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Representational Theories of Consciousness

Consciousness is said in many ways. A theory "of consciousness" can be about practically anything mental; just look through the various current book series and anthologies and journals that feature the word "consciousness" in their titles. But the notions of consciousness addressed here will be only the following: (1) Conscious awareness of one's own mental states, and "conscious states" in the particular sense of: states whose subjects are aware of being in them. (2) "Phenomenal consciousness," as Block (1995) calls it, viz., being in a sensory state that has a distinctive qualitative or phenomenal character. (3) The matter of "what it is like" for the subject to be in a particular mental state, especially for that subject to experience a particular phenomenal property.

The idea of representation has been central in discussions of intentionality for many years, at least since Sellars (1956). But only more recently has it begun playing a major role in theories of consciousness. For each of the three foregoing notions of consciousness, some philosophers have claimed that that type of consciousness is entirely or largely explicable as a kind of representing.

§1: Awareness of One's Own Mental States

Occurrent mental or psychological states fall roughly into three categories: those whose subjects are aware of being in them; those whose subjects are not aware of being in them, but could have been had they taken notice; and those, such as language-processing states, which are entirely subterranean and inaccessible to introspection. A theory is needed to explain these differences.

Two Representational Theories of Awareness

There are two main representational theories of conscious awareness and conscious states. (Important terminological note:  Again, I am using the term "conscious state" to mean a mental state that one is aware of being in, and "awareness" as a term for that phenomenon. The phrase "conscious state" has been used in at least one entirely different sense, as by Dretske (1993). Failure to keep these senses straight can lead to much confusion.)  The two theories are the Lockean "inner sense" or "higher-order perception" (HOP) theory offered by Armstrong (1968, 1981) (see also Lycan (1987, 1996)), and the "higher-order thought" (HOT) theory defended by Rosenthal (1993) (see also Gennaro (1995) and Carruthers (2000)). According to each of the theories, a subject's awareness of her/his own mental state consists in a representing of that state itself. HOP has it that the representing is done quasi-perceptually, by a set of functionally specified internal attention mechanisms of some kind that scan or monitor first-order mental/brain states. HOT theorists say that merely having a thought about the first-order state will suffice, provided that the thought was directly caused by the state itself.

Each of HOP and HOT easily explains the differences between our three categories of first-order state; a state is, or is not, or could not be a conscious state accordingly as it itself is, or is not, or psychofunctionally could not be the object of a higher-order quasi-perception or thought. Further motivation for a representational theory of awareness is obvious enough as well:  In general, to be aware of any thing or state of affairs is to represent that item in some way, and to be unaware or unconscious of it is to fail to represent it. And when we deliberately introspect and thereby become aware of a first-order mental state that we had not realized we were in, the awareness is quasi-perceptual or at least takes the form of a mental state of some kind itself directed upon the first-order state; it feels as though we are "looking at" a particular sector of our cognitive or phenomenal field.

Some Criticisms of Representational Theories of Awareness

Two misguided objections to representational theories need to be warded off. First, it is sometimes complained that such theories do not in any way explain the qualitative or phenomenal character of experience; a mere higher-order representation could hardly bring a phenomenal property into being. So how can they claim to be theories of consciousness?  But it is no claim of either HOP or HOT (at least as I understand them here) to have explained anything about phenomenal character; they are theories only of the distinction between mental states one is aware of being in and mental states one is not aware of being in. Some other theory must be given of phenomenal character.

Second, some philosophers have feared a regress. If the second-order representation is to confer consciousness on the first-order state, it must itself be a conscious state; so there must be a third-order representation of it, and so on forever. But HOP and HOT theorists reject the opening conditional premise. The second-order representation need not itself be a conscious state.  (Of course, it may be a conscious state, if there does happen to be a higher-order representation of it in turn.)

But some further criticisms are not so easily rebutted. (I here ignore objections that apply selectively, to HOP alone or to HOT alone.)

Fallibility. Some philosophers have complained that representational theories leave introspective beliefs too fallible and underrate the privileged access we have to our own mental states. An internal monitor, or whatever device produces a higher-order thought, is a mechanism, and every mechanism is fallible and works only contingently. But the objectors contend that our awareness of our own mental states is either infallible or, if not flatly infallible, noncontingently constrained against unreliability. Shoemaker (1994b), for example, grants that pain can "occasionally" escape awareness, but he insists that that could not happen "as a matter of course; it may be true in Lake Wobegon that all of the children are above average, but it can't be true everywhere" (273-274).

There is a special problem about first-order states that have wide intentional content, i.e., content that is not determined by what is in the subject's head but consists in part of relations the subject bears to external objects (Davidson (1987)). Belief contents are normally wide; two people could be molecularly indistinguishable but have different beliefs, if one were on earth and believed something about about water (H2O), while the other was on Putnam's Twin Earth and had the corresponding belief about the qualitatively similar stuff, XYZ. But (Dretske (1995)) an internal monitor, or whatever device produces a higher-order thought, would be located inside the head and would not be able to look outside the head; so it would not be able to tell, for example, whether its owner's belief was a belief about water or a belief about XYZ. Yet we do know introspectively what it is we believe; so much the worse for the higher-order representation views. (Burge (1988) and Heil (1988) have offered what is now a standard reply to this argument; there has been considerable controversy over that reply.)

Finally, Bar-On and Long (in press) argue more radically that privileged access is not an epistemic matter at all; that is, they say, first-person privilege is not a matter of evidence or especially reliable indication or justification of any other sort. Knowing what one believes or what one phenomenally feels is not in that way like proprioceptively knowing the position of my own limbs without looking. (Bar-On and Long go on to suggest a sophisticated expressive theory of first-person avowals.)

Objections of this sort are really objections to higher-order representation theories considered as theories of self-knowledge and first-person privilege. They do not obviously carry over to the theories' original explanandum, which was the distinction between conscious states and un-, sub-, pre-, or otherwise nonconscious states. It may be that the hypothesis of higher-order representation is needed to explain the latter distinction even if it does not satisfactorily explain privileged access.

False Positives. Shoemaker's complaint was about unfelt pains and other sensations of which, on a representationalist view, one might be systematically unaware.  But the fallibility problem for representational theories gets worse: There is also a danger of false positives. Might not an internal scanner, or whatever mechanism produces a higher-order thought, be defective in that it fires mistakenly, introspecting a visual sensation or a pain that never occurred?  A subject might seem to her-/himself to suffer terrible pain for weeks, while actually having no pain at all. (This is not a case of psychosomatic pain; psychosomatic pain is real pain, though of no known physical cause.)  Does that consequence of representationalism even make clear sense?  Neander (1998) prosecutes this objection; Lycan (1998) rejoins (none too effectively).

Ubiquity. Rey (1983) objects that if all it takes to make a first-order state a conscious state is that the state be the object of a higher-order representation, then consciousness is a lot more prevalent than we think. Any laptop computer, for example, has monitoring devices that keep track of its "psychological" states. Perhaps no existing computer has genuinely psychological states, but Rey argues that once we had done whatever needs to be done in order to fashion a being that did have nonconscious first-order intentional and sensory states, the addition of an internal monitor or two would be a trifling afterthought, hardly the sort of thing that could turn a simply nonconscious being into a conscious being.

This objection clearly calls for a thoughtful response. White (1987) and Lycan (1996) have tried to rebut it.

Computational/Cognitive Overload. Carruthers (2000) points out that, given the richness of a person's conscious experience at a time, the alleged higher-order representing devices would be kept very busy. The higher-order representations would have to keep pace with every nuance of the total experience. The complexity of the experience would have to be matched in every detail by a higher-order perception or thought. It is hard to imagine that a human being would have so great a capacity for complex higher-order representation, much less that a small child or a nonhuman animal would have it. Carruthers concludes that if HOP or HOT is true, then to say the least, few if any creatures besides human adults have conscious experiences. Perhaps representational theorists can live with that apparent consequence; perhaps not.

Thus, representational theories of consciousness in the sense of awareness of one's own mental states have serious difficulties to overcome.

