This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Diagrams
Citation Information


1. It is an interesting question why this has been the case. The possibility of being misled by diagrams and their limited expressive power have been considered as major reasons for their rejection. Mark Greaves [2002] explores the philosophical and historical roots for the adoption or rejection of diagrams in logical and geometric proofs, and concludes that whether a diagrammatic system is invented, or accepted, is a reflection of whether the inventor, or user, accepts a certain metaphysics.

2. Note that, however natural this convention may sound, this is still an arbitrary convention. For example, Lambert and Englebretsen's systems visualize individuals as points and sets as lines [Lambert 1764, Englebretsen 1992].

3. Euler [1768], p. 233.

4. For more details, see Hammer and Shin [1998].

5. Such problems have been studied under the banner of “Topological Inference ” and are nearly all NP hard [Grigni et al. 1995, Lemon & Pratt 1997b, Lemon 2001].

6. Now Ian Pratt-Hartmann.

7. As a practical instance of Helly's Theorem.

8. For more recent logical study on this issue, refer to papers by Aiello and van Benthem, Fisler, and Lemon, in Barker-Plummer et al. [2002].

9. For example: Reasoning with Diagrammatic Representations: 1992 AAAI Spring Symposium; Cognitive and Computational Models of Spatial Representation: 1996 AAAI Spring Symposium; Reasoning with Diagrammatic Representations II: 1997 AAAI Fall Symposium; and Formalizing Reasoning with Visual and Diagrammatic Representations: 1998 AAAI Fall Symposium. See also Narajanan [1993].

10. The following conferences are good evidence for this effort: VISUAL '98: Visualization Issues in Formal Methods (Lisbon); International Roundtable Conference on Visual and Spatial Reasoning in Design (MIT, 1999); and Theories of Visual Languages -- Track of VL '99 : 1999 IEEE Symposium on Visual Languages.

11. See Aristotle On the Soul and On the Memory and Recollection.

12. Block [1981] is one of the best collections of important papers on this debate, and Block [1983] presents a succinct summary of this controversy and raises insightful philosophical questions about the debate. Chapters 1-4 of Tye [1991] are a good overview of both cognitive scientists' and philosophers' various positions on this issue.

Copyright © 2003
Sun-Joo Shin
Oliver Lemon

Notes to Diagrams
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy