably called matter or energy" (1989, p. 263). Thus, Zahar holds that the fundamental stuff of physics is a sort of "I- know-not-what" that we can call either "mass" or "energy."

Unfortunately, Zahar's interpretation suffers from a rather imprecise use of the terms "mass," "matter," and "energy." For example, Zahar uses both "mass" and "matter" to designate a substance, when he clearly seems to intend only for the latter to designate a substance and for the former to designate a property. This equivocation can be easily corrected. His use of the term "energy," however, is more difficult to repair unless we introduce the notion of a field. So, for example, when Zahar talks about energy occupying a different "ontological level" from matter, what he should be saying is that fields occupied such a different level. According to mature classical physics (without the aether), it is fields that are "produced" by matter. Consequently, Zahar would have to say that it is fields and matter that are on the same ontological level, and hence that as a result of E = mc2, we can no longer really distinguish between the two. Thus, a charitable interpretation of Zahar, which uses the terms "matter," "mass," "field," and "energy" a bit more carefully, reduces to Einstein and Infeld's position.

Despite the difference in the ontological claims made by the two leading interpretations, there is one significant similarity. Both interpretations implicitly claim that mass-energy equivalence changes our knowledge concerning the extensions of the terms "mass" and "energy." Whereas the terms "mass" and "energy" had different extensions and intensions in pre-relativistic physics, SR teaches us that the extension of the two terms is actually the same. This is analogous to the discovery that the referents of "the morning star" and "the evening star" are the same. We can push the analogy a bit further. Just as it is possible to verify empirically that the planet Venus is the referent of both "the morning star" and "the evening star," it is possible to verify empirically that the extensions of "mass" and "energy" are the same. (See Section 4, Experimental Verification of Mass- Energy Equivalence.) Thus, the one-stuff interpretation merely goes farther than the same-property interpretation by drawing a conclusion concerning not just the properties of physical systems, but also about their very constituents.

3. Derivations of Mass-Energy Equivalence: History

Einstein first derived mass-energy equivalence from the principles of SR in a small article titled "Does the Inertia of a Body Depend Upon Its Energy Content?" (1905b). This derivation, along with others that followed soon after (e.g., Planck (1906), Von Laue (1911)), uses Maxwell's theory of electromagnetism. (See Subsection 3.1, Derivations of E = mc2 that Use Maxwell's Theory.) However, as Einstein later observed (1935), mass-energy equivalence is a result that should be independent of any theory that describes a specific physical interaction. This is the main reason that led physicists to search for "purely dynamical" derivations, i.e., derivations that invoke only mechanical concepts such as "energy" and "momentum", and the principles that govern them. (See Subsection 3.2, Purely Dynamical Derivations of E = mc2.)

3.1 Derivations of E = mc2 that Use Maxwell's Theory

Einstein's original derivation of mass-energy equivalence is the best known in this group. Einstein begins with the following thought-experiment: a body at rest (in some inertial frame) emits two pulses of light of equal energy in opposite directions. Einstein then analyzes this "act of emission" from another inertial frame, which is in a state of uniform motion relative to the first. In this analysis, Einstein uses Maxwell's theory of electromagnetism to calculate the physical properties of the light pulses (such as their intensity) in the second inertial frame. By comparing the two descriptions of the "act of emission", Einstein arrives at his celebrated result: "the mass of a body is a measure of its energy-content; if the energy changes by L, the mass changes in the same sense by L/9 × 1020, the energy being measured in ergs, and the mass in grammes" (1905b, p. 71). A similar derivation using the same thought experiment but appealing to the Doppler effect was given by Langevin (1913) (see the discussion of E = mc2 in Fox (1965)).

Some philosophers and historians of science claim that Einstein's first derivation is fallacious. For example, in The Concept of Mass, Jammer says: "It is a curious incident in the history of scientific thought that Einstein's own derivation of the formula E = mc2, as published in his article in Annalen der Physik, was basically fallacious. . .   the result of a petitio principii, the conclusion begging the question" (Jammer, 1961, p. 177). According to Jammer, Einstein implicitly assumes what he is trying to prove, viz., that if a body emits an amount of energy L, its inertial mass will decrease by an amount Δm = L/c2. Jammer also accuses Einstein of assuming the expression for the relativistic kinetic energy of a body. If Einstein made these assumptions, he would be guilty of begging the question. Recently, however, Stachel and Torretti (1982) have shown convincingly that Einstein's (1905b) argument is sound. They note that Einstein indeed derives the expression for the kinetic energy of an "electron" (i.e., a structureless particle with a net charge) in his earlier (1905a) paper. However, Einstein nowhere uses this expression in the (1905b) derivation of mass-energy equivalence. Stachel and Torretti also show that Einstein's critics overlook two key moves that are sufficient to make Einstein's derivation sound, since one need not assume that Δm = L/c2.