§2: Qualitative/Phenomenal Character

Qualitative features of mental states are often called "qualia" (singular, "quale"). In recent philosophy of mind that term has been used in a number of confusingly different ways, but here I shall use it in the specific, strict sense due to C.I. Lewis (1929): A quale in this sense is an introspectible monadic qualitative or phenomenal property inhering in a mental state, and I shall be talking only of sensory states in particular. A quale can be thought of as the distinctive phenomenal property of an apparent phenomenal individual. (An "apparent phenomenal individual" is anything of the sort that Russell would have taken to be a "sense-datum," such as a colored region of ones visual field, or a heard sound or an experienced smell.)  A paradigm of a quale is the color of an after-image. For example, Bertie is experiencing a green after-image as a result of seeing a red flash bulb go off; the greenness of the after-image is the quale.

Qualia in this sense pose a problem for materialist theories of the mind. For where, ontologically speaking, are they located?  Actual Russellian sense-data are immaterial individuals; so the materialist cannot admit that the greenness of the after-image is a property of an actual sense-datum. Nor is it plausible to suggest that the greenness is exemplified by anything physical in the brain (if there is some green physical thing in your brain, you are probably in big trouble). To sharpen the problem, suppose there is no green physical object in Bertie's visible environment either:  So there is no green physical thing either inside his head or visibly outside it. But since there is a green thing that he is experiencing, it must after all be a nonphysical, immaterial thing.

There is a representational theory of qualia, due in modern times to Anscombe (1965) and Hintikka (1969); adherents include Kraut (1982), Lewis (1983), Lycan (1987, 1996), Harman (1990), Shoemaker (1994a), Tye (1994, 1995), and Dretske (1995). The representational theory is an attempt to resolve the foregoing dilemma compatibly with materialism. According to it, qualia are actually intentional contents, represented properties of represented objects. Suppose Ludwig is seeing a real tomato in good light, and naturally it looks red to him; there is a corresponding red patch in his visual field. He is visually representing the actual redness of the tomato, and the redness of the "patch" is just the redness of the tomato itself. But suppose George Edward is hallucinating a similar tomato, and there is a tomato-shaped red patch in his visual field just as there is in Ludwig's. George Edward too is representing the redness of an external, physical tomato. It is just that in his case the tomato is not real; it and its redness are intentional inexistents. But the redness is still the redness of the illusory tomato. (Note that the representation going on here is good old first-order representation of environmental features, not higher-order representation as in the HOP and HOT theories of awareness.)

What about Bertie's green after-image?  On the representationalist analysis, for Bertie to experience the green after-image is for Bertie to be visually-representing a green blob located at such-and-such a spot in the room. Since in reality there is no green blob in the room with Bertie, his visual experience is unveridical; after-images are illusions. The quale, the greenness of the blob, is (like the blob itself) an intentional inexistent.

And that is how the representationalist resolves our dilemma.  There is a green thing that Bertie is experiencing, but it is not an actual thing. That "there is" is the same lenient non-actualist "there is" that occurs in "There is something that Bertie believes in but that doesn't exist" and in "There is a mythical god that the Greeks worshipped but no one worships any more."  (In defending his sense-data, Russell mistook a nonactual material thing for an actual immaterial thing.)

Most representationalists agree that the representation of color and other sensible properties is "nonconceptual" in some sense--at least in that the qualitative representations need not be easily translatable into the subject's natural language. Of course, some psychosemantics would be needed to explain what it is in virtue of which a brain item represents greenness in particular. Dretske (1995) offers one, as does Tye (1995); both accounts are teleologized versions of "indicator" semantics.

On pain of circularity, the representational theory requires color realism. In this discussion, "green" has meant the objective, public property that inheres in some physical objects. (One could not, without circularity, explicate phenomenal greenness in terms of represented real-world color and then turn around and construe real physical greenness as a disposition to produce sensations of phenomenal greenness.)  What sort of real-world property is an "objective," physical color?  There is a variety of realist answers, though none of them is uncontroversial. (Dretske (1995), Tye (1995), Lycan (1996) and Lewis (1997) each gesture toward one.)

Of course, the mere representation of redness does not suffice for phenomenal red, for something's looking red to a subject. (One could say the word "red" aloud, or semaphore it from a cliff, or send it in Morse code, or write the French word "rouge" on a blackboard, or point to a color chip.)  The representation must be specifically a visual representation, produced by either a normal human visual system or by something functionally like one. Thus, the representational theory of qualia cannot be purely representational, but must appeal to some further factor. Dretske (1995) cites only the fact that visual representation is sensory and what he calls "systemic."  Tye (1995) requires that the representation be nonconceptual and "poised," and also argues that visual representations of color would differ from other sorts of representations in being accompanied by further representational differences. Lycan (1996) appeals to functional considerations. (The latter mixed view is what Block (1996) calls "quasi-representationism.")

Thus we may distinguish different grades of representationalism about qualia. Purest representationalism would be the view that representation is all it takes to make a quale; but no one holds that view. Strong representationalism is what is defended by Dretske, Tye and Lycan: that representation of a certain kind suffices for a quale, where the kind can be specified in functionalist or other familiar materialist terms, without recourse to properties of any ontologically new sort. Weak representationalism says only that qualitative states have representational content, which admission is compatible with qualia also necessarily involving features that are ontologically "new" (Block (1990, 1996), Chalmers (1996)).    (There is a further question, of whether qualia themselves, in our very specific sense, exhaust all of what has usually been thought of as a sensory state's overall phenomenal character. Lycan (1998) argues that they do not.)  Throughout the rest of this article, unless otherwise noted, "representationalism" shall mean the strong representationalist view.

§2.1: Arguments in Favor of the Representational Theory of Qualia

There are at least four direct arguments in favor of the representational theory.

First, the theory is the only very promising way to preserve materialism while accommodating qualia. For the only viable alternative resolution of our Bertie dilemma seems to be belief in actual Russellian sense-data or at least in immaterial properties. (The anti-materialist may not mind sense-data ontologically, but s/he will also inherit the nasty epistemological problems that Russell never succeeded in overcoming; the external world is a nice thing to have. More likely, an opponent will hold the line at property dualism, as do Jackson (1982) and Chalmers (1996).) A materialist might suggest a type-identity of Bertie's phenomenal greenness with something neurophysiological, but that would be to do away with the important claim that greenness itself, rather than some surrogate property, figures in Bertie's experience; the suggestion would be an error theory, and would have to explain away the intuition that, whatever the ultimate ontology, Bertie really is experiencing an instance of greenness.

Second (Dretske (1996)), there is nothing intrinsic to the brain that constitutes the difference between a red quale and a green one; unless there are Russellian sense-data or at least immaterial properties, what distinguishes the two qualia must be relational, and the only obvious candidate is, representing red or green. (A surprising but harmless consequence of this view is that qualia in our strict (C.I.-)Lewisian sense are not themselves properties of the experiences that present them:  Qualia are represented properties of represented objects, and so they are only intentionally present in experiences. As before, the relevant properties of the experiences are, representing this quality or that. Of course, one could neologize slightly and speak of "qualia" as properties of experiences, identifying them with representational features.) But to this second argument the neurophysiological type-identity theorist would have a stronger rebuttal.

Third, we distinguish between veridical and unveridical visual experiences. How so?  I would take it to be fairly uncontentious that Bertie's experience is as of a green blob and has greenness as an intentional object, and that what the experience reports is false. (The only type of theorist I know who disputes this is an unreconstructed Russellian sense-datum merchant: If one thinks of the after-image itself as an actually and independently existing individual--indeed one of the world's basic building blocks--one will not also think of it as representational.)  Moreover, the experience's veridicality condition, i.e., there being a green blob where there seems to Bertie to be one, seems to exhaust not only its representational content but its qualitative content.  Once the greenness has already been accounted for, what qualitative content is left?  (But we shall see in §3 below that that question has a serious nonrhetorical answer.)

Fourth, the transparency argument (Harman (1990)):  We normally "see right through" perceptual states to external objects and do not even notice that we are in perceptual states; the properties we are aware of in perception are attributed to the objects perceived. "Look at a tree and try to turn your attention to intrinsic features of your visual experience. I predict you will find that the only features there to turn your attention to will be features of the presented tree, including relational features of the tree ‘from here’" (p. 39). Tye (1995) extends this argument to bodily sensations such as pain.

The transparency argument can be extended also to the purely hallucinatory case. Suppose you are looking at a real, richly red tomato in good light. Suppose also that you then hallucinate a second, identical tomato to the right of the real one. (You may be aware that the second tomato is not real.)  Phenomenally, the relevant two sectors of your visual field are just the same; the appearances are just the same in structure. The redness involved in the second-tomato appearance is exactly the same property as is involved in the first. But if we agree that the redness perceived in the real tomato is just the redness of the tomato itself, then the redness perceived in the hallucinated tomato--the red quale involved in the second-tomato appearance--is just the redness of the hallucinated tomato itself.

§2.2: Objections to the Representational Theory of Qualia

Objections to the representational theory come mainly in the form of counterexamples: cases in which either two experiences share their intentional content and differ in their qualia or they differ entirely in their intentional content but share qualia. Peacocke (1983) gave three examples of the former kind, Block (1990) one of the latter. (Block (1995, 1996) also offers some of the former kind; for discussion, see Lycan (1996).)

In Peacocke's first example, your experience represents two (actual) trees, at different distances from you but as being of the same physical height and other dimensions; "[y]et there is also some sense in which the nearest tree occupies more of your visual field than the more distant tree" (p. 12). That sense is a qualitative sense, and Peacocke maintains that the qualitative difference is unmatched by any representational difference. The second and third examples concern, respectively, binocular vision and the reversible-cube illusion. In each case, Tye (1995) and Lycan (1996) have rejoined that there are after all identifiable representational differences constituting the qualitative differences.

Block appeals to an "Inverted Earth," a planet exactly like Earth except that its real physical colors are (somehow) inverted with respect to ours. The Inverted Earthlings' speech sounds just like English, but their intentional contents in regard to color are inverted relative to ours:  When they say "red," they mean green (if it is green Inverted objects that correspond to red Earthly objects under the inversion in question), and green things look green to them even though they call those things "red."  Now, an Earthling victim is chosen by the customary mad scientists, knocked out, fitted with color inverting lenses, transported to Inverted Earth, and repainted to match that planet's human skin and hair coloring.  Block contends that after some length of time--a few days or a few millennia--the victim's word meanings and propositional-attitude contents and all other intentional contents will shift to match the Inverted Earthlings' contents, but, intuitively, the victim's qualia will remain the same. Thus, qualia are not intentional contents.

The obvious representationalist reply is to insist that if the intentional contents would change, so too would the qualitative contents; what is Block's argument for denying this?  Block's nearly explicit argument is that qualia are "narrow," in that they supervene on head contents (on this view, two molecularly indistinguishable people could not experience different qualia), while the intentional contents shift under environmental pressure precisely because they are "wide."  If qualia are indeed narrow, and all the intentional contents are wide and would shift, then Block's argument succeeds. (Stalnaker (1996) gives a version of Block's argument that does not depend on the assumption that qualia are narrow; Lycan (1996) rebuts it.)

Three replies are available, then:  (i) To insist that not all the intentional contents would shift. Word meanings would shift, but it does not follow that visual contents ever would. (ii) To hold that although all the ordinary intentional contents would shift, there is a special class of narrow though still representational contents underlying the wide contents; qualia can be identified with the special narrow contents. (iii) To deny that qualitative content is narrow and argue that it is wide, i.e., that two molecularly indistinguishable people could indeed experience different qualia. This last is the position that Dretske (1996) has labelled "phenomenal externalism."

Reply (i) has not been much pursued. (ii) has, a bit, by Tye (1994) and especially Rey (1998). Rey argues vigorously that qualia are narrow, and then offers a narrow representational theory. (But it turns out that Rey's theory is not a theory of qualia in the strict Lewisian sense of quale used here; see below.)

Reply (iii), phenomenal externalism, has been defended by Dretske (1995, 1996), Tye (1995) and Lycan (1996). A number of people (even Tye himself (1998)) have since called the original contrary assumption that qualia are narrow a "deep / powerful / compelling" intuition, but it proves to be highly disputable. Here are two arguments, though not very strong arguments, for the claim that qualia are wide.

First, if the representational theory is correct, then qualia are determined by whatever determines a psychological state's intentional content; in particular, the color properties represented are taken to be physical properties instanced in the subject's environment.  What determines a psychological state's intentional content is given by a psychosemantics, in Fodor's (1987) sense. But every known plausible psychosemantics makes intentional contents wide.  Of course, the representational theory is just what is in question; but:

Second, suppose qualia are narrow. Then Block's Inverted Earth argument is plausible, and it would show that either qualia are narrow functional properties or they are properties of a very weird kind whose existence is suggested by nothing else we know (see Ch. 6 of Lycan (1996)). But qualia are not functional properties, at least not narrow ones:  Recall the Bertie dilemma. Also, qualia are monadic properties, while functional properties are all relational; and see further Block's anti-functionalist arguments in Block (1978).  So, either qualia are wide or weirdness is multiplied beyond necessity. Of course, that dichotomy will be resisted by anyone who offers a narrow representationalist theory as in (ii) above.

§2.4: Arguments For Narrow Qualia

Although until a few years ago the assumption that qualia are narrow had been tacit and entirely undefended, opponents of representationalism have since begun defending it with vigor.  Here are (only) some of their arguments, with sample replies.

Introspection. An Earthling suddenly transported to Inverted Earth or some other relevant sort of Twin Earth would notice nothing introspectively, despite a change in representational content; so the quale must remain unchanged and so is narrow.

Reply:  The same goes for propositional attitudes, i.e., the transported Earthling would notice nothing introspectively. Yet the attitude contents are still wide. Wideness does not entail introspective change under transportation.

Narrow content. In the propositional-attitude literature, the corresponding transportation argument has been taken as the basis of an argument for "narrow content," viz., for something that is intentional content within the meaning of the act but is narrow rather than, as usual, wide. The self-knowledge problem aforementioned, and the problem of "wide causation" (Fodor (1987), Kim (1995)), have also been used to motivate narrow content. And, come to think of it, any general argument for narrow content will presumably apply to sensory representation as well as to propositional attitudes. If there is narrow content at all, and sensory content is representational, then probably sensory states have narrow content too. Thus, qualia can and should be taken to be the narrow contents of such states.

Replies:  First, this begs the question against the claim that qualia are wide. Even if there are indeed narrow contents impacted within sensory states, independent argument is needed for the identification of qualia with those contents rather than with wide contents. Second and more strongly, narrow sensory contents still would not correspond to qualia in the Lewisian sense. The redness of a patch in my visual field is (so far as has been shown) still a wide property, even if some other, narrow property underlies it in the same way that mysterious, ineffable narrow contents are supposed to underlie beliefs and desires.

Modes of Presentation. (Rey (1998))  There is no such thing as representation without a mode of presentation.  If a quale is a representatum, then it is represented under a mode of presentation, and modes of presentation may be narrow even when the representational content itself is wide. Indeed, many philosophers of mind take modes of presentation to be internal causal or functional roles played by the representations in question.  Surely they are strong candidates for qualitative content. Are they not narrow qualia?

Reply:  Remember, the qualia themselves are properties like phenomenal greenness and redness, which according to the representational theory are representata. The modes or guises under which greenness and redness are represented in vision are something else again.

It can plausibly be argued that such modes and guises are qualitative or phenomenal properties of some sort, perhaps higher-order properties. See the next section.

Qualitative but Nonrepresenting States. (Rey (1998))  Even if perceptual states are representational, bodily sensations and moods do not have that same feature. Yet bodily sensations and moods do have qualitative character. "Many have noted that states like that of elation, depression, anxiety, pleasure, orgasm seem to be just overall states of oneself, and not features of presented objects" (p. 441, italics original).

