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Descartes' Epistemology

René Descartes' approach to the theory of knowledge plays a prominent role in shaping the agenda of early modern philosophy. It continues to effect (some would say "infect") the way problems in epistemology are conceived today. Students of philosophy (in his own day, and in the history since) have found the distinctive features of his epistemology to be at once attractive and troubling; features such as the emphasis on method, the role of epistemic foundations, the conception of the doubtful as contrasting with the warranted, the sceptical arguments of the First Meditation, and the cogito ergo sum--to mention just a few that we shall consider.

Depending on context, Descartes thinks that different standards of warrant are appropriate. The context for which he is most famous, and on which the present treatment will focus, is that of investigating First Philosophy. The first-ness of First Philosophy is (as Descartes conceives it) one of epistemic priority, referring to the matters one must "first" confront if one is to succeed in acquiring systematic and expansive knowledge.

Section links:

1. Knowledge as normative, internalist, and methodist

1.1. Cartesian knowledge is normative.

In recent epistemologies, it is increasingly fashionable to conceive of knowledge in terms that leave little (or no) room for epistemic responsibility. The processes leading to knowledge happen to the subject via organs and faculties, much as do circulation of blood, digestion of food, and the like. Such processes (cognitive or otherwise) may occur more or less reliably. Notions as praise and blame, however, need be no more apropos to the reliability of cognitive processes than to that of non-cognitive processes.

In contrast, Descartes regards the categories of praise and blame as quite appropriate to epistemology. Where the acquisition of knowledge is concerned--the philosopher's knowledge, at any rate--one is obliged to withhold assent except when warranted. Judgments grounded in shoddy evidence are conducive to error and thus merit blame, even when the judged matter is true. Among the aims of epistemology, accordingly, is to identify epistemic duties the following of which will ensure error-free judging.

Granting that ought implies can, normative accounts presuppose some degree of voluntary control over those actions we're duty-bound to perform (or to restrain from performing). In keeping with this, Descartes holds that epistemic warrant or justification (unlike circulation and digestion) is the willful result of a dutiful, reflective mind; specifically, warrant occurs only where there is a systematic withholding of assent, except when prescribed, and a careful directing of attention towards prescribed matters. In the course of the Meditations, Descartes purports to reveal both prescriptions.

1.2. Cartesian knowledge is internalist.

Where warrant is understood as a normative concept, the would-be knower needs cognitive access to the factors by which warrant is rendered. The jargon of "internalism" and "externalism" is often applied here, but an adequate characterization of the internalism-externalism distinction is difficult and beyond our aims. According to a construal that will serve our purposes, a theory of justification is internalist insofar as it requires that the justifying factors grounding knowledge claims are accessible to the knower's consciousness. On this construal, Descartes is a thorough-going internalist.

Descartes thinks it a straightforward consequence of 17th century mechanist doctrine that requisite cognitive access can come only by means of ideas (conscious states of mind). To use a metaphor Descartes is fond of, evidence of the sort relevant to the internalist is directly present to the mind's eye--it is "intuited" with mental vision. To the extent that we have cognitive access to that which is directly present to our literal eyes (and other organs of physiology), it is by means of ideas. As Descartes conceives the task of acquiring knowledge, the would-be knower must begin with the data of consciousness (the internal world) and then somehow build up to (hopefully expansive) knowledge wholly on the basis of such data. The problem of so expanding our knowledge to include even the external world is among the central epistemological problems of 17th and 18th century philosophy.

1.3. Cartesian knowledge is methodist.

How is the epistemologist to proceed in identifying candidates for knowledge? A distinction will prove useful--that between particularist and methodist responses to this question. The particularist is apt to presuppose the credibility of our prima facie intuitions regarding particular items of knowledge, and then use these intuitions to help identify more general epistemic duties. The methodist, on the other hand, is apt to hold that our prima facie intuitions are unstable and unreliable; that we ought to begin with a method to help us arrive at settled, reflective intuitions as to which particular knowledge claims are credible.

Famously, Descartes is in the methodist camp. Those who haphazardly "direct their minds down untrodden paths" are sometimes "lucky enough in their wanderings to hit upon some truth," but "it is far better," writes Descartes, "never to contemplate investigating the truth about any matter than to do so without a method" (Rules 4, AT 10:371). Though it's prima facie palpable that the earth is unmoved, and that ordinary objects (as tables and chairs) are just as they seem, the newly emerging mechanist doctrines of the 17th century have it that such matters are in fact false. Such cases underscore the unreliability of our prima facie intuitions and the need for a method to help us distinguish these seductive though false matters from genuine truth.

In the dialectic of the First Meditation, Descartes confronts common sense particularism in an effort to show (among other things) that our prima facie intuitions are in need of revision. (As the narrative unfolds, the common sense perspective is often intermingled with that of Aristotelian scholasticism, the prevailing philosophical system in the schools--a system that was common sense oriented in terms of its credulous trust in sense perception.) At the first level of the dialectic, while speaking on behalf of common sense, the meditator-spokesperson (hereafter referred to as the "meditator") appeals to the seeming obviousness of claims as "that I am here, sitting by the fire, wearing a winter dressing-gown, holding this piece of paper in my hands, and so on"--particular matters "about which doubt is quite impossible," or so it would seem (AT 7:18). In response (and at each level of the dialectic), Descartes invokes his own methods to show that the prima facie obviousness of such particular claims is insufficient to meet the burden of proof to which we're epistemically obliged.

Further reading: On normativity, see the Fourth Meditation and Prin. 1.36ff ; see also Alston (1989). On belief voluntarism, see Audi (1999). On the internalism-externalism distinction, see Alston (1989) and Plantinga (1993). On the methodism-particularism distinction, see Chisholm (1982).

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2. Descartes' methods: foundationalism and doubt

Of his own methods, Descartes writes:
Throughout my writings I have made it clear that my method imitates that of the architect. When an architect wants to build a house which is stable on ground where there is a sandy topsoil over underlying rock, or clay, or some other firm base, he begins by digging out a set of trenches from which he removes the sand, and anything resting on or mixed in with the sand, so that he can lay his foundations on firm soil. In the same way, I began by taking everything that was doubtful and throwing it out, like sand ... (Replies 7, AT 7:537)
As suggested by these remarks, Descartes' two principal methods--foundationalism and doubt--are integrated. Since he holds that matters that are prima facie obvious, or self-evident, often turn out false, and since the method of foundationalism depends on an ability to avoid such error when identifying the foundations, a complement method is required if the search for unshakable foundations is to succeed. In the present Section, we consider both of Descartes' methods, making liberal use of his architectural metaphor.

2.1. Foundationalism.

The central insight of foundationalism is that a system of epistemic justification can be fashioned after the manner of a structurally sound house. Such a house might owe its unshakability to two features: a firm foundation and a well-anchored superstructure consisting of tightly linked support beams firmly grounded into the foundation. Likewise, where warrant is construed in terms of unshakable certainty, a system of knowledge might emerge from two parallel features: a foundation of unshakably certain first principles, and a superstructure of further claims anchored into the foundation by means of unshakably certain inference. Among its considerable alleged benefits, foundationalism provides the means for a potentially indefinite expansion of one's stock of knowledge, from relatively meager beginnings. This is especially significant where there are few first principles.

(It's worth noting that foundationalism, as here characterized, presupposes a conception of truth that involves more than coherence. If relations of coherence exhausted the notion of truth, judgments as to the truth of first principles could not be justified (qua first principles), nor could inference be justification preserving as opposed to justification conferring.)

A paradigmatic example of a foundationalist system is Euclid's geometry. Euclid begins with a foundation of first principles--his definitions, postulates, and axioms or common notions--on which he then bases a superstructure of further propositions. Descartes' own designs for metaphysical knowledge are inspired by Euclid's system: "Those long chains composed of very simple and easy reasoning, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way" (Discourse 2, AT 6:19). Though it would be misleading to characterize the constructive component of the Meditations as straightforwardly fashioned after the manner of the geometers, Descartes does think it can be reconstructed as such, and he expressly does so at end of the Second Replies--providing a "geometrical" exposition of his central constructive steps, under the following headings: definitions, postulates, axioms or common notions, and propositions (AT 7:160ff).

As alluded to above, the Meditations contains a destructive component that Descartes likens to the architect's preparations for laying a foundation. Though the component finds no analogue in the method of the geometers, Descartes looks to hold that it is needed because of unique problems associated with the discovery of first principles in metaphysical inquiry. The discovery of Euclid's first principles (some of them, at any rate) is comparatively unproblematic: claims as that things which are equal to the same thing are also equal to one another (Euclid's first axiom) wear their truth on their sleeve. In metaphysics, however, our analyses might reveal first principles that are in conflict with preconceived opinions deriving from the senses.

The difference is that the primary notions which are presupposed for the demonstration of geometrical truths are readily accepted by anyone, since they accord with the use of our senses. Hence there is no difficulty there, except in the proper deduction of the consequences, which can be done even by the less attentive, provided they remember what has gone before. ... In metaphysics by contrast there is nothing which causes so much effort as making our perception of the primary notions clear and distinct. Admittedly, they are by their nature as evident as, or even more evident than, the primary notions which the geometers study; but they conflict with many preconceived opinions derived from the senses which we have got into the habit of holding from our earliest years, and so only those who really concentrate and meditate and withdraw their minds from corporeal things, so far as possible, will achieve perfect knowledge of them. (Replies 2, AT 7:156-57)
(Note: Descartes uses ‘perceive’/‘perception’ (percipio/perceptio) with much wider scope than is the current practice in philosophy: for Descartes, to perceive X is, roughly, to be aware of X.)

Among Descartes' persistent themes is that such preconceived opinions can have the effect of obscuring our mental vision; that where there are disputes about first principles, it is not "because one man's faculty of knowledge extends more widely than another's, but because the common notions are in conflict with the preconceived opinions of some people who, as a result, cannot easily grasp them"; whereas, "we cannot fail to know them when the occasion for thinking about them arises, provided that we are not blinded by preconceived opinions" (Prin. 1.49-50, AT 8a:24). These "preconceived opinions" must be "set aside," says Descartes, since doing so "is wholly necessary in order to lay the first foundations of philosophy" (May 1643, AT 8b:37). Unless they are set aside, we're apt to regard, as bona fide first principles, the mistaken (though prima facie obvious) sensory claims that particularists find attractive. Again, what could be more palpable than that the earth is unmoved? (Indeed, defenders of common sense have even proposed that "the consent of ages and nations, of the learned and unlearned, ought to have great authority with regard to first principles" (Reid 1785, 6.4), perhaps unwittingly making the case that the scholastic doctrine that the earth is unmoved be regarded as a first principle.)

Not only do preconceived opinions interfere with the search for first principles, Descartes thinks they hinder our ability to generate foundationalist superstructure:

[A]lthough the proofs I employ here are in my view as certain and evident as the proofs of geometry, if not more so, it will, I fear, be impossible for many people to achieve an adequate perception of them, both because they are rather long and some depend on others, and also, above all, because they require a mind which is completely free from preconceived opinions and which can easily detach itself from involvement with the senses. (Dedicatory Epistle for Meditations, AT 7:4)
Though the method of foundationalism brilliantly allows for the expansion of knowledge from meager beginnings, the method is incomplete if prejudices thwart our ability to identify the foundations. To help "set aside" these preconceived opinions, Descartes devises a second method--the method of doubt.

(We should add that there has been a history of controversy surrounding Euclid's fifth postulate--the parallel postulate. Some have taken the worries, here, as suggesting intractable problems for any endeavor to discover unshakably certain foundations.)

2.2. Methodological doubt.

Descartes opens the First Meditation asserting the need "to demolish everything completely and start again right from the foundations" (AT 7:17). Whereas, in the architectural metaphor, we can think of tractors and bulldozers as the tools of demolition, the tool of epistemic demolition is sceptical doubt. Tractors undermine literal ground; doubt undermines epistemic ground. Descartes' aim, however, is not that of "the sceptics, who doubt only for the sake of doubting," but instead "to reach certainty--to cast aside the loose earth and sand so as to come upon rock or clay" (Discourse 3, AT 6:28-29). In our consideration of the method of doubt, we begin by addressing a few misunderstandings; we then focus on how the universality and hyperbole of doubt are intended to impede the corrupting influence of preconceived opinion.

Misconceptions about the method abound. Two of these are illustrated in a passage from the pragmatist Peirce:

We cannot begin with complete doubt. We must begin with all the prejudices which we actually have when we enter upon the study of philosophy. These prejudices are not to be dispelled by a maxim [viz. the maxim that the philosopher "must begin with universal doubt"], for they are things which it does not occur to us can be questioned. Hence this initial skepticism will be a mere self-deception, and not real doubt ... A person may, it is true, in the course of his studies, find reason to doubt what he began by believing; but in that case he doubts because he has a positive reason for it, and not on account of the Cartesian maxim. Let us not pretend to doubt in philosophy what we do not doubt in our hearts. (1955, 228f)
One misconception is in supposing that universal doubt is intended to result from the mere effort to adhere to the maxim--as if by sheer effort of will. Quite to the contrary, Descartes introduces sceptical arguments precisely in acknowledgement that, where it does not occur to us that our judgments can be questioned, we need some prompting; we need to be provided with reasons for doubt on which to reflect. Descartes writes:
I did say that there was some difficulty in expelling from our belief everything we have previously accepted. One reason for this is that before we can decide to doubt, we need some reason for doubting; and that is why in my First Meditation I put forward the principal reasons for doubt. (Replies 5, appendix, AT 9a:204)
A further misconception has it that the intended attitude of doubt need involve the kind of sincerity that Peirce characterizes as a "doubt in our hearts." Distinguish (what I'll call) a hypothetical from a sincere doubt. Merely hypothetical doubt involves recognition that one's warrant is undermined by a sceptical hypothesis that one regards as extravagant (but not unthinkable). As such, a merely hypothetical doubt need not undermine one's inclination to assent. In contrast, sincere doubt involves recognition that one's warrant is undermined by a sceptical hypothesis that one regards as plausible. Sincere doubt does undermine one's inclination to assent, and only it involves "doubt in our hearts" (as it were). The misconception is in supposing that Descartes' method requires a sincere doubt as opposed to a merely hypothetical doubt. Hypothetical doubt is in fact sufficient to induce recognition that one's confidence is not unshakably firm as is required for the foundations of knowledge. Moreover, it is clear that Descartes regards his hyperbolic doubts as merely hypothetical. He concludes the Synopsis of the Meditations by noting that "no sane person has ever seriously doubted" many of the matters that are called into question, such as the existence of the external world. (Rather, he says the primary aim is to establish issues of epistemic priority.) And subsequent to introducing his most extravagant doubt, he concedes that the preceding opinions it undermines remain "much more reasonable to believe than to deny" (AT 7:22).

A related misconception has Descartes calling not merely for doubt, but for disbelief or dissent. Gassendi, e.g., misreads Descartes as urging us to "consider everything as false" (Objs. 5, AT 7:257-58). But surely the spirit of Descartes' invocation to doubt (even if not always its letter) is that, due to the importance of unshakable foundations, we are to "hold back [our] assent from opinions which are not completely certain and indubitable just as carefully as [we] do from those which are patently false" (Med. 1, AT 7:18).

Yet another misconception has it that the universality of doubt renders inert Descartes' own sceptical hypotheses, since they are dubious in every case. Yet since the motivation for the method is to avoid building on dubious/shakable foundations, the scope of universal doubt need not encompass the sceptical hypotheses themselves, as opposed merely to every candidate for knowledge (without exception). And since the doubt required by the method is merely hypothetical, the sceptical hypotheses need not seem plausible in order to serve as tools of demolition--"there may be reasons which are strong enough to compel us to doubt, even though these reasons are themselves doubtful, and hence are not to be retained later on" (Replies 7, AT 7:473-74).

These are by no means the only misconceptions about the method of doubt. Even barring such misconception, Descartes admits that "the usefulness of such extensive doubt is not apparent at first sight," adding that "its greatest benefit lies in freeing us from all our preconceived opinions" (Synopsis, AT 7:12). Further appeal to the architectural metaphor will help to elucidate how the universality and hyperbole of Descartes' doubt (two features that he consistently emphasizes) are supposed to help us to "set aside" the preconceived opinions apt to obscure the search for first principles.

That doubt is to be universal has two aspects: it is to be applied without exception, and it is to be applied collectively rather than piecemeal. The latter deserves further comment. The requirement that doubt be collective rather than piecemeal is intended in part to prevent a pseudo-firmness that might otherwise result from the supportive influence that judgments have on one another. Suppose an architect attempted to secure the structural stability of a house by renovating it in piecemeal fashion, rather than by means of a universal demolition followed by a complete rebuilding. A potential problem looms in that, roughly in proportion with the number of boards one binds together (other things equal), a structure will seem increasingly sturdy--via a mass-coherence-induced-pseudo-firmness. Imagine our architect moving from one support beam to another, checking each one for sturdiness even while the whole structure remains intact. This piecemeal procedure is apt to lead her to confuse the stability of mass-coherence with that of bedrock-grounding. Indeed, such a procedure might well exhibit an aircraft carrier as resting on unshakable foundations, even though it is (in the relevant sense) nothing more than a massive raft--grounded in nothing, perhaps drifting aimlessly. Likewise, where one's web of preconceived opinion is sufficiently massive and coherent, a procedure of attempting to shake individual such opinions, in piecemeal fashion, while allowing the rest of one's web to remain intact, is apt to exhibit a great many falsehoods as seeming to be quite firm/sure. Universal doubt is intended to avoid this kind of pseudo-firmness. If one first disassembles the various support beams from one another before testing their shakability, the difference between mass-coherence-induced-pseudo-stability and bedrock-grounded-stability is more perspicuous. Descartes is supposing that the same benefit is realized when building epistemic structures: by first razing the existing structure in its entirety, one is more likely to hit on first principles whose firmness is not mass-coherence-induced.

In the Seventh Replies, Descartes offers yet another metaphor to illustrate the benefit of the universality requirement in preventing the corrupting influence that judgments can have on one another.

Suppose [an inquirer] had a basket full of apples and, being worried that some of the apples were rotten, wanted to take out the rotten ones to prevent the rot spreading. How would he proceed? Would he not begin by tipping the whole lot out of the basket? And would not the next step be to cast his eye over each apple in turn, and pick up and put back in the basket only those he saw to be sound, leaving the others? In just the same way, those who have never philosophized correctly have various opinions in their minds which they have begun to store up since childhood, and which they therefore have reason to believe may in many cases be false. They then attempt to separate the false beliefs from the others, so as to prevent their contaminating the rest and making the whole lot uncertain. Now the best way they can accomplish this is to reject all their beliefs together in one go, as if they were all uncertain and false. They can then go over each belief in turn and re-adopt only those which they recognize to be true and indubitable. (Replies 7, AT 7:481)
Turning our attention to Descartes' emphasis on a hyperbolic doubt, again the requirement is intended to prevent a pseudo-firmness that might otherwise result when attempting to identify first principles. Remarks by Gassendi make him a useful foil:
There is just one point I am not clear about, namely why you did not make a simple and brief statement to the effect that you were regarding your previous knowledge as uncertain so that you could later single out what you found to be true. ... This strategy made it necessary for you to convince yourself by imagining a deceiving God or some evil demon who tricks us, whereas it would surely have been sufficient to cite the darkness of the human mind or the weakness of our nature. (Objs. 5, AT 7:257-58)

The architectural metaphor is again helpful. Suppose our architect is vigilant in meeting the first requirement--a universal demolition. Even so, she is apt to confound firm dirt with genuine bedrock if she is not using heavy-duty demolition tools. Indeed, she's apt to rebuild on the very same ground that, prima facie, seemed immovable when the original edifice was built. Descartes thinks there's a nearly irresistible urge to regard as immovable the comfortable ground which has, for a lifetime, been unmoved. In the absence of powerful demolition equipment, Descartes' own project thus threatens to amount to no more than an exercise in foundationalist rebuilding on a given (preconceived), unquestioned foundation--a serious concern, in view of the proclivity of his scholastic readers to regard the questioning of ancient and divine authorities as tantamount to heresy. As Descartes writes, in response to Gassendi:

Is it really so easy to free ourselves from all the errors which we have soaked up since our infancy? Can we really be too careful in carrying out a project which everyone agrees should be performed? ... most people, although verbally admitting that we should escape from preconceived opinions, never do so in fact, because ... they reckon that nothing they have once accepted as true should be regarded as a preconceived opinion. (Replies 5, AT 7:348)
Just as light-duty gardening tools are incapable of uncovering bedrock (as bedrock), Descartes needs to provide his readers with heavy-duty demolition gear (i.e. hyperbolic sceptical arguments) if the method is to succeed in preventing the confounding of cherished prejudices with unshakable foundations.

Hence the importance of a universal, hyperbolic doubt to the larger effort to apply foundationalism to metaphysical inquiry. Indeed, Descartes regards the sceptical/destructive component as of such importance to the success of his larger project that he recommends we "devote several months" to the First Meditation alone (Replies 2, AT 7:130). Of course, there is no guarantee, at the outset, that a careful procedure of doubt will achieve the intended result. There are a number of plausible, failed outcomes: (i) perhaps there are no unshakable truths of the sort the method is intended to reveal; or, even granting that there are, (ii) perhaps Descartes' sceptical hypotheses are, though hyperbolic, nonetheless too weak to clear away the prejudices obscuring bedrock; or, even granting that they are sufficiently heavy-duty, (iii) perhaps the meditator will look in all the wrong places for bedrock. On the other hand, if the method does in fact reveal some unshakably certain matters--even in the face of the most hyperbolic doubt that we're capable of contriving--then Descartes thinks that such matters are the stuff of knowledge if anything is: where our "conviction is so firm that it is impossible for us ever to have any reason for doubting what we are convinced of, then there are no further questions for us to ask: we have everything that we could reasonably want" (Replies 2, AT 7:144-45).

The propriety of Descartes' (oft-criticized as being too high) burden of proof is elucidated by analogy to criminal law. Consider two desiderata of our criminal court system: to convict all the guilty, and to convict only the guilty. As one raises the burden of proof imposed on the prosecution, the prospects of achieving the first desideratum are decreased; the prospects of achieving the second desideratum are increased. The burden can thus be raised or lowered in accordance with the desideratum one wishes to emphasize. The implications are clear for epistemologists who share the following two desiderata: to warrant all the true, and to warrant only the true. Descartes places a premium on achieving the second desideratum at all costs--a good method is such that following it ensures that "one will never take what is false to be true" (Rules 4, AT 10:371-72). Given this priority, it is appropriate to impose a maximally high burden of proof on the inquirer--we "cannot possibly go too far" in the application of doubt (Med. 1, AT 7:22).

In view of this high burden of proof, it emerges that a requirement of knowledge (as Descartes conceives it) is full indefeasibility (i.e. full immunity to doubt): one's conviction must be "so firm that it is impossible for us ever to have any reason for doubting" (Replies 2, AT 7:144); "so strong that it can never be shaken" (24 May 1640, AT 3:65), not even in the face of the most hyperbolic of doubts which might be contrived by the sceptic. The effect may be to limit the eventual stock of knowledge, but the brand of knowledge worthy of the philosopher, as opposed to that appropriate for the mundane affairs of daily life, calls for high standards (cf. Replies 2, AT 7:149). Hereafter, I refer to this rigorous brand of knowledge that Descartes seeks (what he calls scientia) as Knowledge (uppercase ‘K’).

Further reading: On foundationalism: for Descartes' treatment, see Discourse, First Meditation, and Seventh Objections and Replies; for its treatment by ancients, see Euclid (1956) and Aristotle (Posterior Analytics); by interpreters of Descartes, see Sosa (1997a) and Van Cleve (1979). On Cartesian inference (there are disputes as to what "certain inference" (my term) comes to, for Descartes), see Descartes' Rules (bearing in mind that the he never finished this work, much less published it, and some of the doctrines there are at odds with his published writings); by commentators, see Gaukroger (1989) and Hacking (1980). On methodological doubt: for Descartes' treatment, see Rules,Discourse, First Meditation, and Seventh Replies; by commentators, see Frankfurt (1970), Garber (1986), Williams (1983), and Wilson (1978). For a contemporary application interestingly similar to Descartes' treatment of doubt vis-à-vis first principles, see Rawls (1971) on reflective equilibrium. A discussion of the relation between the methods of doubt and foundationalism is somewhat incomplete without consideration of another distinction of method, that between analysis and synthesis. On the analysis-synthesis distinction: see the Second Replies (AT 7:155ff); see also Galileo (1967, 50f), Arnauld (L'Art de Penser, 4.2-3), Curley (1986), and Hintikka (1978). On the indefeasibility (and other conditions) of Knowledge/scientia, see Newman and Nelson (1999).

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3. First Meditation sceptical arguments

Of his sceptical arguments, Descartes says he "could not have left them out, any more than a medical writer can leave out the description of a disease when he wants to explain how it can be cured" (Replies 3, AT 7:172). Among the aims of an accurate sceptical diagnosis is to reveal the comparative shakability of various kinds of judgments--so as to expose which kinds are more (and less) suitable as materials for building enduring Knowledge. Towards this aim, Descartes' diagnosis unfolds from the least hyperbolic doubt (that which undermines the fewest kinds of judgments) to the most hyperbolic doubt. In what follows, we first consider his treatment of doubts motivated by reflection on dreaming. We then consider his most powerful doubt, a doubt motivated by reflection on the veracity of our cognitive faculties.

3.1. Dreaming Doubts.

Historically, there are two distinct dream-related skeptical doubts. The one doubt undermines the judgment that one is presently awake--call this the Now Dreaming Doubt. The other doubt undermines the judgment that one is ever awake (i.e. in the way normally supposed)--call this the Always Dreaming Doubt. A textual case can be made on behalf of either formulation (or both) being raised in the Meditations. We'll not attempt to settle this interpretive dispute here, though we will discuss both.

Both kinds of dream doubt appeal to some version of the thesis that the experiences we take as dreams are (at their best) qualitatively similar to the experiences we take as waking--call this the Similarity Thesis. The Similarity Thesis may be formulated in a variety of strengths. Indeed, disputes as to how similar the experiences of the dreaming-kind are to those of the waking-kind have raged for more than two millennia. The tone of the debate suggests that the degree of qualitative similarity may vary across individuals (or, at least, across their recollections of dreams). Granting such variation, dreaming doubts that appeal to weaker versions of the Similarity Theses are apt (all other things equal) to persuade more people. Without attempting, here, to settle the interpretive issue of how strong a Similarity Thesis Descartes intends to advance, let's consider a textually defensible formulation that errs on the weak side. The relatively weak thesis I have in mind is this: that the qualitative features of the experiences we take as dreams are sufficiently similar to those of the experiences we take as waking, as to render it not unthinkable that waking-quality features should be reproduced in a dream: "every sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep" (Med. 6, AT 7:77). This version of the Similarity Thesis is endorsable by those who never recollect dreams that seem (on hindsight) qualitatively indistinguishable from the experiences they take as waking; indeed, it's endorsable even by those who simply do not remember their dreams to any significant degree. Descartes' own meditator, however, appears to be someone who remembers dreams of sufficient qualitative similarity to have fooled him while having them: "As if I did not remember other occasions when I have been tricked by exactly similar thoughts while asleep" (Med. 1, AT 7:19).

This weak Similarity Thesis is sufficient for Descartes' purposes. Recall that his method only requires a hypothetical doubt. As long as it is not unthinkable that waking-quality experiences should be reproduced in a dream, then Descartes thinks we're unable to meet the burden of proof requisite for Knowledge--"there are never any [unshakably] sure signs by means of which being awake can be distinguished from being asleep" (Med. 1, AT 7:19; italics added). Even if one is very confident of being able to distinguish dreaming from waking, Descartes thinks this level of confidence is not so high as to constitute warrant.

(Much to-do is often made over whether dreaming arguments are self-refuting. The worry is that Similarity Theses, on which such arguments are based, must presuppose that we already know which experiences are dreams and which are waking, in order to assess their comparative quality; this, however, is precisely the distinction that dreaming arguments purport to undermine. Descartes preempts this debate by couching his claims in terms of experiences we think of as dreams, those we think of as waking, those we remember as dreams, and so on.)

We're now in position to generate straightaway the Now Dreaming Doubt: since there are no unshakably sure signs of being awake, for all I Know I'm now dreaming. It's not unthinkable, even if I don't believe it. The sceptical consequences of this admission are not insignificant. The further judgments that are called into doubt include all those in which my confidence is shaken on the hypothesis that I'm now dreaming--e.g., the judgment that I'm now "holding this piece of paper in my hands." It's not unthinkable that, in a few moments, I'll awaken to the reality that I have no hands. Descartes is not denying the truth of such claims, as to what one is holding in one's hands. He's not even denying that we know them (small ‘k’, the sense appropriate for practical matters). He's questioning whether we have an unshakable certainty as is requisite for the foundations of Knowledge.

Descartes appears to hold that, from the very same Similarity Thesis, together with a further assumption, the more powerful sceptical result can be generated, namely the Always Dreaming Doubt. The further assumption is that, for all we Know, the processes producing the experiences we take as waking are no more veracious than those producing the experiences we take as dreams. As Descartes writes:

[E]very sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep; and since I do not believe that what I seem to perceive in sleep comes from things located outside me, I did not see why I should be any more inclined to believe this of what I think I perceive while awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:77)
The aim of the Always Dreaming Doubt is not to undermine our confidence that we're now awake; nor to question whether there are significant differences between the experiences we categorize as waking and those we categorize as dreaming. Instead, the aim is to undermine our confidence that experiences in the waking category need be produced by external objects. In both categories of experience, our (internalist relevant) cognitive access extends only to the productive result, but not to the productive process. On what basis, then, do we suppose that external objects play any more a role in producing the experiences in the waking category than those in the dreaming category? It is not unthinkable that "there may be," says the meditator, "some other faculty not yet fully known to me, which produces these ideas without any assistance from external things; this is, after all, just how I have always thought ideas are produced in me when I am dreaming" (Med. 3, AT 7:39). Granting, then, that we are not unshakably certain that our "waking" experiences are produced by external objects, all of our experiences might be dreams of a sort.

The sceptical consequences of this Always Dreaming Doubt are considerably more potent: if we are not unshakably certain that external objects contribute to the production of our "waking" ideas of them, then (thinks Descartes) we are not unshakably certain that there even are any such external objects. Our best evidence for the existence of an external world of tables and chairs, and the like, comes from our preconceived opinions as to the role of external objects in producing our ideas of them.

All these considerations are enough to establish that it is not reliable judgement but merely some blind impulse that has made me believe up till now that there exist things distinct from myself which transmit to me ideas or images of themselves through the sense organs or in some other way. (Med. 3, AT 7:39-40)
The two dreaming doubts are parasitic on the same Similarity Thesis, though their sceptical consequences differ. The Now Dreaming Doubt invokes the universal conceivability of delusion: for any one of my sensory experiences, it's not unthinkable that the experience is delusive. The Always Dreaming Doubt invokes the conceivability of universal delusion: it's not unthinkable that all my sensory experiences are delusions (say, from a God's-eye perspective).

3.2. Meta-Cognitive Doubts.

Though dreaming doubts undermine a significant number of Knowledge claims, Descartes regards them as only moderately hyperbolic. His most hyperbolic doubt undermines everything the weaker doubts do, and more. Some readers might have thought to ask, "What's left to undermine?" The meditator proposes a response: "whether I am awake or asleep, two and three added together are five, and a square has no more than four sides. It seems impossible that such transparent truths should incur any suspicion of being false." (Med. 1, AT 7:20) Descartes' next doubt is intended to defeat even these claims.

(It's tempting to read Descartes as holding that only a priori judgments (i.e. in the post-Kantian sense) survive dreaming doubts--that the eventual foundations of Knowledge will be exclusively a priori. It emerges in the Second Meditation, however, that a posteriori judgments (as, e.g., concerning the present contents of consciousness) can be among our epistemic best (cf. §5.3 below). It would be more accurate to say that Descartes regards dreaming doubts as having their most damaging undermining impact on judgments of external sense.)

Suppose that our cognitive equipment is flawed and our intellectual faculties are no more reliable than a broken calculator--that we're "wired" (as it were) to compute even simple matters in error. In that case, even those matters that seem most evident (as e.g. those surviving dreaming doubts) might well be false notwithstanding their apparent status as supremely evident. According to Descartes, "the most serious doubt [arises] from our ignorance about whether our nature might not be such as to make us go wrong even in matters which seemed to us utterly evident" (Prin. 1.30, AT 8a:16). If we do not have unshakable certainty as to the perfect reliability of our cognitive equipment, observes Descartes, then there is nothing so evident as to escape doubt. Call this doubt about the reliability of our cognitive faculties Meta-Cognitive Doubt (MCD).

(Note: If the very credibility of our cognitive equipment is in doubt, how could we ever gain Knowledge by means of such equipment? Descartes thinks this is what makes hyperbolic doubt so insidious, and why we should regard his eventual solution as so brilliant.)

Lest the reader suppose that even (mere) hypothetical doubt should not be pressed this far, Descartes presents a dilemma intended to motivate MCD. Either the design of our cognitive faculties ultimately traces to an all-powerful creator, or it does not. Assuming it does, then for all we Know this omnipotent creator might be a "malign genius" who intentionally designed us with cognitive flaw; a creator this powerful "could have given me a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident" (AT 7:36). On the other hand, given the opposite assumption (as to the omnipotence of the creator), we're no better off--as Descartes explains in the First Meditation:

Perhaps there may be some who would prefer to deny the existence of so powerful a God rather than believe that everything else is uncertain. ... yet since deception and error seem to be imperfections, the less powerful they make my original cause, the more likely it is that I am so imperfect as to be deceived all the time. (AT 7:21).
Today's reader is likely to try blocking the second horn of dilemma--appealing to a natural selection account, perhaps even forgiving Descartes for not having the benefit of Darwinian theory. But natural selection accounts guarantee, at best, that an organism is as fit as the local competition--a result that does not preclude our having cognitive flaw.

The typical reader in Descartes' own day would have instead tried to block the first horn of the dilemma--appealing to then-standard doctrines about the nature of God, as being not only omnipotent but also omnibenevolent: "God would not have allowed me to be deceived in this way, since he is said to be supremely good" (Med. 1, AT 7:21). Anticipating this move, Descartes poses the so-called problem of evil, as applied to error: "if it were inconsistent with [God's] goodness to have created me such that I am deceived all the time, it would seem equally foreign to his goodness to allow me to be deceived even occasionally; yet this last assertion cannot be made" (ibid.). This reductio ad absurdum is supposed to raise doubts as to whether the existence of an omnipotent and omnibenevolent creator is compatible with the undisputed occurrence of (at least) occasional error. And so, this kind of effort to block MCD fails, that is unless the reader already has an unshakably certain solution to the problem of evil.

(A common interpretive mistake is to suppose that, according to Descartes, it would take an omnipotent evil genius in order to undermine our confidence in our epistemic best. Descartes' handling of the above dilemma, along with a perusal of the various texts in which he discusses his radical doubt (cf. AT 3:64-65, 7:21, 7:36, 7:70, 7:77, 8a:6, 8a:9-10, 8a:16), shows that the evil genius plays an ancillary role to the more fundamental worry about cognitive flaw.)

Having reflected on the dilemma, Descartes' meditator states: "I have no answer to these arguments, but am finally compelled to admit that there is not one of my former beliefs about which a doubt may not properly be raised; and this is not a flippant or ill-considered conclusion, but is based on powerful and well thought-out reasons" (Med. 1, AT 7:21).

Doubt is now both hyperbolic and universal. Since Descartes regards the refutation of MCD as essential to epistemic warrant, it emerges that a requirement of Knowledge is that the would-be Knower have an unshakable confidence in the perfect reliability of his cognitive equipment. In §5.2, we return to a consideration of MCD and the indirect manner in which it calls matters into doubt.

Further reading: On Descartes' sceptical arguments, see Bouwsma (1949), Curley (1978), Newman (1994), Newman and Nelson (1999), Williams (1986), and Wilson (1978). For a more general philosophical treatment of dreaming arguments, see Dunlap (1977).

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4. Cogito ergo sum

Famously, Descartes holds that the occurrence of thought guarantees the existence of a thinker. A version of this insight appears in every published work in which he treats scepticism--unlike the canonical slogan, ‘cogito ergo sum’ (‘je pense, donc je suis’, ‘I think therefore I am’). As illustrated early in the Second Meditation, the purported insight has it that though the existence of my body is subject to doubt, the existence of me--qua thinker--looks to withstand even the most hyperbolic of doubts: let the evil genius "deceive me as much as he can, he will never bring it about that I am nothing so long as I think that I am something" (AT 7:25). The very attempt to doubt one's own existence turns out self-stultifying: every such effort is an occurrence of thought; in turn, the occurrence of thought requires a thinker, albeit only a minimally construed thinker. Descartes regards the cogito (as I shall refer to it) as the "first and most certain of all to occur to anyone who philosophizes in an orderly way" (Prin. 1.7, AT 8a:7).

The cogito has generated an enormous literature--both pro and con. Though the relevant issues are far too numerous and difficult to address here in a systematic way, a few points of clarification might help to preclude some of the philosophic and interpretive mistakes that have ensnared many a critic. I'll restrict my observations concerning the cogito to its treatment by Descartes in contexts of systematic doubt.

First, a first-person formulation is essential to the success of the cogito. Third-person claims, such as "Icarus thinks," or even "Descartes thinks," are not unshakably certain--not for me, at any rate; only the occurrence of my own thought has a chance of resisting hyperbolic doubt. There are a number of passages in which Descartes refers to a third-person version of the cogito, but none of these occur in the context of trying to establish categorically the existence of a particular thinker (as opposed merely to the conditional existence of whatever thinks).

Second, the cogito is intended to involve the occurrence of cogitatio (i.e. cogitation or thinking, or consciousness more generally). Any mode of thinking will do: doubt, understanding, affirmation, denial, volition, imagination, sensation, or the like (cf. Med. 2, AT 7:28). Non-cogitative occurrences, on the other hand, will not work. For instance, it won't suffice to reason that "I exist since I am walking," because hyperbolic doubt calls into question the existence of my legs. A simple revision, as "I exist since it seems I'm walking," restores the anti-sceptical potency (cf. Replies 5, AT 7:352).

A caveat is in order. That Descartes rejects the indubitability of such formulations, as those that presuppose the existence of body, commits him to nothing more than an epistemological distinction, but not yet an ontological distinction (not to mention a real, or substantial distinction), between mind and body. Indeed, on the heels of the cogito, Descartes has his meditator say:

And yet may it not perhaps be the case that these very things which I am supposing to be nothing [e.g., "that structure of limbs which is called a human body"], because they are unknown to me, are in reality identical with the "I" of which I am aware? I do not know, and for the moment I shall not argue the point, since I can make judgements only about things which are known to me. (Med. 2, AT 7:27)
Third, and related to this last quotation, is that Descartes' reference to an "I" (ego), in the "I think" (cogito), is not intended to presuppose the existence of a substantial self. Indeed, in the very next sentence following the initial statement of the cogito, the meditator says: "But I do not yet have a sufficient understanding of what this ‘I’ is, that now necessarily exists" (Med. 2, AT 7:25). What function, then, does the "I" serve in the evidential claim "I think"? Many a critic has complained that in referring to the "I" Descartes begs the question, since he presupposes what he intends to establish in "I exist." Bertrand Russell objects that "the word ‘I’ is really illegitimate"; that Descartes should have, instead, stated "his ultimate premiss in the form ‘there are thoughts’." As Russell adds, "the word ‘I’ is grammatically convenient, but does not describe a datum." (1945, 567) Accordingly, "there is pain" and "I am in pain" have different contents, and Descartes is entitled only to the former.

On behalf of Descartes, it seems that such objections fail to consider fully the subjective character of experience. There surely is something more to the experience of pain than what "there is pain" conveys. The additional feature is the subject of the pain, a subjective character that minimally includes a point-of-view. If we take Descartes to be using ‘I’ to designate this subjective character of consciousness--but not yet designating anything like a substantial self (as Descartes' express qualifications indicate he intends)--then there is no question begging: rather than being smuggled in, the "I"-ness of consciousness turns out to be (contra Russell) a primary datum of experience. Taking the "I" in this minimalist, subjective sense, introspection reveals (as Descartes writes) that the various modes of thinking all seem to have "one and the same ‘I’," as their subject (Med. 2, AT 7:28). Of course, for all Descartes' meditator Knows (at this early stage of the inquiry), the "I" might well turn out to be indicative of nothing more than a Humean bundle, or perhaps even a committee of substantial selves. But whatever the eventual outcome, vis-à-vis the ontological status of the self, the "I" can be read as a placeholder for what is a primary datum of experience.

Fourth, the necessity of Descartes' claim, that "I am, I exist" is true "whenever it is put forward by me or conceived in my mind," can be read as having a performatory aspect. There is no formal inconsistency in the suggestion that I might never have existed. But there is a conceptual repugnance, or what Hintikka calls an "existential inconsistency," in actually having or performing the thought that I--qua subject of my thoughts--do not exist. As such, the certainty of the cogito endures only as long as the performance: "for it could be," says the meditator, "that were I totally to cease from thinking, I should totally cease to exist" (Med. 2, AT 7:27).

Fifth, much of the debate over whether the cogito is intended to involve inference or simple intuition (roughly self-evidence), rests on one of two kinds of mistake--one interpretive, the other philosophic. The interpretive mistake is in focusing on the absence of an express ‘ergo’ (‘therefore’) in the Meditations account: this is surely a mistake, since this is the one place (of his various published treatments of the cogito) where Descartes does his reader the favor of elaborating the line of inferential reflection that is left implicit in the comparatively elliptical accounts that include an express ‘ergo’ (or ‘donc’). The philosophic mistake is in supposing that the cogito must either involve inference or intuition, but not both. There is no inconsistency in the view that the meditator comes to appreciate the persuasive force of the cogito by means of inferential reflection, while also holding that his eventual conviction is not grounded in inference. (A common theme among rationalists is that the genesis of assent need not serve as its ground.) Moreover, what one intuits might well include an inference (as is widely held of modus ponens).

Finally, insofar as the cogito does involve inference, many readers of Descartes have worried that the inference is invalid. It is far from clear, however, that a worry this strong is well-founded. In view of its unique (aforementioned) features, the cogito is not amenable to a straightforward characterization in first-order logic. Presumably, formal validity is a special case of a more general conception of validity (perhaps such, that the denial of a conclusion is inconceivable on the condition of a premise set); otherwise we'd have no means of identifying which forms were valid. That having been said, an inference may be valid even if it is not formally valid.

A final observation about the relation between the cogito and Descartes' search for unshakable foundations. We earlier observed (cf. §2) that the method of doubt is intended to complement the method of foundationalism by making possible the identification of bona fide first principles. This observation suggests that the foundations of Descartes' foundationalism need not be prima facie self-evident, a suggestion confirmed by his treatment of the cogito. If anything in the Meditations is prima facie self-evident, the cogito is. But, as the third paragraph of the Second Meditation reveals, Descartes intends that the cogito emerges from inferential reflection.

Further reading: See the second and third sets of Objections and Replies. See also Beyssade (1993), Hintikka (1962), and Markie (1992).

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5. Epistemic privilege

The method of doubt promises only to avoid error. Among Descartes' further desiderata is a positive criterion--a set of internal marks/criteria the occurrence of which guarantee truth. The cogito provides grounds for optimism, in that further reflection on its impressiveness might yield this desideratum.

In the present Section, we first consider Descartes' candidate truth criterion. We then consider the indirect sense in which even the privileged judgments grounded in this candidate criterion are defeasible by means of MCD. Finally, we confront the well discussed doctrine that judgments about the mind are epistemically privileged compared with those about body.

5.1. Our epistemic best: clear and distinct perception.

Descartes opens the Third Meditation by observing that the impressiveness of the cogito is owed to its being clearly and distinctly perceived (AT 7:35). Later texts indicate both an epistemic and a psychological benefit of such perception. While in the midst of clear and distinct attention, our evidence is complete (i.e. by the lights of our cognitive nature); the perceived matter is understood as true (cf. AT 7:36, 7:38, 7:56ff). Moreover, on the occasion of clear and distinct understanding, our assent is compelled--we "cannot but assent to these things, at least so long as" we continue to so perceive them (Med. 5, AT 7:65; cf. 7:36, 7:69). Elsewhere, Descartes defines clarity and distinctness:
A perception which can serve as the basis for a certain and indubitable judgement needs to be not merely clear but also distinct. I call a perception "clear" when it is present and accessible to the attentive mind--just as we say that we see something clearly when it is present to the eye's gaze and stimulates it with a sufficient degree of strength and accessibility. I call a perception "distinct" if, as well as being clear, it is so sharply separated from all other perceptions that it contains within itself only what is clear. (Prin. 1.45, AT 8a:21-22)
He adds that "a concept is not any more distinct because we include less in it; its distinctness simply depends on our carefully distinguishing what we do include in it from everything else" (Prin. 1.63, AT 8a:31).

Since our evidentially best ground is clarity and distinctness, if anything will issue as the mark of truth, clarity and distinctness will. It thus emerges as Descartes' candidate truth criterion: "I now seem [videor] to be able to lay it down as a general rule that whatever I perceive very clearly and distinctly is true" (Med. 3, AT 7:35). I shall call this general criterion the C&D Rule. The announcement of the candidate criterion is carefully tinged with caution (videor), as the C&D Rule has yet to be subjected to hyperbolic doubt. Should it turn out that clarity and distinctness--as ground--is shakable, then, writes Descartes, being grounded in clarity and distinctness "would not be enough to make me certain of the truth of the matter" (ibid.).

5.2. The defeasibility of even our epistemic best.

Notwithstanding its evidential impressiveness, Descartes thinks that matters grounded in clarity and distinctness are defeasible and thus are not (yet) sufficiently warranted for Knowledge. Earlier, we introduced Meta-Cognitive Doubt (MCD). In the Fourth paragraph of the Third Meditation (a passage widely discussed by commentators), the doubt resistance of judgments grounded in clarity and distinctness is measured against MCD. Even these privileged judgments are defeasible, though only in an indirect way. During moments of clear and distinct attention, we're incapable of doubt; upon turning our attention away, we're able to entertain doubt by noticing the shakability of our confidence in the reliability of our cognitive equipment.
But what about when I was considering something very simple and straightforward in arithmetic or geometry, for example that two and three added together make five, and so on? Did I not see at least these things clearly enough to affirm their truth? Indeed, the only reason for my later judgement that they were open to doubt was that it occurred to me that perhaps some God could have given me a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident. And whenever my preconceived belief in the supreme power of God comes to mind, I cannot but admit that it would be easy for him, if he so desired, to bring it about that I go wrong even in those matters which I think I see utterly clearly with my mind's eye. Yet when I turn to the things themselves which I think I perceive very clearly, I am so convinced by them that I spontaneously declare: let whoever can do so deceive me, he will never bring it about that I am nothing, so long as I continue to think I am something; or make it true at some future time that I have never existed, since it is now true that I exist; or bring it about that two and three added together are more or less than five, or anything of this kind in which I see a manifest contradiction. (Med. 3, AT 7:36; italics added)
On a very natural reading of this notoriously difficult passage, Descartes appears to be subjecting even the cogito to the indirect doubt invoked by MCD. The plausibility of this reading is bolstered by the very character of MCD: whether our epistemic best states are described as being "directly intuited by the mind's eye," or "revealed by the lights of our cognitive nature" (the lumen naturale), or "clearly and distinctly perceived," or the like, such cognitive states are cognitive; if the hypothesis of cognitive flaw renders even our cognitive best states subject to hyperbolic doubt, it would seem that the cogito is no exception. There is, however, considerable debate about this amongst commentators; indeed, it is widely held that the cogito is intended to be immune to any form of doubt.

Putting aside the debate about the cogito, there is little dispute that Descartes intends that some clearly and distinctly perceived matters are subject to MCD. The indirect manner of their defeasibility deserves further comment. There are two modes of doubting invoked by Descartes. In some cases, the perceiver may entertain doubt while attending to the dubious matter; e.g., I may doubt whether the tower in the distance is square or round, even while attending very carefully to my perception of it (cf. Med. 6, AT 7:76). Call this a direct doubt. In other cases, the perceiver is capable of doubt only when redirecting attention away from the perceived matter; e.g., in order to undermine such matters as 2+3=5, the meditator (in the above passage) must turn his attention away from them--a redirecting of attention that enables him to focus on his lack of confidence in the reliability of his cognitive faculties. Call this an indirect doubt.

At the end of §2, we noted that Descartes conceives Knowledge as fully indefeasible. This is to say that he conceives Knowledge as being immune to both direct and indirect doubts. While clearly and distinctly attending to a matter, it is not subject to direct doubt; such matters are, however, subject to indirect doubt, so long as one can perform Descartes' most hyperbolic doubt--MCD. Even though such matters are so evidentially impressive that we "see a manifest contradiction" in denying them, this is not yet sufficient warrant for Knowledge, if we're able to doubt the credibility of the cognitive equipment by means of which we apprehend such evidence. In closing the above passage (in the last block quote), Descartes concedes that his indirect doubt (MCD) is "a very slight and, so to speak, metaphysical" doubt, but he adds nonetheless that so long as we're uncertain as to whether a veracious God exists, as opposed to one who endows us with cognitive flaw, we "can never be quite certain about anything else" (AT 7:36).

What next? How are we to make epistemic progress if even our epistemic best is subject to hyperbolic doubt? Perhaps the one, seemingly hopeful note is that we're able--even in the face of hyperbolic doubt--to construct anti-sceptical arguments that are psychologically compelling for so long as they are clearly and distinctly perceived (they resist direct doubt). But these same anti-sceptical arguments are then subject to indirect doubt, by MCD, as soon as we turn our attention away from them. On one plausible reading of the anti-sceptical arguments of the Third and Fourth Meditations, Descartes intends that his meditator is "progressing" (by means of psychological compulsion) by attending clearly and distinctly to these arguments--attempting to demonstrate the existence of an all-perfect creator who guarantees the C&D Rule. On this interpretation, however, the anti-sceptical effort would appear to be both Sisyphean (since subject to later, indirect doubts) and circular (since relying on that which he attempts to establish, namely the criterion of clarity and distinctness). In §6 we return to a more detailed consideration of such problems. Before doing so, let's stray a bit from the project of philosophizing "in an orderly way" and consider a Cartesian doctrine that has received much attention in its subsequent history.

5.3. The epistemic privilege of judgments about the mind.

In our natural, pre-reflective condition, Descartes thinks we're apt to confound mind and body in a manner that obstructs our ability to perceive with clarity and distinctness. The confusion is clearly expressed (Descartes would say) in a 1925 essay written by G. E. Moore, "A Defence of Common Sense":
I begin, then, with my list of truisms, every one of which (in my own opinion) I know, with certainty, to be true. ... There exists at present a living human body, which is my body. This body was born at a certain time in the past, and has existed continuously ever since ... But the earth had existed also for many years before my body was born ... (1962, 32-33)
In contrast, Descartes writes:
[I]f I judge that the earth exists from the fact that I touch it or see it, this very fact undoubtedly gives even greater support for the judgement that my mind exists. For it may perhaps be the case that I judge that I am touching the earth even though the earth does not exist at all; but it cannot be that, when I make this judgement, my mind which is making the judgement does not exist. (Prin. 1.11, AT 8a:8-9)
The method of doubt is intended to help us appreciate the folly of the commonsensical position--assisting us in recognizing that the perception of our own minds is "prior to" and "more evident" than that of our own bodies. As the cogito is supposed to show, Knowledge claims (as Moore's) are subject to doubts to which claims about the existence of our own cogitation is immune. "Disagreement on this point," adds Descartes, comes from "those who have not done their philosophizing in an orderly way"; from those who, while properly acknowledging the "certainty of their own existence," mistakenly "take ‘themselves’ to mean only their bodies"--failing to "realize that they should have taken ‘themselves’ in this context to mean their minds alone" (Prin. 1.12, AT 8a:9). Reflection on reasons for doubt helps us ascertain that our own bodies are part of the external world--that our direct cognitive access reaches no further than states of consciousness.

We observed earlier (cf. §3) that a full sceptical diagnosis is intended to reveal the comparative shakability of various kinds of judgments, thereby exposing which kinds are most suitable as the building materials of Knowledge. By way of example, suppose there are two elevators available to you. You have grounds for doubting the integrity of the electrical wiring in the elevator on the left (but not in the elevator on the right); both elevators, however, have a cable of dubious integrity. Under these circumstances, the elevator on the right is clearly more conducive to safety (other things equal). An analogous point holds when comparing judgments about the body and those about the mind: the array of First Meditation doubts reveals that, though both kinds of judgments are subject to doubt at some level, judgments about the mind are subject to less kinds of doubt than those about the body. Our very best judgments of external sense are subject to direct doubt (by dreaming doubts) and to indirect doubt (by MCD); our very best judgments about the mind are subject only to indirect doubt.

This mind-is-better-known-than-body doctrine seems, for Descartes, to be motivated in part by his understanding of the new mechanistic science. As one of its pioneers, he gleaned epistemic consequences for our judgments about body from the mechanical causal story involved in sensory perception, as well as from the new mechanical conception of body. According to Descartes' theory of sensation, our physiological organs and nerves serve as mediating links that stand (spatially and causally) between the tables and limbs (and the like) that we perceive and the brain events that occasion our perceptual awareness of them (cf. Prin. 4.196). He thinks mechanism helps explain how non-veridical perception--e.g. dreams of colored tables, and pains in phantom limbs--can be occasioned by physiological processes largely similar to those that occasion veridical perception; indeed, he thinks the Similarity Thesis (cf. §3.1) has scientific support.

[I]t is the soul which sees, and not the eye; and it does not see directly, but only by means of the brain. That is why madmen and those who are asleep often see, or think they see, various objects which are nevertheless not before their eyes: namely, certain vapours disturb their brain and arrange those of its parts normally engaged in vision exactly as they would be if these objects were present. (Optics, AT 6:141; cf. Med. 6., AT 7:83ff; Passions 26)
Moreover, according to the new science, bodies have no properties that resemble the qualitative features of our conscious experience of them (specifically, what would later be called secondary qualities, as e.g. the color "of" a table, and the pain "in" one's foot). The famous wax passage (at the end of the Second Meditation) is supposed to help show that our clear and distinct ideas of body include "none of the features" that we arrive at "by means of the senses" (AT 7:30). Sofar as internalist-relevant evidence is concerned, all that sensory experience avails us of is a glimpse of our own minds, a glimpse that largely misrepresents the real properties of external things.

Notwithstanding the undisputed role our nervous systems play in mediating our perception of tables and chairs (and even bracketing that sensory images of tables and chairs bear little resemblance to the supposed scientific image), there is considerable philosophical controversy concerning in what respects sense perception should be regarded as direct/immediate as opposed to indirect/mediated. Since, when looking through a window, say, at a tree, one's perception is of or about the tree rather than of/about the window, it seems one's perception is intentionally direct, and might remain direct even upon adding additional mediating panes of glass. Moreover, the same perception is likely to be inferentially direct, in that one's judgments about the tree do not become inferentially (more) complex in virtue of adding mediating panes of glass. Indeed, it would be misleading to characterize the judgment forming process as follows: "Aha, I see that the additional panes of glass are clean, and not tinted, and are thus not corrupting my perception of the tree." In view of such considerations, why would one hold that the mediation of our nervous systems is of epistemological importance?

One kind of reply open to Descartes lies in the evidentially relevant difference between the mediation of our nervous systems and that in our example of adding panes of glass: the former case, unlike the latter, is not such that we could compare our sensory perception of a tree both with and without such mediation in order to check for a corrupting influence. This means that the mediation of our nervous systems renders our sensory apprehension of tables and chairs as--essentially--evidentially incomplete. By means of our senses, we could never have Knowledge as to whether our sensory ideas accurately represent the external objects they purport to be of. The evidential problem thus far characterized holds even for materialist ontologies and is intensified with dualism. Some version or other of the mind-is-better-known-than-body doctrine is widely embraced in the 17th century.

On a slightly different note, it is generally overlooked that the mind-is-better-known-than-body doctrine is intended to convey a comparative rather than a superlative thesis. For Descartes, the only superlative state is that of clarity and distinctness: only it is correctly characterized as "our cognitive best"; and only it is regarded as a promising candidate for an infallible criterion of truth. Though the better-known doctrine entails that introspective judgments (i.e. those concerning the present contents of consciousness) are privileged, Descartes regards them as nonetheless subject to error. Even introspective perception--e.g. of occurrent pains and other sensations--must be rendered clear and distinct to be among our cognitive best. Such matters are clearly and distinctly perceivable, writes Descartes,

provided we take great care in our judgements concerning them to include no more than what is strictly contained in our perception--no more than that of which we have inner awareness. But this is a very difficult rule to observe, at least with regard to sensations. (Prin. 1.66, AT 8a:32; cf. 1.68)
Indeed, we do "frequently make mistakes, even in our judgements concerning pain" (Prin. 1.67), since "people commonly confuse this perception [of pain] with an obscure judgement they make concerning the nature of something which they think exists in the painful spot and which they suppose to resemble the sensation of pain" (Prin. 1.46, AT 8a:22). Not only are introspective judgments error prone, introspective reports provide an additional source of error, since we may "attach our concepts to words which do not precisely correspond to real things" (Prin. 1.74, AT 8a:37).

Though Descartes is quite clear (as these texts show) as to the fallibility of introspective judgments, contemporary thinkers widely attribute to him a variety of related doctrines that he rejects. Compare the doctrines of the infallibility of the mental--roughly, the doctrine that sincere introspective judgments are always true; the indubitability of the mental--roughly, that sincere introspective judgments are indefeasible; and omniscience with respect to the mental--roughly, that one has Knowledge of every true proposition about one's own present contents of consciousness. (There is some variation in the way these doctrines are formulated in the literature.)

The widespread attribution of such doctrines to Descartes appears to stem from two Meditations texts in which he says, of examples of introspective claims, that they cannot be false strictly speaking. In each case, however, the larger context suggests a reconciliation of these claims with the fallibility conceded in the above cited passages. The first text (Med. 2) follows immediately on the heels of a reflective procedure of analysis intended to strip away every feature of introspection except that which is clearly and distinctly perceived--the very same procedure to which Descartes alludes, in Principles 1.66 (cf. the last block quote). Where the analysis has been run successfully (and in context we're to assume that the meditator has been successful), Descartes thinks that there is no room left for an appearance-reality gap: that we "seem to see, to hear, and to be warmed" (again, in the context of a successful stripping away) is what "having a sensory perception" just is, in the "restricted sense" (i.e. the mental part of sense perception) (AT 7:29). The second text that has misled interpreters (Med. 3) can be read as alluding to the very same stripping away procedure, and Descartes carefully adds the following qualification (as to our perception of such ideas): "provided they are considered solely in themselves and I do not refer them to anything else" (AT 7:37). So, in both texts the claimed epistemic privilege is conditional on successfully performing the requisite introspection. Not just any sincere effort at introspection will suffice: the internalist-relevant criterion of success is clarity and distinctness, not sincerity.

One final thought on the subject of epistemic privilege. As has been stressed, clear and distinct perception is the superlative epistemic state of privilege. But how are we to be sure that we're in a perceptual state of bona fide clarity and distinctness? As Gassendi complains, Descartes owes us a "method to guide us" as to "when we are mistaken and when not," when we suppose we "clearly and distinctly perceive something" (Objs. 5, AT 7:279). In his reply, Descartes acknowledges the need and adds: "I carefully provided such a method in the appropriate place, where I first eliminated all preconceived opinions and afterwards listed all my principal ideas, distinguishing those which were clear from those which were obscure or confused" (AT 7:362).

Further reading: On discussions of truth criteria in the 16th and 17th centuries, see Popkin (1979). On Descartes' doctrine of ideas, see Chappell (1986), Hoffman (1996), Jolley (1990), and Nelson (1997). On the indirect doubt of matters perceived clearly and distinctly (including the cogito), see Newman and Nelson (1999). On contemporary treatments of infallibility, indubitability, and omniscience, see Alston (1989) and Audi (1993). For a historical anticipator of Descartes' mind-is-better-known-than-body doctrine, see Augustine's Contra Academicos.

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6. Cartesian Circle

Returning to the project of philosophizing "in an orderly way," we left the meditator (at the end of §5.2) seemingly unable to make epistemic progress in the face of hyperbolic doubt. He can construct compelling, anti-sceptical arguments, but they are subject to later, indirect doubt by means of MCD. In his Principles treatment, Descartes summarizes the problem:
The mind, then, knowing itself, but still in doubt about all other things, looks around in all directions in order to extend its knowledge further. First of all, it finds within itself ideas of many things; and so long as it merely contemplates these ideas and does not affirm or deny the existence outside itself of anything resembling them, it cannot be mistaken. Next, it finds certain common notions from which it constructs various proofs; and, for as long as it attends to them, it is completely convinced of their truth. ... But it cannot attend to them all the time; and subsequently, when it happens that it remembers a conclusion without attending to the sequence which enables it to be demonstrated, recalling that it is still ignorant as to whether it may have been created with the kind of nature that makes it go wrong even in matters which appear most evident, the mind sees that it has just cause to doubt such conclusions, and that the possession of certain knowledge [scientiam] will not be possible until it has come to know the author of its being. (Prin. 1.13, AT 8a:9-10)
(Note: Translations typically obscure the fact that Descartes is careful to use different terms when referring to weaker forms of knowledge/knowing than when referring to the strong form which we're signaling with an uppercase ‘K’ (i.e. scientia). In the above passage, for instance, only in that occurrence of "knowledge"-talk that has been expressly marked does Descartes refer to scientia as opposed to some weaker concept as cognitio.)

Descartes' meditator thus constructs arguments in an effort to show that the "author of his being" did not endow him with a flawed cognitive nature--a seemingly hopeless effort, since these same proofs are subject to indirect doubt by MCD. Included in the effort is Descartes' Third Meditation proof of the existence of God, and a further proof intended to establish that God guarantees the perfect reliability of the C&D Rule (Med. 4). Both of these proofs present difficult interpretive and philosophic problems that we'll not here consider. In the present treatment, we'll instead focus our attention on the broader line of reasoning which, quite famously, appears to involve circularity--the so-called Cartesian Circle. The apparent circle is defined by two arcs:

(1) I am certain that God exists only because I am certain of whatever I clearly and distinctly perceive.

(2) I am certain of whatever I clearly and distinctly perceive only because I am certain that God exists.

There is wide agreement amongst commentators that Descartes' procedure is not viciously circular in the manner suggested by a bald reading of (1) and (2). There is less agreement, however, both as to how Descartes avoids circularity, and as to what extent his procedure provides a satisfactory solution to the sceptical problem (this, even when granting the exceedingly permissive assumption that the component Third and Fourth Meditation proofs are themselves sound). It would be useful to isolate the issues about which there's fairly general agreement amongst commentators, from those about which there's not. Towards this end, let's first try to show why (1) and (2) misrepresent Descartes' procedure, by exposing an ambiguity in the italicized phrase--some such diagnosis is either explicit or implicit in much of the secondary literature. We'll then be in position to clarify the remaining interpretive problems on which commentators are divided, problems that arise in connection with the Third and Fourth Meditation proofs being subject to indirect doubt.

Both (1) and (2) involve an expression of confidence as to the credibility of clarity and distinctness: I am certain of whatever I clearly and distinctly perceive. Call this the Certainty Thesis. The Certainty Thesis turns out to be ambiguous between the following two claims:

(3) I am certain that p, if I clearly and distinctly attend to p (and its proof, if any).

(4) I am certain that the C&D Rule is perfectly reliable, if I clearly and distinctly attend to it and its proof.

The certainty expressed in (3) stems from the evidential impressiveness of clearly and distinctly understood matters (cf. §5.1): "my nature is such that so long as I perceive something very clearly and distinctly I cannot but believe it to be true" (Med. 5, AT 7:69). As such, this certainty does not depend on having established a divine guarantee of the perfect reliability of the C&D Rule; indeed, the certainty of atheist geometers stems from (3).

The claim in (4) is a substitution instance of (3). The consequent of (4) expresses a confidence in the C&D Rule as would result from carefully attending to a supporting demonstration--a demonstration that Descartes claims an atheist could not produce. Such certainty is derivative of that expressed in (3). Accepting (3), however, does not presuppose a commitment to there being any such demonstration as would provide for the confidence expressed in (the consequent of) (4).

In the ambiguity of the Certainty Thesis lies the key to dissolving the Cartesian Circle. Descartes' procedure might at first appear to define the arcs of (1) and (2), but it actually unfolds (in part) as a subtle effort to use the certainty of (3) as a fulcrum on which to lever compelling anti-sceptical arguments in the pursuit of (4). To the extent that the two "arcs" (better: "stages") properly characterize the project, the express statement of the Certainty Thesis has a different sense in each stage. One can characterize the first stage by means of (1), so long as the Certainty Thesis is understood as referring to (3). So understood, (1) might be rewritten (though somewhat awkwardly):

(1prime) I am certain that God exists only because (I am certain that p, if I clearly and distinctly attend to p and its proof).

As for the second stage, one can characterize it by means of (2), so long as the express statement of the Certainty Thesis, there, is understood as referring to (4). So understood, (2) might be rewritten (again, somewhat awkwardly):

(2prime) (I am certain that the C&D Rule is perfectly reliable, if I clearly and distinctly attend to it and its proof) only because I am certain that God exists.
Since, according to Descartes, the C&D Rule rests on a divine guarantee, the meditator's eventual, demonstrative confidence in its perfect reliability is parasitic on earlier steps (in connection with (1prime)) establishing the existence of God. What prevents circularity is that the proof of the C&D Rule (in connection with (2prime)) is not intended to provide for (atheist-available) confidence stemming from (3), nor does the appeal to God (in (2prime)) rest on the divinely guaranteed C&D Rule. Naturally, a preferred characterization of the two stages would not use numerically the same express language to signify two, importantly different certainty theses. Making the point by means of (1prime) and (2prime) amounts to an exercise showing that it is possible (even though misleading) to characterize Descartes' project by means of the express Certainty Thesis in (1) and (2): the two stages, as expressed in (1) and (2), would form a bona fide circle only if the Certainty Thesis had the same sense in both cases; their correct sense is represented by (1prime) and (2prime), but these do not define a circle.

Granting that Descartes' project is not circular in the manner of (1) and (2), significant problems remain. Since, as already noted, the anti-sceptical proofs (even if non-circular) remain subject to indirect doubt by means of MCD, it is unclear how these proofs are supposed to contribute to a final solution to the sceptical problem. Indeed, it is unclear how they are supposed to provide even for epistemic progress: prior to reflection on the proofs of God, clearly and distinctly perceived matters resist direct doubt while being vulnerable to indirect doubt; subsequent to reflection on these same proofs (and granting they are recognized as sound), it appears to remain the case that clearly and distinctly perceived matters resist direct doubt while being vulnerable to indirect doubt. To put the interpretive puzzle in terms of a comparison that Descartes is fond of, it is unclear in what respect a theist geometer (one who's successfully worked through the Meditations) is epistemically advantaged over an atheist geometer. As we've thus far set-up the interpretive issues, it would appear that the theist has no epistemic advantage over the atheist insofar as the best proofs of each are vulnerable to indirect doubt. Yet Descartes is adamant that the atheist does not have Knowledge of the matters he clearly and distinctly perceives, precisely "since no act of awareness that can be rendered doubtful seems fit to be called knowledge [scientia]" (Replies 2, AT 7:141).

An obvious desideratum of an adequate interpretation is to avoid this unsavory result. What all existing interpretations share in common is the (implicit) assumption that unless the undermining effects of Descartes' indirect doubt (MCD) are somehow mitigated, there is in principle no way to have the fully indefeasible Knowledge he purports to attain; and no way to account for the alleged epistemic advantage enjoyed by the theist. A useful way of understanding the disagreement amongst interpreters is in terms of how/where they think the mitigation is to occur. The interpretive camps that have emerged rally around two kinds of strategies for mitigating the effects of MCD. Both kinds of strategy achieve a mitigation of MCD by exempting a category of judgments from its sceptical reach. The one strategy involves antecedent exemption, the other involves subsequent exemption.

(Note: There are many possible taxonomies of the views in the voluminous literature. I pick this particular taxonomy, since it best clarifies that none of the interpretive efforts thus far succeeds in attributing to Descartes what he should regard as an adequate response to the sceptic. For another recent taxonomy, see Loeb (1992).)

According to interpretations involving antecedent exemption, Descartes preempts at the outset the problem of indirect doubt by exempting from MCD a class of first principles. He then constructs his anti-sceptical demonstrations out of steps consisting of items from the exempted class. That each step in a demonstration is exempted from MCD is evidently thought to ensure that the resulting conclusion is also immune, thus allowing Descartes to use a foundationalist architecture to build up to Knowledge. Among the texts that are often cited on behalf of antecedent exemption is a Second Replies passage in which Descartes says, of very "simple" and "transparently clear" matters, including the cogito and other axioms, that "we cannot doubt them without at the same time believing they are true; that is, we can never doubt them" (AT 7:145-46)--suggesting that he regards these matters as immune even to indirect doubt.

According to interpretations involving subsequent exemption, Descartes initially allows that hyperbolic doubt is universal such that even simple axioms are subject to indirect doubt; the exemption then kicks-in later, at the level of superstructure. In short, subsequent to careful reflection on the theistic proofs, further contemplation of MCD no longer moves us to doubt. The claim is not that clear and distinct perception is now immune to indirect doubt. Rather, the interpretation seems to have it that hyperbolic worries (as MCD) are no longer regarded as being of epistemic significance. Interpreters in this camp are impressed by the following, late Fifth Meditation passage:

Now, however, I have perceived that God exists, and at the same time I have understood that everything else depends on him, and that he is no deceiver; and I have drawn the conclusion that everything which I clearly and distinctly perceive is of necessity true. Accordingly, even if I am no longer attending to the arguments which led me to judge that this is true, as long as I remember that I clearly and distinctly perceived it, there are no counter-arguments which can be adduced to make me doubt it, but on the contrary I have true and certain knowledge of it. And I have knowledge not just of this matter, but of all the matters which I remember ever having demonstrated, in geometry and so on. (Med. 5, AT 7:70)
On one recent subsequent exemption account, Descartes is interested in anti-sceptical reproducibility: so long as the meditator retains an on-demand ability to reproduce the demonstration of the C&D Rule, it provides him all the anti-sceptical oomph that Descartes thinks one needs for Knowledge. On another subsequent exemption account, Descartes is interested in establishing a mere reflective coherence sufficient to induce a general confidence in the reliability of our cognitive equipment: prior to reflecting on the existence and nature of God, we lack this reflective coherence; subsequent to such reflection, we no longer need be troubled by the hyperbolic doubts of the First Meditation.

Significant problems face all exemption strategies. Such declarations of exemption (whether antecedent or subsequent) seem hopelessly arbitrary: there appears to be no principled basis on which to exclude a class of cognitive states (whether axioms or theorems) from a doubt so hyperbolic that it undermines the reliability of our cognitive equipment. Moreover, exemption strategies seem irreconcilable with Descartes' systematic insistence that there can be no atheistic Knowledge: antecedent exemption opens the door for an atheist meditator to build up to Knowledge from a foundation of exempted first principles (since these are equally available to him); subsequent exemption, in fudging on issues of indirect doubt, sets a precedent that arguably allows the atheist meditator to similarly fudge. Finally, exemption strategies are difficult to reconcile with Descartes' somewhat strident claims to being the first philosopher to have decisively refuted the sceptic on the sceptic's own terms--terms that Descartes clarifies as requiring immunity to indirect doubts.

Further reading: (Note: The foregoing discussion is in large part excerpted from Newman and Nelson (1999).) See the Fourth Replies for Descartes' express response to charges of circularity; see the Fifth Meditation, Second Replies, and the letter to Regius (24 May 1640), for texts on his intended, final solution to doubt. For examples of antecedent exemption accounts, see Kenny (1968), (Morris 1973), and Wilson (1978). For examples of subsequent exemption accounts, see DeRose (1992) and Loeb (1992), both of whom offer reproducibility accounts; Frankfurt (1970) and Sosa (1997a and 1997b), both of whom offer reflective coherence accounts; and Curley (1978 and 1993). For an interpretation that involves neither antecedent nor subsequent exemption, see Newman and Nelson (1999). For an anthology devoted largely to the Cartesian Circle, see Doney (1987). For a treatment of the Fourth Meditation contribution to the demonstration of the divine guarantee of the C&D Rule, see Newman (1999).

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7. Proving the existence of the external, material world

Granting that Descartes has laid a theistic foundation for Knowledge--specifically, the divine guarantee of the C&D Rule--he attempts to expand his clear and distinct perception to encompass the existence of the external, material world. The attempt builds on a familiar strategy in the history of philosophy, an appeal to the involuntariness of sensory experience. Let's first consider the familiar strategy and its defect in the face of First Meditation doubt, and then consider Descartes' effort to repair it.

The familiar strategy turns on the following prima facie plausible inference: some of our sensory experiences come to us involuntarily; therefore, they are caused by things external to us.

I know by experience that these ideas do not depend on my will, and hence that they do not depend simply on me. Frequently I notice them even when I do not want to: now, for example, I feel the heat whether I want to or not, and this is why I think that this sensation or idea of heat comes to me from something other than myself, namely the heat of the fire by which I am sitting. (Med. 3, AT 7:38)
In spite of its seeming plausibility, the inference falls prey to First Meditation doubt.
Then again, although these [apparently adventitious] ideas do not depend on my will, it does not follow that they must come from things located outside me. Just as the impulses which I was speaking of a moment ago seem opposed to my will even though they are within me, so there may be some other faculty not yet fully known to me, which produces these ideas without any assistance from external things; this is, after all, just how I have always thought ideas are produced in me when I am dreaming. (Med. 3, AT 7:39; italics added)
The familiar inference presupposes exactly what is in dispute--namely, that our seemingly involuntary ideas are not caused by some hidden faculty of our minds, some unconscious mental component. But according to the Always Dreaming Doubt, what we take as normal, waking experiences might well be another kind of dreaming, whereby the conscious images of "waking" life are fictitious inventions of our minds; such images might well be produced by some unknown, immaterial (internal) faculty. (This unknown faculty hypothesis can also be motivated by the supposition of an evil genius who endowed us with cognitive equipment by which we're inevitably misled.) Thus, as a first step in repairing the familiar argument, Descartes thinks we need to refute the sceptical hypothesis that our involuntary sensory experiences are produced by an unknown, internal faculty.

By the time of the Sixth Meditation, Descartes has new premises at his disposal, premises which he thinks block the unknown faculty scenario. Among the metaphysical theses developed throughout the Meditations is that mind and body have distinct essences; that the essence of thinking substance is pure thought/consciousness/awareness, while the essence of body is pure extension. Writes Descartes, "nothing can be in me, that is to say, in my mind, of which I am not aware," and this "follows from the fact that the soul is distinct from the body and that its essence is to think" (31 Dec. 1640, AT 3:273). This result makes possible the following line of reasoning. Since the essence of mind is awareness, it follows that there can be no hidden mental occurrences--no unconscious happenings of the mind. As such, if the cause of my seemingly involuntary sensory ideas were a faculty in me, I would be aware of this faculty on the occasion of its operations. But I am not aware of the operations of any such faculty. Thus, the cause of the ideas is not in me qua thinking thing. "I proved the existence of material things," says Descartes, "not from the fact that we have ideas of them but from the fact that these ideas come to us in such a way as to make us aware that they are not produced by ourselves" (August 1641, AT 3:428-29). The cause of such ideas

cannot be in me, since clearly it presupposes no intellectual act [viz. a volition] on my part, and the ideas in question are produced without my cooperation and often even against my will. So the only alternative is that it is in another substance distinct from me ... (Med. 6, AT 7:79)
Granting Descartes his moves thus far, it still remains to be shown that this external cause of our involuntary sensory ideas is a body. There are three possible options. The external cause is (a) corporeal/material substance (just as it seems), (b) some other non-material creature, or (c) God.
But since God is not a deceiver, it is quite clear that he does not transmit the ideas to me either directly from himself, or indirectly, via some creature ... For God has given me no faculty at all for recognizing any such source for these ideas; on the contrary, he has given me a great propensity to believe that they are produced by corporeal things. It follows that corporeal things exist. (Med. 6, AT 7:79-80)
The inference here is quite troubling to the interpreter: in view of the epistemic duty (emerging from the Fourth Meditation) that we withhold assent except when our perception is clear and distinct, Descartes would appear to be straying from those rigorous standards earlier enforced. The worry is apt. The above line of reasoning does not have the meditator clearly and distinctly perceiving straightaway that option (a) is correct. Rather, he appears to be drawing a roundabout conclusion on the basis of a perception with credentials significantly less impressive than clarity and distinctness; the perception doing the evidential work is said to yield a (mere) "great propensity" to judge that (a) is the correct option.

According to one interpretation (that we'll not here elaborate), Descartes is not in fact straying from his earlier standards. Rather, the Fourth Meditation demonstration of the C&D Rule proceeds by means of steps that license the inference that he is here making. On this reading, in the Fourth Meditation Descartes establishes a divine guarantee of the infallible truth of a judgment, that p, whenever (as the above text indicates):

(i) I am positively inclined to assent to p; and
(ii) I have no faculty/capacity for correction by which I could ascertain that not-p.
(There are hard questions, e.g. as to the nature on this inclination, that find no straightforward answers in the texts. As will emerge, Descartes again calls on this same inferential move in his effort to prove that he is not dreaming.)

Even granting this interpretation, potential problems loom. Since the procedure allows that mere propensity/inclination producing perceptions can result in Knowledge, it threatens to prove too much. Not only are we "inclined" to judge that corporeal things (in general) exist, we're also inclined to form particular existential judgments, as that this table and that chair exist; indeed, we're inclined to judge that such bodies have qualitative properties (as color, sound, taste, etc). But Descartes' own mechanist principles entail that bodies have only quantitative properties (primary qualities, as size, shape, motion, etc.). And on the assumption that I'm now dreaming (Descartes has yet to rebut the Now Dreaming Doubt) there might not even be any particular bodies quite like those now appearing to me. How, then, does Descartes prevent his argument from establishing these further results that he regards as unwarranted?

In the continuation of the last quoted passage, Descartes qualifies the conclusion of his argument:

They [bodies] may not all exist in a way that exactly corresponds with my sensory grasp of them, for in many cases the grasp of the senses is very obscure and confused. But at least they possess all the properties which I clearly and distinctly understand, that is, all those which, viewed in general terms, are comprised within the subject-matter of pure mathematics. (Med. 6, AT 7:80)
Issues of interpretation are difficult here. Descartes may hold that the second of the two conditions above--(ii), concerning whether we have a faculty/capacity for correction--is what gives him the proper result without proving too much: since he thinks we do have the ability to ascertain that bodies aren't colored, our "inclination" to suppose they are colored is not conclusive; and since we do have the ability to ascertain whether we are awake (as he later discusses), we'd need to do so before forming Knowledge-worthy judgments as to the particular objects around us.

Further reading: See Descartes' Prin. 2.1 for a variation of his Sixth Meditation argument. On Descartes' treatment of the problem of the existence of the external, material world, see Friedman (1997), Garber (1992), and Newman (1994). On the respects in which the Sixth Meditation inference draws on Fourth Meditation work, see Newman (1999).

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8. Proving that one is not dreaming

As one nears the end of the Meditations, Descartes purports to have made astonishing anti-sceptical advances. None of these foregoing results, however, entails that the meditator is awake. It remains to be shown whether Knowledge extends this far. Descartes confronts the Now Dreaming Doubt in the closing paragraph of the Meditations.

It is tempting to read him as offering a wholly naturalistic solution to the problem, in the form of a Continuity Test: since continuity with past experiences holds only for one's waking experiences but not for one's dream experiences, checking for the requisite continuity reveals whether one is awake. The following passage can be read as suggesting this litmus test:

I now notice that there is a vast difference between [being asleep and being awake], in that dreams are never linked by memory with all the other actions of life as waking experiences are. ... But when I distinctly see where things come from and where and when they come to me, and when I can connect my perceptions of them with the whole of the rest of my life without a break, then I am quite certain that when I encounter these things I am not asleep but awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:89-90)
This "solution" prompts two obvious criticisms (both of which were raised by Hobbes, in the Third Objections). First, the solution runs contrary to Descartes' no-atheist-Knowledge thesis: since the Continuity Test involves no appeal to God, it appears, as Hobbes notes, "that someone can know he is awake without knowledge of the true God" (AT 7:196). Second, adds Hobbes, it seems one could dream the requisite continuity; i.e., one could "dream that his dream fits in with his ideas of a long series of past events," thus undermining the credibility of the Continuity Test (AT 7:195). Let's consider Descartes' reply to both objections.

As to the first, it turns out on closer inspection that the Continuity Test is used in conjunction with a theistic appeal. We saw earlier, in the proof of the external, material world, that Descartes invokes the following (divinely guaranteed) truth rule, namely that p is true whenever:

(i) I am positively inclined to assent to p; and
(ii) I have no faculty/capacity for correction by which I could ascertain that not-p.
In the final paragraph of the Sixth Meditation, while confronting the Now Dreaming Doubt, Descartes again appears to invoke this rule. The larger passage opens with the meditator discussing his various faculties for correcting sensory error.
I can almost always make use of more than one sense to investigate the same thing; and in addition, I can use both my memory, which connects present experiences with preceding ones, and my intellect, which has by now examined all the causes of error. Accordingly, I should not have any further fears about the falsity of what my senses tell me every day; on the contrary, the exaggerated doubts of the last few days should be dismissed as laughable. This applies especially to ... my inability to distinguish between being asleep and being awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:89)
Referring to the worry (that he's dreaming) as exaggerated suggests that condition (i) is met--that he's "positively inclined" to judge that he is awake. As such, he need only to establish condition (ii) and he'll have a divine guarantee of being awake. Thus, says the meditator (speaking of sensory appearances),
when I distinctly see where things come from and where and when they come to me, and when I can connect my perceptions of them with the whole of the rest of my life without a break, then I am quite certain that when I encounter these things I am not asleep but awake. And I ought not to have even the slightest doubt of their reality if, after calling upon all the senses as well as my memory and my intellect in order to check them, I receive no conflicting reports from any of these sources. For from the fact that God is not a deceiver it follows that in cases like these I am completely free from error. (Med. 6, AT 7:90; italics added)
Central to the inference is the meditator's effort to ascertain the correctness of the judgment towards which he is inclined, by means of his various faculties: the inclination is sufficient to warrant the judgment that he is awake, provided his faculties do not enable him to ascertain that he is instead dreaming. (Elsewhere Descartes remarks that, when "we are asleep and are aware that we are dreaming, we need imagination in order to dream, but to be aware that we are dreaming we need only the intellect"; Replies 5, AT 7:358-59.) The cases like these to which Descartes refers look to be those where conditions (i) and (ii) are both satisfied.

There are, then, multiple internalist criteria that Descartes discusses in connection with the Now Dreaming Doubt. Initially (in the First Meditation), the meditator draws the provisional, sceptical conclusion that "there are never any sure [internal] signs by means of which being awake can be distinguished from being asleep" (AT 7:19), a result of reflecting on the qualitative similarity between waking and dreaming (cf. the Similarity Thesis from §3.1). By the end of the Sixth Meditation, following an extended inquiry into dropsy-type error, he notices that we have an ability to cross-check various of our cognitive faculties in order to correct sensory errors that would have an adverse effect on the well-being of the body. This observation leads to the disclosure of the Continuity Test. Though the Continuity Test is available to an atheist meditator, this naturalistic criterion--alone--is insufficient to warrant that one is awake. As Descartes says to Hobbes, "an atheist can infer that he is awake on the basis of memory of his past life" (via the Continuity Test), but "he cannot know that this criterion is sufficient to give him the certainty that he is not mistaken, if he does not know that he was created by a non-deceiving God" (Replies 3, AT 7:196). The further internalist criteria to which Descartes thus appeals looks to be (i) and (ii); when combined with the Continuity Test, he thinks this further (divinely guaranteed) truth rule provides justification requisite for Knowledge.

True to form, then, Descartes' procedure does preclude atheistic Knowledge. There are, however, further questions as to how the procedure is supposed to work for the theist. This brings us to the second objection. As Descartes correctly notes, "a dreamer cannot really connect his dreams with the ideas of past events" in the successful manner required by the Continuity Test; yet, as Descartes concedes, the dreamer "may dream that he does" (Replies 3, AT 7:196). This reminds us of the more general problem that plagues internalist epistemologies: if it can seem to me that I'm in the requisite criterial state (e.g., the state of recognizing that I'm passing the Continuity Test), even on occasions when I'm not actually in the requisite state (e.g., I'm merely dreaming that I am), how can I rely on how things seem as a guide to truth? (Cf. the objection from Gassendi that we considered at the very end of §5.3.) Unfortunately, Descartes does not elaborate in his reply to Hobbes, and it is not at all clear how an adequate response would go. It is clear, however, that Descartes recognizes that even theists face difficulties in implementing his procedure for determining that one is awake, and he adds the following caveat as his closing remark in the Meditations:

But since the pressure of things to be done does not always allow us to stop and make such a meticulous check, it must be admitted that in this human life we are often liable to make mistakes about particular things, and we must acknowledge the weakness of our nature. (Med. 6, AT 7:90; italics added)

Further reading: See Newman (1999), Williams (1978), and Wilson (1978).

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a priori justification and knowledge | certainty | Descartes, René | Descartes, René: modal metaphysics | Descartes, René: theory of sensation | idealism | idealism: British | ideas | innate ideas | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | knowledge: analysis of | moral particularism | original position | perception: epistemological problems of | primary and secondary qualities | rationalism vs. empiricism | realism | reasoning: defeasible | sense-data | skepticism | truth


I am grateful to Robert Audi, for commenting on an earlier version of this article, and to Alan Nelson for discussions on many of the ideas here and for permission to excerpt from our joint work, in 1999.

Copyright © 1999
Lex Newman

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