Einstein's further conclusion that "the mass of a body is a measure of its energy content" (1905b, p. 71) does not, strictly speaking, follow from his argument. As Torretti (1983) and other philosophers and physicists have observed, Einstein's (1905b) argument allows for the possibility that once a body's energy store has been entirely used up (and subtracted from the mass using the mass-energy equivalence relation) the remainder is not zero. In other words, it is only an hypothesis in Einstein's (1905b) argument, and indeed in all derivations of E = mc2 in SR, that no "exotic matter" exists that is not convertible into energy (see Ehlers, Rindler, Penrose, (1965) for a discussion of this point). However, particle-antiparticle anihilation experiments in atomic physics, which were first observed decades after 1905, strongly support "Einstein's dauntless extrapolation" (Torretti, 1983, p. 112).

3.2 Purely Dynamical Derivations of E = mc2

Purely dynamical derivations of E = mc2 typically proceed by analyzing an inelastic collision from the point of view of two inertial frames in a state of relative motion (the centre-of-mass frame, and an inertial frame moving with a relative velocity v). One of the first papers to appear following this approach is Perrin's (1932). According to Rindler and Penrose (1965), Perrin's derivation was based largely on Langevin's "elegant" lectures, which were delivered at the College de France in Zurich around 1922. Einstein himself gave a purely dynamical derivation (Einstein, 1935), though he nowhere mentions either Langevin or Perrin. The most comprehensive derivation of this sort was given by Ehlers, Rindler and Penrose (1965). More recently, a purely dynamical version of Einstein's original (1905b) thought experiment, where the particles that are emitted are not photons, has been given by Mermin and Feigenbaum (1990).

Derivations in this group are distinctive because they demonstrate that mass-energy equivalence is a consequence of the changes to the structure of spacetime brought about by SR. The relationship between mass and energy is independent of Maxwell's theory or any other theory that describes a specific physical interaction.We can get a glimpse of this by noting that to derive E = mc2 by analyzing a collision, one must first define relativistic momentum (prel) and relativistic kinetic energy (Trel), since one cannot use the old Newtonian notions of momentum and kinetic energy. In Einstein's own purely dynamical derivation (1935), more than half of the paper is devoted to finding the mathematical expressions that define prel and Trel. This much work is required to arrive at these expressions for two reasons. First, the changes to the structure of spacetime must be incorporated into the definitions of the relativistic quantities. Second, prel and Trel must be defined so that they reduce to their Newtonian counterparts in the appropriate limit. This last requirement ensures, in effect, that SR will inherit the empirical success of Newtonian physics. Once the definitions of prel and Trel are obtained, the derivation of mass-energy equivalence is straight-forward. (For a more detailed discussion of Einstein's (1935), see Flores, (1998).)

4. Experimental Verification of Mass-Energy Equivalence

Cockcroft and Walton (1932) are routinely credited with the first experimental verification of mass-energy equivalence. Einstein (1905b) had conjectured that the equivalence of mass and energy could be tested by "weighing" an atom before and after it undergoes radioactive decay. But there was no way of performing this experiment or another experiment that would directly confirm mass-energy equivalence at the time. Technological developments allowed Cockcroft and Walton to take a different approach. They studied the bombardment of a lithium atom (Li) by a proton (p), which produces two alpha particles (α). This reaction is symbolized by the following equation:

p + Li = 2α

In this reaction, there is a decrease in the total rest-mass as the reaction proceeds from left to right: the total rest-mass of proton and the Lithium atom is greater than the total rest-mass of the two alpha particles. Furthermore, there is also an increase in the total kinetic energy: the kinetic energy of the proton is less than the total kinetic energy of the two alpha particles. (One only considers the kinetic energy of the proton because the Lithium atom is considered at rest, and hence has zero kinetic energy.) Cockcroft and Walton were able to measure the kinetic energies of the incident proton and the out-going alpha particles very precisely. They found that the decrease in rest-mass corresponds to the increase in kinetic energy according to Einstein's famous equation E = mc2 (to an accuracy of better than 1%). Hence, the total mass and energy of the entire system is conserved.


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

ontology and ontological commitment

Copyright © 2004
Francisco Flores

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy