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The Unity of Consciousness

Our consciousness evidences a striking unity. As we will see, unified consciousness can take more than one form but the following form is central. When we are conscious, we are conscious of the contents of a number of conscious states at the same time and as related to one another in various ways. I am aware not of A and, separately, of B and, separately, of C, but of A-and-B-and-C, all at the same time -- or better, as all parts of the contents of a single conscious state. Since at least the time of Kant (1781/7), this phenomenon has been called the unity of consciousness.

Historically, the notion of the unity of consciousness has played a very large role in thought about the mind. Indeed, as we will see, it figured centrally in some of the most influential arguments about the mind from the time of Descartes to the 20th century. In the early part of the 20th century, the notion largely disappeared for a time. Analytic philosophers began to pay attention to it again only in the 1960s. We will trace this history up to about 1900. At that point, we will have to delineate the unity of consciousness more carefully and examine some evidence from neuropsychology because both are necessary to understand the recent work on the issue. We will then examine that work. We will conclude with the question of whether consciousness' being unified has implications for other issues concerning consciousness and the mind.

1. History of the Notion

The unity of consciousness has had an interesting history in philosophy and psychology. Taking Descartes to be the first major philosopher of the modern period, the unity of consciousness was central to the study of the mind for the whole of the modern period until the 20th century. The notion figured centrally in the work of Descartes, Leibniz, Hume, Reid, Kant, Brentano, James -- indeed, in most of the major precursors of contemporary philosophy of mind and cognitive psychology. It played a particularly important role in Kant's work (Brook, 1994).

A couple of examples will illustrate the role that the notion of the unity of consciousness played in this long literature. Consider a classical argument for dualism (the view that the mind is not the body, indeed is not made out of matter at all). It starts like this:

When I consider the mind, that is say, myself inasmuch as I am only a thinking thing, I cannot distinguish in myself any parts, but apprehend myself to be clearly one and entire. [Descartes, 1641, p. 196]

Descartes then asserts that if the mind is not made up of parts, it cannot be made of matter, presumably because, as he saw it, anything material has parts. He then goes on to say that this would be enough to prove dualism by itself, had he not already proved it elsewhere. Notice where it is that I cannot distinguish any parts. It is in the unified consciousness that I have of myself.

Here is another, somewhat more elaborate argument based on unified consciousness. The conclusion will be that unified consciousness could never be achieved by any system of components acting in concert. William James' well-known version of the argument starts as follows:

Take a sentence of a dozen words, take twelve men, and to each one word. Then stand the men in a row or jam them in a bunch, and let each think of his word as intently as he will; nowhere will there be a consciousness of the whole sentence. [James, 1890, Vol. 1, p.160]

James generalizes this observation to all conscious states. To get dualism out of this, we need to add a premise: that if the mind were made out of matter, conscious states would have to be distributed over some group of components in some relevant way. But, this thought experiment is meant to show, conscious states cannot be so distributed. Therefore, the conscious mind is not made out of matter. Q.E.D. Call the argument that James is using here the Unity Argument. Clearly, the idea that our consciousness of, in this case, the parts of a sentence is unified is at the center of the Unity Argument. Like the first, this argument goes all the way back to Descartes. Versions of it can be found in thinkers otherwise as different from one another as Leibniz, Reid, and James. The Unity Argument continued to be influential into the 20th century. That the argument was considered to be a powerful reason for concluding that the mind is not the body is illustrated in a somewhat backhanded way by Kant's treatment of it (as he found it in Descartes and Leibniz, not James, of course).

Kant did not think that we could demonstrate anything about the nature of the mind, including whether or not it is made out of matter. To make the case for this view, he had to show that all existing arguments that the mind is not material do not work and he set out to do just this in the chapter in the Critique of Pure Reason on the Paralogisms of Pure Reason (1781) (paralogisms are faulty inferences about the nature of the mind). The Unity Argument is the target of a major part of that chapter; if one is going to show that we cannot know what the mind is like, we must dispose of the Unity Argument, which purports to show that the mind is not made out of matter. Kant's argument that the Unity Argument does not support dualism is simple. He urges that the idea of unified consciousness being achieved by something that has no parts or components is no less mysterious than its being achieved by a system of components acting together (1781, A352). Remarkably enough, even though no philosopher has ever met this challenge of Kant's and no account exists of what an immaterial mind not made out of parts might be like, philosophers continued to rely on the Unity Argument until well into the 20th century. It may be a bit difficult for us to capture this now but the idea that unified consciousness could not be realized by any system of components, and a fortiori any system of material components, had a strong intuitive appeal for a long time.

The notion that consciousness is unified was also central to one of Kant's own famous arguments, his ‘transcendental deduction of the categories’. In this argument, boiled down to its essentials, Kant claims that in order to tie various objects of experience together into a single unified conscious representation of the world, something that he simply assumed that we could do, we must be able to apply certain concepts to the items in question. In particular we have to apply concepts from each of four fundamental categories of concept: quantitative, qualitative, relational, and what he called ‘modal’ concepts. Modal concepts concern whether an item might exist, does exist, or must exist. Thus, the four kinds of concept are concepts for how many units, what features, what relations to other objects, and what existence status are represented in an experience.

It was relational concepts that most interested Kant and of relational concepts, he thought the concept of cause-and-effect to be by far the most important. Kant wanted to show that natural science (which for him meant primarily physics) was genuine knowledge (he thought that Hume's skeptical treatment of cause and effect relations challenged this status). He believed that if he could prove that we must tie items in our experience together causally if we are to have a unified awareness of them, he would have put physics back on "the secure path of a science". The details of his argument have exercised philosophers for over two hundred years. We will not go into them here, but the argument illustrates how central the notion of the unity of consciousness was in Kant's thinking about the mind and its relation to the world.

Even though the unity of consciousness had been at the center of pre-20th century research on the mind, early in the 20th century the notion almost disappeared. Logical atomism in philosophy and behaviorism in psychology were both unsympathetic to the notion. Logical atomism focused on the atomic elements of cognition (sense data, simple propositional judgments, etc.), rather than on how these elements are tied together to form a mind. Behaviorism urged that we focus on behavior, the mind being either a myth or at least something that we cannot and do not need to study in a science of the human person. This attitude extended to consciousness, of course. The philosopher Daniel Dennett summarizes the attitude prevalent at the time this way:

Consciousness appear[ed] to be the last bastion of occult properties, epiphenomena, immeasurable subjective states -- in short, the one area of mind best left to the philosophers. Let them make fools of themselves trying to corral the quicksilver of ‘phenomenology’ into a respectable theory. [1978, p. 149]

The unity of consciousness next became an object of serious attention in analytic philosophy only as late as the 1960s. In the years since, new work has appeared regularly. The accumulated literature is still not massive but the unity of consciousness has once again become an object of serious study. Before we examine the more recent work, we need to explicate the notion in more detail than we have done so far and introduce some empirical findings. Both are required to understand recent work on the issue.

2. What the Unity of Consciousness Is

To expand on our earlier notion of the unity of consciousness, we need to introduce a pair of distinctions. Current work on consciousness labors under a huge, confusing terminology. Different theorists talk about access consciousness, phenomenal consciousness, self-consciousness, simple consciousness, creature consciousness, state consciousness, monitoring consciousness, awareness as equated with consciousness, awareness distinguished from consciousness, higher order thought, higher order experience, qualia, the felt qualities of representations, consciousness as displaced perception, ... and on and on and on. We can ignore most of this profusion but we do need two distinctions: between consciousness of objects and consciousness of our representations of objects, and between consciousness of representations and consciousness of self.

Consciousness of objects is closely related to sentience and to being awake. It is (at least) being in a certain informationally and behaviorally responsive state to one's immediate environment. It is the ability, for example, to process and act responsively to information about food, friends, foes, and other items of relevance. One finds consciousness of objects in creatures much less complex than human beings. It is what we (at any rate first and primarily) have in mind when we say of some person or animal as it is coming out of a general anaesthesia, ‘It is regaining consciousness’. Consciousness of objects is not just any form of informational access to the world. It is knowing about, being conscious of, things in the world. We will return to this point in a moment.

We are conscious of our representations when we are conscious, not (just) of some object, but of our representations: ‘I am seeing [as opposed to touching, smelling, tasting] and seeing clearly [as opposed to dimly].’ Consciousness of our own representations it is the ability to process and act responsively to information about oneself, but it is not just any form of such informational access. It is knowing about, being conscious of, one's own psychological states. In Nagel's famous phrase (1974), when we are conscious of our representations, it is ‘like something’ to have them. If, as seems likely, there are forms of consciousness that do not involve consciousness of objects, they might well consist in consciousness of representations, though some theorists would insist that this kind of consciousness is not of representations either (via representations, perhaps, but not of them).

The distinction just drawn between consciousness of objects and consciousness of our representations of objects may seem to be similar to Block's (1995) well-known distinction between P- [phenomenal] and A- [access] consciousness. Here is his definition of ‘A-consciousness’: "A state is A-conscious if it is poised for direct control of thought and action" (1995, p. 233). He tells us that he cannot define ‘P-consciousness’ in any "remotely noncircular way" but will use it to refer to what he calls "experiential properties", what it is like to have certain states (1995, p. 231). Our consciousness of objects may appear to be rather like Block's A-consciousness. It is not. It is a form of P-consciousness. Consciousness of an object is -- how else can we put it? -- consciousness of the object. Even if consciousness just is informational access of a certain kind (something that Block would deny), it is not all forms of informational access and we are talking about conscious access here. Recall the idea that it is like something to have a conscious state. Other closely related ideas are that in a conscious state, something appears to one, that conscious states have a ‘felt quality’ (see the entry on qualia). A term for all this is phenomenology: conscious states have a phenomenology. (Thus some philosophers speak of phenomenal consciousness here.) We could now state the point we are trying to make this way. If I am conscious of an object, then it is like something to have that object as the content of a representation.

(Some theorists would insist that this last statement be qualified. While such a representation of an object may provide everything that a representation has to have for its contents to be like something to me, they would urge, something more is needed. Different theorists would add different elements. For some, I would have to be aware, not just of the object, but of my representation of it. For others, I would have to direct attention a certain way or something. We cannot go into this controversy here. Here we are merely making the point that consciousness of objects is more than Block's A-consciousness.)

Consciousness of self involves, not just consciousness of states that it is like something to have, but consciousness of the thing that has them, i.e., of oneself. It is the ability to process and act responsively to information about oneself, but again it is more than that. It is knowing about, being conscious of, oneself, indeed of oneself as oneself. Consciousness of oneself in this way is often called consciousness of oneself as the subject of experience. Consciousness of oneself as oneself seems to require an indexical ability and a rather special indexical ability at that, not just an ability to pick out something out but to pick something out as oneself. Human beings have such self-referential indexical ability. Whether any other creatures have it is controversial. The leading nonhuman candidate would be chimpanzees and other primates who have been taught enough language to use first-person pronouns.

The literature on consciousness sometimes fails to distinguish consciousness of objects, consciousness of one's own representations, and consciousness of self, or treats one of the three, usually consciousness of one's own representations, as the totality of consciousness. (There may also be conscious states that do not have objects, yet are not consciousness of a representation either. We cannot pursue that complication here.) The term ‘conscious’ and cognates are ambiguous in everyday English. We speak of someone regaining consciousness -- where we mean simple consciousness of the world. Yet we also say things like, ‘She wasn't conscious of what motivated her to say that’ -- where we do not mean that she lacked either consciousness of the world or consciousness of self but rather that she was not conscious of certain things about herself, specifically, certain of her own representational states. To understand the unity of consciousness, it is important to make these distinctions. The reason is this: the unity of consciousness takes a somewhat different form in consciousness of self than it takes in either consciousness of one's own representations or consciousness of objects.

So what is unified consciousness? As we said, the predominant form of the unity of consciousness is being aware of a number of things at the same time. Intuitively, this is the notion of a number of representations being aspects of a single encompassing conscious state. A more informative idea can be gleaned from the way philosophers have written about unified consciousness. As emerges from what they have said, the central feature of unified consciousness is taken to be something like this:

Unity of consciousness: A group of representations being related to one another such that to be conscious of any of them is to be conscious of others of them and of the group of them as a single group.

Call this notion UC(1). Now, unified consciousness of some sort can be found in all three of the kinds of consciousness we delineated. (It can be found in a fourth, too, as we will see in a moment.) We can have unified consciousness of: objects represented to us; the representations themselves; and oneself, the thing having the representations. In the first case, the represented objects would appear as aspects of a single encompassing conscious states. In the second case, the representations themselves would thus appear. In the third case, one is aware of oneself as a single, unified subject. Does UC(1) fit all three (or all four, including the fourth yet to be introduced)? It does not. At most, it fits the first two. Let us see how this unfolds.

2.1 Unity of consciousness of objects

Unified consciousness of objects is the consciousness that one has of the world around one (including one's own body) as aspects of a single world, of the various items in it as linked to other items in it. What makes it unified can be illustrated by an example. Suppose that I am aware of the computer screen in front of me and also of the car sitting in my driveway. If awareness of these two items is not unified, I will lack the ability to compare the two. If I cannot bring the car as I am aware of it to the state in which I am aware of the computer screen, I could not answer questions such as, Is the car the same color as the WordPerfect icon?, or even, As I am experiencing them, is the car to the left or to the right of the computer screen? We can compare represented items in these ways only if we are aware of both items together, as parts of the same field or state or act of conscious. That is what unified consciousness does for us. UC(1) fits this kind of unified consciousness well. There are a couple of disorders of consciousness in which this unity seems to break down or be missing. We will examine them shortly.

2.2 Unified consciousness of one's own representations

Unified consciousness of one's own representations is the consciousness that we have of our representations, consciousness of our own psychological states. The representations by which we are conscious of the world are particularly important but, if those theorists who maintain that there are forms of consciousness that do not have objects are right, they are not the only ones. What makes consciousness of our representations unified? We are aware of a number of representations together, in such a way that they appear as aspects of a single state of consciousness. As with unified consciousness of the world, here too we can compare items of which we have unified consciousness. For example, we can compare what it is like to see an object to what it is like to touch the same object. Thus, UC(1) fits this kind of unified consciousness well, too.

2.3 Unified consciousness of self

When one has unified consciousness of self, one is aware of oneself not just as the subject but, in Kant's words (A350), the ‘single common subject’ of a number of representations and the single common agent of various acts of deliberation and action.

This is one of the two forms of unified consciousness that UC(1) does not fit. When one is aware of oneself as the common subject of experiences, the common agent of actions, one is not aware of a number of objects. Some think that when one is aware of oneself as subject, one is not aware of oneself as an object at all. Kant held this view (A382, A402, B429). Whatever the merits of this view, it is clear that when one is aware of oneself as the single common subject of many representations, one is not aware of a number of things. Rather, one is aware of, and knows that one is aware of, one and the same thing -- via a number of representations. Call this kind of unified consciousness UC(2). Even though UC(2) is different from UC(1), we still have the core idea: unified consciousness consists in tying what is contained in a number of representations, in this case a number of representations of oneself, together so that they are all part of a single field or state or act of consciousness.

Unified consciousness of self has been argued to have some very special properties. In particular, there is a small but important literature on the idea that the reference to oneself as oneself by which one achieves awareness of oneself as subject involves no ‘identification’ (Castañeda, 1966; Shoemaker, 1968; Perry, 1979). Generalizing the notion a bit, some claim that reference to self does not proceed by way of attribution of properties or features to oneself at all. One argument for this view is that one is or could be aware of oneself as the subject of each and every one of one's conscious experiences. If so, awareness of self is not what Bennett calls ‘experience-dividing’ -- statements expressing it have "no direct implications of the form ‘I shall experience C rather than D’" (Bennett, 1974, p. 80). If this is so, the linguistic activities using first person pronouns by which we refer to ourselves as subject and the representational states that result have to have some unusual properties.

2.4 Unity of focus

Finally, as we said, we need to distinguish a fourth site of unified consciousness. Let us call it unity of focus. Unity of focus is our ability to pay unified attention to objects, one's representations, and one's own self. It is different from the other sorts of unified consciousness. In the other three situations, consciousness ranges over either many objects or many instances of consciousness of an object (in unified consciousness of oneself). Unity of focus picks out one such item (or a small number of them). Wundt captures what I have in mind well in his distinction between the field of consciousness (Blickfeld) and the focus of consciousness (Blickpunkt). The consciousness of a single item on which one is focusing is unified because one is aware of many aspects of the item in one state or act of consciousness (especially relational aspects, e.g., any dangers it poses, how it relates to one's goals, etc.) and one is aware of many different considerations with respect to it in one state or act of consciousness (goals, how well one is achieving them with respect to this object, etc.). UC(1) does not fit this kind of unified consciousness any better than it fit unified consciousness of self. Here too we are not, or need not be, aware of a number of items. Rather, one is integrating a number of properties of an item, especially properties that involve relationships to oneself, and integrating a number of one's abilities and applying them to the item, and so on. Call this form of unified consciousness UC(3). One way to think of the relationship of UC(3) (unified focus) to UC(1) and UC(2) is this. UC(3) occurs within UC(1) and UC(2) -- within unified consciousness of world and self.

Though this has often been overlooked, all forms of unified consciousness come in both simultaneous and across-time versions. That is to say, the unity can consist in links of certain kinds among phenomena occurring at the same time (synchronically) and it can consist in links of certain kinds among phenomena occurring at different times (diachronically). In its synchronic form, it consists in such things as our ability to compare items to one another, for example, to see if an item fits into another item. Diachronically, it consists in a certain crucial form of memory, namely, our ability to retain a representation of an earlier object in the right way and for long enough to bring it as recalled into current consciousness of currently represented objects in the same as we do with simultaneously represented objects. Though this process across time has always been called the unity of consciousness, sometimes even to the exclusion of the synchronic unity just delineated, another good name for it would be continuity of consciousness. Note that this process of relating earlier to current items in consciousness is more than, and perhaps different from, the learning of new skills and associations. Even severe amnesiacs can do the latter.

That consciousness can be unified across time as well as at a given time points up just how central unity of consciousness is to cognition. Without the ability to retain representations of earlier objects and unite them with current represented objects, most complex cognition would simply be impossible. The only bits of language that one would be able to understand, for example, would be single words; the simplest of sentences is an entity spread over time. Now, unification in consciousness might not be the only way to unite earlier cognitive states (earlier thoughts, earlier experiences) with current ones but it is certainly a central way and the one best known to us. The unity of consciousness is central to cognition.

2.5 Other Forms of Unity

We will close this section by noting that UC(1), UC(2) and UC(3) are not the only kinds of mental unity. Our remarks about UC(3), specifically about what can be integrated in focal attention, might already have suggested as much. There is unity in the exercise of our cognitive capacities, unity that consists of integration of motivating factors, perceptions, beliefs, etc., and there is unity in the outputs, unity that consists of integration of behavior.

Human beings bring a strikingly wide range of factors to bear on a cognitive task such as seeking to characterize something or trying to reach a decision about what to do about something. For example, we can bring to bear: what we want; what we believe; our attitudes to self, situation, and context; input from each of our various senses; information about the situation, other people, others' beliefs, desires, attitudes, etc.; the resources of however many languages we have available to us; various kinds of memory; bodily sensations; our various and very diverse problem-solving skills; and so on. Not only can we bring all these elements to bear, we can integrate them in a way that is highly structured and ingeniously appropriate to our goals and the situation(s) before us. This form of mental unity could appropriately be called unity of cognition. Unity of consciousness often goes with unity of cognition because one of our means of unifying cognition with respect to some object or situation is to focus on it consciously. However, there is at least some measure of unified cognition in many situations of which we are not conscious, as is testified by our ability to balance, control our posture, manoeuver around obstacles while our consciousness is entirely absorbed with something else, and so on.

At the other end of the cognitive process, we find an equally interesting form of unity, what we might call unity of behavior, our ability to coordinate our limbs, eyes, bodily attitude, etc. The precision and complexity of the behavioral coordination we can achieve would be difficult to exaggerate. Think of a concert pianist performing a complicated work.

3. Empirical Phenomena Related to Unified Consciousness

One of the most interesting ways to study psychological phenomena is to see what happens when they or related phenomena break down. Phenomena that look simple and seamless when functioning smoothly often turn out to have all sorts of structure when they begin to malfunction. Like other psychological phenomena, we would expect unified consciousness to be open to being damaged, distorted, etc., too. And if the unity of consciousness is as important to cognitive functioning as we have been suggesting, such damage or distortion should create serious problems for the people to whom it happens. The unity of consciousness is damaged and/or distorted in both naturally-occurring and experimental situations, and some of these situations are indeed very serious for those undergoing them.

In fact, unified consciousness can break down in what look to be two distinct ways. There are situations in which it is natural to say that one unified conscious being has split into two unified conscious beings without the unity itself being destroyed or even significantly damaged, and situations in which at all times we have one being with one instance of consciousness but the unity itself appears to be damaged or even destroyed. In the former cases, there is reason to think that a single instance of unified consciousness has become two (or something like two). In the latter cases, unity of consciousness has been compromised in some way but nothing suggests that anything has split.

3.1 Split Consciousness

First, situations in which we are inclined to say that something has split. Some such description seems natural in at least three different kinds of situation.

(1) Brain Bisection Operations

One is ‘brain bisection’ operations (commissurotomies), specifically certain results of them. In these operations, the corpus callosum is cut to stop the spread of epileptic seizures from one hemisphere to the other. The corpus callosum is a large strand of about 200,000,000 neurons running from one hemisphere to the other. When present, it is the chief channel of communication between the hemispheres. These operations, done mainly in the 1960s, were a last-ditch effort to control certain kinds of severe epilepsy by stopping seizures in one lobe of the cerebral cortex from spreading to the other lobe. Under certain laboratory conditions, two ‘centers of consciousness’ seem to appear in patients who have had this operation (Nagel, 1971; Marks, 1981). Here is a couple of examples of the kinds of behavior that prompt such an assessment.

The human retina is split vertically in such a way that the left half of the retina is primarily hooked up to the left hemisphere of the brain and the right half of the retina is hooded up to the right hemisphere of the brain. Now suppose that we flash the word TAXABLE on a screen in front of a brain bisected patient in such a way that the letters TAX hit one side of the retina, the letters ABLE the other and we put measures in place to ensure that the information hitting each retina stays in one lobe and is not fed to the other. If such a patient is asked what word is being shown, the mouth will say TAX while the hand controlled by the hemisphere that does not control the mouth (usually the left hand) will write ABLE. Or, if the hemisphere that controls a hand is asked to do arithmetic in a way that does not penetrate to the hemisphere that controls the mouth and the hands are shielded from the eyes, the mouth will insist that it is not doing arithmetic, has not even thought of arithmetic today, etc., -- while the appropriate hand is busily doing arithmetic! Notice that since the two ‘centers’ coexist and are active at the same time, whatever breach of unified consciousness there is in these cases is a breach of synchronically unified consciousness. These operations have received a huge amount of attention from philosophers in the past few decades and we will return to them.

(2) Hemi-neglect

Another phenomenon where we may find something like a split without diminished or destroyed unity is hemi-neglect, the strange phenomenon of losing all sense of one side of one's body or sometimes a part of one side of the body. Whatever it is exactly that is going on in hemi-neglect, unified consciousness remains. It is just that its ‘range’ has been bizarrely circumscribed. It ranges over only half the body (in the most common situation), not seamlessly over the whole body. Where we expect proprioception and perception of the whole body, in these patients they are of (usually) only one-half of the body.

(3) Dissociative Identity Disorder

A third candidate phenomenon is what used to be called Multiple Personality Disorder, now, more neutrally, Dissociative Identity Disorder (DID). Everything about this phenomenon is controversial, including whether there is any real multiplicity of consciousness at all, but one common way of describing what is going on in at least some central cases is to say that the units (whether we call them persons, personalities, sides of a single personality, or whatever) ‘take turns’, usually with pronounced changes in personality. When one is active, the other(s) usually is(are) not. If this is an accurate description, then here too we have a breach in unity of some kind in which unity is nevertheless not destroyed. Notice that whereas in brain bisection cases the breach, whatever it is like, is synchronic (at a time), here it is diachronic (across time), different unified ‘packages’ of consciousness taking turns, and the breach consists primarily in some pattern of reciprocal (or sometimes one way) amnesia -- some pattern of each ‘package’ not remembering having the experiences or doing the things had or done when another ‘package’ was in charge.

3.2 Shattered Consciousness

By contrast to brain bisection and DID cases, there are phenomena in which unified consciousness does not seem to split and does seem to be damaged or even destroyed altogether. In brain bisection and dissociative identity cases, the most that is happening is that unified consciousness is splitting into two or more relatively intact units -- two or more at a time or two or more across time. It is a matter of controversy whether even that is happening, especially in DID cases, but we clearly do not have more than that. In particular, the unity itself does not disappear; while it may split, we could say, it does not shatter. There are at least three kinds of case in which unity does appear to shatter.

(1) Schizophrenia

One is some particularly severe forms of schizophrenia. Here the victim seems to lose the ability to form an integrated, interrelated representation of his or her world and his or her self altogether. The person speaks in ‘word salads’ that never get anywhere, indeed sometimes never become complete sentences. The person is unable to put together integrated plans of actions even at the level necessary to obtain sustenance, tend to bodily needs, or escape painful irritants. And so on. Here, it seems more correct to say that unity of consciousness has shattered than split. The behavior of these people seems to express no more than what we might call experience-fragments, each lasting a tiny length of time and unconnected to any others. In particular, except for the (usually semantically irrelevant) associations that lead these people from each entry to the next in the word salads they create, to be aware of one of these states is not to be aware of any others -- or so the evidence suggests.

(2) Dysexecutive Syndrome

In schizophrenia of this sort, the shattering of unified consciousness is part of a general breakdown or deformation of mental functioning: affect, desire, belief, even memory all suffer massive distortions. In another kind of case, the normal unity of consciousness seems to be just as absent but there does not seem to be general disturbance of the mind. This is what some researchers call dysexecutive syndrome (Dawson, 1998, p. 215). What characterizes the breakdown in the unity of consciousness here is that subjects are unable to consider two things together, even things that are directly related to one another. For example, such people cannot figure out whether a piece of a puzzle fits into a certain place even when the piece and the puzzle are both clearly visible and the piece obviously fits. They cannot crack an egg into a pan. And so on.

(3) Simultagnosia

A disorder presenting similar symptoms is simultagnosia or Balint's syndrome (Balint was an earlier 20th century German neurologist). In this disorder, which is fortunately rare, patients see only one object located at one ‘place’ in the visual field at a time. Outside of a few ‘degrees of arc’ in the visual field, these patients say they see nothing and seem to be receiving no information (Hardcastle, in progress). In both dysexecutive disorder and simultagnosia (if we have two different phenomena here), subjects seem not to be aware of even two items in a single conscious state.

We can pin down what is missing in each case a bit more precisely. Recall the distinction between being conscious of individual objects and having unified consciousness of a number of objects at the same time introduced at the beginning of this article. Broadly speaking, we can think of the two phenomena isolated by this distinction as two stages. First, the mind ties together various sensory inputs into representations of objects. In contemporary cognitive research, this activity has come to be called binding (Hardcastle 1998 is a good review). Then, the mind ties these represented objects together to achieve unified consciousness of a number of them at the same time. (The first theorist to separate these two stages was Kant, in his doctrine of synthesis.) The first stage continues to be available to dysexecutive and simultagnosia patients: they continue to be aware of individual objects, events, etc. The damage seems to be to the second stage: it is the tying of objects together in consciousness that is impaired or missing altogether. The distinction can be made this way: these people can achieve some UC(S), unity of focus with respect to individual objects, but little or no unified consciousness of any of the three kinds over a number of objects.

The same distinction can also help make clear what is going on in the severe forms of schizophrenia just discussed. Like dysexecutive syndrome and simultagnosia patients, severe schizophrenics lack the ability to tie represented objects together, but they also seem to lack the ability to form unified representations of individual objects. In a different jargon, these people seem to lack even the capacity for object constancy. Thus their cognitive impairment is much more severe than that experienced by dysexecutive syndrome and simultagnosia patients.

With the exception of brain bisection patients, who do not evidence distortion of consciousness outside of specially contrived laboratory situations, the split or breach occurs naturally in all the patients just discussed. Indeed, they are a central class of the so-called ‘experiments of nature’ that are the subject-matter of contemporary neuropsychology. Since all the patients in whom these problems occur naturally are severely disadvantaged by their situation, this is further evidence that the ability to unify the contents of consciousness is central to proper cognitive functioning.

3.3 What Happens When Unified Consciousness Breaks Down?

Is there anything common to the six situations of breakdown in unified consciousness just sketched? And how do they relate to UC(1), UC(2) or UC(3)?

In brain bisection cases, the key evidence for a duality of some kind is that there are situations in which whatever is aware of some items being represented in the body in question is not aware of other items being represented in that same body at the same time. We looked at two examples of the phenomenon in Section 3 in connection with the word TAXABLE and the doing of arithmetic. With respect to these represented items, there is a significant and systematically extendable situation in which to be aware of some of these items is not to be aware of others of them. This seems to be what motivates the judgment in us that these patients evidence a split in unified consciousness. If so, brain bisection cases are a straightforward case of a failure to meet the conditions for UC(1). However, they are more than that. Because the ‘centers of consciousness’ created in the lab do not communicate with one another except in the way that any mind can communicate with any other mind, there is also a breakdown in UC(2). One subject of experience aware of itself as the single common subject of its experience seems to become two (in some measure at least).

In DID cases, a central feature of the case is some pattern of amnesia. Again, this is a situation in which being conscious of some represented objects goes with not being conscious of others in a systematic way. The main difference is that the breach is at a time in brain bisection cases, across time in DID cases. So again the breakdown in unity consists in a failure to meet the conditions for UC(1). However, DID being diachronic, there is also a breakdown in UC(2) across time -- though there is continuity across time within each personality, there seems to be little or no continuity, conscious continuity at any rate, from one to another.

The same pattern is evident in the cases of severe schizophrenia, dysexecutive disorder and simultagnosia that we considered. In all three cases, consciousness of some items goes with lack of consciousness of others. In these cases, to be aware of a given item is precisely not to be aware of other relevant items. However, in the severe schizophrenia cases we considered, there is also a failure to meet the conditions of UC(3).

Hemi-neglect is a bit different. Here we do not have two or more ‘packages’ of consciousness and we do not have individual conscious states that are not unified with other conscious states. (Not so far as we know -- for there to be conscious states not unified with the states on which the patient can report, there would have to be consciousness of what is going on in the side neglected by the subject with whom we can communicate and there is no evidence for this.) Here none of the conditions for UC(1), UC(2) or UC(3) fail to be met -- but that may be because hemi-neglect is not a split or a breakdown in unified consciousness in the first place. It may be simply a shrinking of the range of phenomena over which otherwise intact unified consciousness extends.

It is interesting that none of the breakdown cases we have considered evidence damage to or destruction of the unity in UC(2). We have seen cases in which unified consciousness it might split at a time (brain bisection cases) or over time (DID cases) but not cases in which the unity itself is significantly damaged or destroyed. Nor is our sample unrepresentative; the cases we have considered are the most widely discussed cases in the literature. There do not seem to be many cases in which it is plausible to say that UC(2), awareness of oneself as a single common subject, has been damaged or destroyed.

4. Recent Philosophical Work

4.1 The Kantian Approach

After a long hiatus, serious work on the unity of consciousness began in recent philosophy with two books on Kant, P. F. Strawson (1966) and Jonathan Bennett (1966). Both of them had an influence far beyond the bounds of Kant scholarship. (A second book by Bennett (1974) should also be mentioned). Central to these works is an exploration of the relationship between unified consciousness, especially unified consciousness of self, and our ability to form an integrated, coherent representation of the world, a linkage that the authors took to be central to Kant's transcendental deduction of the categories. Whatever the merits of the claim (see Brook 1994 for a skeptical judgment), their work set off a long line of writings on the supposed link. Sydney Shoemaker (1984 and 1996), Karl Ameriks (1983), Paul Guyer (1987), Patricia Kitcher (1990), and Quassim Cassam (1997) are some of the philosophers who have worked on unified consciousness from a broadly Kantian point of view. Quite recently the approach prompted a debate about unity and objectivity among Michael Lockwood, Susan Hurley and Anthony Marcel in Peacocke (1994) (note that ‘unity of consciousness’ even occurs in the book's title).

4.2 Philosophical Reflections on Brain Bisection Operations

Another issue that led philosophers back to the unity of consciousness, perhaps the next historically, was the neuropsychological results of brain bisection operations that we explored earlier. Starting with Thomas Nagel (1971) and continuing in the work of Charles Marks (1981), Derek Parfit (1971 and 1984), Lockwood (1989), Hurley (1998) and many others, these operations have been a major theme in work on the unity of consciousness since the 1970s. Much ink has been spilled on the question of what exactly is going on in the phenomenology of brain bisection patients. Nagel goes so far as to claim that there is no whole number of ‘centers of consciousness’ in these patients: there is too much unity to say "two", yet too much splitting to say "one".

Some recent work by Jocelyne Sergent (1990) might seem to support this conclusion. She found, for example, that when a sign ‘6’ was sent to one hemisphere of the brain in these subjects and a sign ‘7’ was sent to the other in such a way that crossover of information from one hemisphere to the other was extremely unlikely, they could say that the 6 is a smaller number than the 7 but could not say whether the signs were the same or different. It is not certain that Sergent's work does support Nagel's conclusions. First, Sergent's claims are controversial -- not all researchers have been able to replicate them. Second, even if the data are good, the interpretation of them is far from straightforward. In particular, they seem to be consistent with there being a clear answer to any precise ‘one or two?’ question that we could ask. (’Unified consciousness of the two signs with respect to numerical size?’ Yes. ‘Unified consciousness of the visible structure of the signs?’ No). If so, it is not obvious that the fact that there is mixed evidence, some pointing to the conclusion ‘one’, some pointing to the conclusion ‘two’, supports the view expressed by Nagel that there may be no whole number of subjects that these patients are.

Much of the work since Nagel has focused on the same issue of the kind of split that the laboratory manipulations of brain bisection patients induces. Some attention has also been paid to the implications of these splits. For example, could one hemisphere commit a crime in such a way that the other could not justifiably be held responsible for it? Or, if such splitting occurred regularly and was regularly followed by merging with ‘halves’ from other splits, what would the implications be for our traditional notion of what philosophers call ‘personal identity’, namely, being or remaining one and the same thing. (Here we are talking about identity in the philosopher's sense of being or remaining one thing, not in the sense of the term that psychologists use when they talk of such things as ‘identity crises’.)

Parfit has made perhaps the largest contributions to the issue of the implications of brain bisection cases for personal identity. Phenomena relevant to identity in things others than persons can be a matter of degree. This is well illustrated by the famous ship of Theseus example. Suppose that over the years, a certain ship in Theseus was rebuilt, board by board, until every single board in it has been replaced. Is the ship at the end of the process the ship that started the process or not? Now suppose that we take all those rotten, replaced boards and reassemble them into a ship? Is this ship the original ship of Theseus or not? Many philosophers have been certain that such questions cannot arise for persons ; identity in persons is completely clear and unambiguous, not something that could be a matter of degree as related phenomena obviously can be with other objects (Bishop Joseph Butler [1736] is a well-known example). As Parfit argues, the possibility of persons (or at any rate minds) splitting and fusing puts real pressure on such intuitions about our specialness; perhaps the continuity of persons can be as partial and tangled as the continuity of other middle-sized objects.

Lockwood's exploration of brain bisections cases goes off in a different direction, two different directions in fact (we will examine the second below). Like Nagel, Marks, and Parfit, Lockwood has written on the extent to which what he calls ‘co-consciousness’ can split. (’Co-consciousness’ is the term that many philosophers now use for the unity of consciousness; roughly, two conscious states are said to be co-conscious when they are related to one another as conscious states are related to one another in unified consciousness.) He also explores the possibility of psychological states that are not determinately in any of the available ‘centers of consciousness’ and the implications of this possibility for the idea of the specious present, the idea that we are directly and immediately aware of a certain tiny spread of time, not just the current infinitesimal moment of time. He concludes that the determinateness of psychological states being in an available ‘center of consciousness’ and the notion that psychological states spread over at least a small amount of time in the specious might well present stand or fall together.

4.3 Hurley on the Unity of Consciousness

Some philosophers interested in pathologies of unified consciousness examine more than brain bisection cases. In what is perhaps the most complex work on the unity of consciousness to date, Hurley examines most of the kinds of breakdown phenomena that we introduced earlier. She starts with an intuitive notion of co-consciousness that she does not formally define. She then explores the implications of a wide range of ‘experiments of nature’ and laboratory experiments for the presence or absence of co-consciousness across the psychological states of a person. For example, she considers acallosal patients (people born without a corpus callosum). When present, the corpus callosum is the chief channel of communication between the hemispheres. When it is cut, it is possible to generate what looks like two centers of consciousness, two internally co-conscious systems that are not co-consciousness with one another. (We examined the kind of evidence that leads to this appearance in Section 3.) Hurley argues that in patients in whom it never existed, things are not so clear. Even though the channels of communication in these patients are often in part external (behavioral cuing activity, etc.), the result may still be a single co-conscious system. That is to say, the neurological and behavioral basis of unified consciousness may be very different in different people.

Hurley also considers research by Trewarthen in which a patient is conscious of some object seen by, say, the right hemisphere until her left hand, which is controlled by the right hemisphere, reaches for it. Somehow the act of reaching for it seems to obliterate the consciousness of it. Very strange -- how can something pop into and disappear from unified consciousness in this way? This leads her to consider the notion of partial unity. Could two centers of consciousness, A and B, though not co-conscious with one another, nonetheless both be co-conscious with some third thing, e.g., the volitional system B (the system of intentions, desires, etc.). If so, ‘co-conscious’ is not a transitive relationship -- A could be co-conscious with B and C could be co-conscious with B without A being co-conscious with C. This is puzzling enough. Even more puzzling would be the question of how activation of the system B with which both A and C are co-conscious could result in either A or C ceasing to be conscious of an object aimed at by B.

Hurley's response to Trewarthen's cases (and also Sergent's cases that we examined in the previous section) is to accept that intention can obliterate consciousness and then distinguish time periods (1998, p. 216). At any given time in Trewarthen's cases, the situation with respect to unity is clear. That the picture does not conform to our usual expectations for diachronic singularity or transitivity then becomes simply an artefact of the cases, not a problem. It is not made clear how this reconciles Sergent's evidence with unity. One strategy would be the one we considered earlier: make the questions more precise. For precise questions, there seems to be a coherent answer about unity for every phenomenon Sergent describes.

Hurley also considers what she calls Marcel's case. Here subjects are asked to report the appearance of some item in consciousness in three ways at the same time -- say, by blinking, pushing a button, and saying, ‘I see it’. Remarkably, any of these acts can be done without the other two. And the question is, What does this imply for unified consciousness? In a case in which the subject pushes the button but neither blinks nor says anything, for example, is the hand-controller aware of the object while the blink-controller and the speech-controller are not? How could the conscious system become fragmented in such a way?

Hurley's suggestion is: they can't. What induces the appearance of incoherence about unity is the short time scale. Suppose that it takes some time to achieve unified consciousness, perhaps because some complex feedback processes are involved. If that were the case, then we do not have a stable unity situation in Marcel's case. The subjects are not given enough time to achieve unified consciousness of any kind (1998, p. 216).

There is a great deal more to Hurley's work. She urges, for example, that there a normative dimension to unified consciousness -- conscious states have to cohere for unified consciousness to result. And systems in the brain have to achieve she calls ‘dynamic singularity’ -- being a single system -- for unified consciousness to result.

4.4 The Binding Problem

A third issue that got philosophers working on the unity of consciousness again is binding (again, see Hardcastle's 1998 review). Here the connection is more distant because binding as usually understood is not unified consciousness as we have been discussing it. Recall the two stages of cognition laid out earlier. First, the mind ties together various sensory inputs into representations of objects. Then the mind ties these represented objects to one other to achieve unified consciousness of a number of them at the same time. It is the first stage that is usually called binding. The representations that result at this stage need not be conscious in any of the ways delineating earlier -- many perfectly good representations affect behavior and even enter memory without ever becoming conscious. Representations resulting from the second stage need not be conscious, either, but when they are, we have at least some of the kinds of unified consciousness delineated in Section 2.

4.5 Neurophysiology and the Unity of Consciousness

In the past few decades, philosophers have also worked on how unified consciousness relates to the brain. Lockwood, for example, thinks that relating consciousness to matter will involve more issues on the side of matter than most philosophers think. (We mentioned that his work goes off in two new directions. This is the second one.) Quantum mechanics teaches us that the way in which observation links to physical reality is a subtle and complex matter. Lockwood urges that our conceptions will have to be adjusted on the side of matter as much as on the side of mind if we are to understand consciousness as a physical phenomenon and physical phenomena as open to conscious observation. If it is the case not only that our understanding of consciousness is affected by how we think it might be implemented in matter but also that processes of matter are or can be affected by our (conscious) observation of them, then our picture of consciousness stands as ready to affect our picture of matter as vice-versa.

The Churchlands, Paul M. and Patricia S. (see for example P. M. Churchland 1995, p. 214), and Daniel Dennett (1991) have fairly radical views of the underlying architecture of unified consciousness. The Churchlands see unity itself much as other philosophers do. They do argue that the term ‘consciousness’ covers a range of different phenomena that need to be distinguished from one another but the important point here is that they urge that the architecture of the underlying processes probably consist not of transformations of symbolically encoded objects of representations, as most philosophers have believed, but of vector transformations in what are called phase spaces. Dennett articulates an even more radical view, encompassing both unity and underlying architecture. For him, unified consciousness is simply a temporary ‘virtual captain’, a small group of related information-parcels that happens to gain temporary dominance in a struggle for control of such cognitive activities as self-monitoring and self-reporting in the vast array of microcircuits of the brain. We take these transient phenomena to be more than they are because each of them is the ‘me’ of the moment; the temporary coalition of conscious states winning at the moment is what I am, is the self. Radical implementation, narrowed range and transitoriness notwithstanding, when unified consciousness is achieved, these philosophers tend to see it in the way we have presented it.

Dennett's and the Churchlands' views fit naturally with a dynamic systems view of the underlying neural implementation. The dynamic systems view is the view that unified consciousness is a result of certain self-organizing activities in the brain. Dennett thinks that given the nature of the brain, a vast assembly of neurons receiving electrochemical signals from other neurons and passing such signals to yet other neurons, cognition could not take any form other than something like a pandemonium of competing bits of content, the ones that win the competition being the ones that are conscious. The Churchlands don't tend to agree with Dennett about this. They see consciousness as a state of the brain, the ‘wetware’, not a result of information processing, of ‘software’. They also advocate a different picture of the underlying neurological process. As we said, they think that transformations of complex vectors in a multi-dimensional phase space are the crucial processes, not competition among bits of content. However, they agree that it is very unlikely that the processes that subserve unified consciousness are sentence-like or language-like at all. It is too early to say whether these radically novel pictures of what the system that implements unified consciousness is like will hold any important implications for what unified consciousness is or when it is present.

Hurley is also interested in the relationship of unified consciousness to brain physiology. It would be truer to say of her that she resists certain standard ways of linking them, however, than to say that she herself links them. In particular, while she clearly thinks that physiological phenomena have all sorts of implications and give rise to all sorts of questions about the unity of consciousness, she strongly resists any simplistic patterns of connection. Many researchers have been attracted by some variant of what she calls the isomorphism hypothesis. This is the idea that changes in consciousness will parallel changes in brain structure or function. She wants to insist, to the contrary, that often two instances of exactly the same change in consciousness will go with very different changes in the brain. We saw an example in the last section. In most of us, unified consciousness is closely linked to an intact, functioning corpus callosum. However, in acallosal people, there may be the same unity but achieved by mechanisms such as cuing activity external to the body that are utterly different from communication though a corpus callosum. Going the opposite way, different changes in consciousness can go with the same changes to structure and function in the brain.

4.6 Other Work

Two philosophers have gone off in directions different from any of the above, Stephen White (1991) and Christopher Hill (1991). White's main interest is not the unity of consciousness as such but what one might call the unified locus of responsibility -- what it is that ties something together to make it a single agent of actions, i.e., something to which attributions of responsibility can appropriately be made. He argues that unity of consciousness is one of the things that go into becoming unified as such an agent but not the only thing. Focused coherent plans, a continuing single conception of the good, reasonably good autobiographical memory, certain future states of persons mattering to us in a special way (mattering to us because we take them to be future states of ourselves, one would say if it were not blatantly circular), a certain continuing kind and degree of rationality, certain social norms and practices, and so on and so forth. In his picture of moral responsibility, unbroken unity of consciousness at and over time is only a small part of the story.

Hill's fundamental claim is that a number of different relationships between psychological states have a claim to be considered unity relationships, including: being owned by the same subject, being [phenomenally] next to (and other relationships that states in the field of consciousness appear to have to one another), both being the object of a single other conscious state, and jointly having the appropriate sorts of effects (functions). An interesting question, one that Hill does not consider, is whether all these relations are what interests us when we talk about the unity of consciousness or only some of them (and if only some of them, which ones). Hill also examines scepticism about the idea that clearly bounded individual conscious states exist. Since we have been assuming throughout that such states do exist, it is perhaps fortunate that Hill argues that we could safely do so.

In some circles, the idea that consciousness has a special kind of unity has fallen into disfavor. Nagel (1971), Donald Davidson (1982), and Dennett (1991) have all urged that the mind's unity has been greatly overstated in the history of philosophy. The mind, they say, works mostly out of the sight and the control of consciousness. Moreover, even states and acts of ours that are conscious can fail to cohere. We act against what we know perfectly well to be our own most desired course of action, for example, or do things while telling ourselves that we must avoid doing them. There is an approach to the small incoherencies of everyday life that does not requires us to question whether consciousness is unified in this way, the Freudian approach (e.g., Freud 1916/17). This approach accepts that the unity of consciousness exists much as it presents itself but argues that the range of material over which it extends is much smaller than philosophers once thought. This latter approach has some appeal. If something is out of sight and/or control, it is out of the sight or control of what? The answer would seem to be, the unified conscious mind. If so, the only necessary difference between the pre-twentieth century vision of unified consciousness as ranging over everything in the mind and our current vision of unified consciousness is that the range of psychological phenomena over which unified consciousness ranges has shrunk.

A final historical note. At the beginning of the 21st century, work on the unity of consciousness continues apace. For example, a major conference was recently devoted to the unity of consciousness, the Association for the Scientific Study of Consciousness Conference held in Brussels in 2000 (ASSC5) Encyclopedias of philosophy (such as this one) and of cognitive science are commissioning articles on the topic. Psychologists are taking up the issue. Bernard Baars (1988, 1997) notion of the global workspace is an example. Another example is work on the role of unified consciousness in precise control of attention. However, the topic is not yet at the center of consciousness studies. One illustration of this is that it can still be missing entirely in anthologies of current work on consciousness.

5. A Background Question

We will close with a different issue. As we saw, philosophers used to think that the unity of consciousness has huge implications for the nature of the mind, indeed entails that the mind could not be made out of matter. We also saw that the prospects for this inference are not good. What about the nature of consciousness? Does the unity of consciousness have any implications for this issue?

There are currently at least three major camps on the nature of consciousness. One camp sees the ‘felt quality’ of representations as something quite unique, in particular as quite different from the power of representations to change other representations and shape belief and action. On this picture, representations could function much as they do without it being like anything to have them. They would merely not be conscious. If so, consciousness may not play any important cognitive role at all, its unity included (Jackson 1986; Chalmers 1996). A second camp holds, to the contrary, that consciousness is simply a special kind of representation (Rosenthal 1991; Dretske 1995; Tye 1995). And a third holds that what we label ‘consciousness’ is really something else. On this view, consciousness will in the end be ‘analyzed away’ -- the term is too coarse-grained and presents things in too unquantifiable a way to have any use in a mature science of the mind (P. S. Churchland 1983).

It is not obvious that the unity of consciousness has strong implications for the truth or falsity of any of these views. If it is as central and undeniable as many have suggested (we saw some of the arguments earlier), its existence may cut against the third, eliminativist position a bit. With respect to the other two positions, the unity of consciousness seems neutral.

Whatever its implications for other issues, the unity of consciousness seems to be a real feature of the human mind, indeed central to it. If so, any complete picture of the mind will have to provide an account of it. Even those who hold that the extent to which consciousness is unified has been overrated owe us an account of what has been overrated.


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Andrew Brook

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