Here the representational theorist must tough it out, and insist both that bodily sensations and moods do have intentional content and that their intentional content exhausts their qualitative character. Of course, each of those claims, especially the first, requires hefty independent defense. It is easy enough to argue that pains and tickles and even orgasms have some representational features (see Tye (1995) and Lycan (1996)). For example, a pain is felt as being in a certain part of one's body, as if that part is disordered in a certain way; that is why pains are described as "burning," "stabbing," "throbbing" and the like. It is harder to show that the sensations' qualitative contents are exhausted by their representational features. It is perhaps still harder to maintain that a mood has intentional content, though it could be argued that a state of elation, for example, represents the world as a beautiful and exciting place.

Memory. (Block (1996)) "[Y]ou remember the color of the sky on your birthday last year, the year before that, ten years before that, and so on, and your long-term memory gives you good reason to think that the phenomenal character of the experience has not changed.... Of course, memory can go wrong, but why should we suppose that it must go wrong here?" (pp. 43-44, italics and boldface original). The idea is that memory acts as a check on the qualia, and can be used to support the claim that the qualia have remained unchanged despite the wholesale shift in representational contents.

Reply:  Memory contents are wide, and so by Block's own reasoning they will themselves undergo the representational shift to the Inverted-Earth complementary color. Thus, your post-shift memories of good old Earth are false. When you say or think to yourself, "Yes, the sky looks as blue as it did thirty years ago," you are not expressing the same memory content as you would have when you had just arrived on Inverted Earth. You are now remembering or remembering that the sky looked yellow, since for you "blue" now means yellow. And that memory is false, since on the long-ago occasion the sky looked blue to you, not yellow; memory is not after all a reliable check on the qualia. (Lycan (1996) takes this line; Tye (1998) expands it in more detail.)

Hardly anyone will accept all of the foregoing replies. But no one should now find it obvious either that qualia are narrow or that they are wide. The matter is likely to remain controversial for some time to come.

§3: What It's Like

Some philosophers (e.g., Dretske (1995), Tye (1995)) use this troublesome expression simply to mean a quale, and this is one of the two meanings it has had in recent philosophy of mind. But in the opening paragraph of this article, the phrase was introduced in the context, "‘what it is like’ for the subject to be in a particular mental state, especially for that subject to experience a particular phenomenal property [or quale]," which suggests that there is another sense in which (when the mental state does involve a quale) the "what it's like" is something over and above the quale itself. In fact, since this second "what it's like" is itself a property of the quale, it cannot very well be identical with the quale. (Block (1995), like many other writers, fails to distinguish this from "phenomenal consciousness" in our original sense. But Carruthers (2000) elaborates nicely on the distinction.)

Here are two further reasons for maintaining such a distinct sense of the phrase. First, Armstrong (1968), Nelkin (1989), Rosenthal (1991), and Lycan (1996) have argued that qualia can fail to be conscious in the earlier sense of awareness; a quale can occur without its being noticed by its subject. But in such a case, there is a good sense in which it would not be like anything for the subject to experience that quale. (Of course, in the first, Dretske-Tye sense there would be something it was like, since the quale itself is that. But in another sense, if the subject is entirely unaware of the quale, it is odd even to speak of the subject as "experiencing" it, much less of there being something it is like for the subject to experience it.)  So even in the case in which one is aware of one's quale, the second type of "what it's like" requires awareness and so is something distinct from the quale itself.

Second, a quale can be described in one's public natural language, while what it is like to experience the quale seems to be ineffable. Suppose Ludwig asks Bertie, "How, exactly, does the after-image look to you as regards color?"  Bertie replies, "I told you, it looks green."  "Yes," says Ludwig, "but can you tell me what it's like to experience that ‘green’ look?"  "Well, the image looks the same color as that," says Bertie, pointing to George Edward's cloth coat. "No, I mean, can you tell me what it's like intrinsically, not comparatively?"  "Um,...."  --In one way, Bertie can describe the phenomenal color, paradigmatically as "green."  But when asked what it is like to experience that green, he goes mute. So there is a difference between (a) "what it's like" in the bare sense of the quale, the phenomenal color that can be described using ordinary color words, and (b) "what it's like" to experience that phenomenal color, which cannot easily be described in public natural language at all.

It is the second sense of "what it's like" that figures in anti-materialist arguments from subjects' "knowing what it's like," primarily Nagel's (1974) "Bat" argument and Jackson's (1982) "Knowledge" argument. Jackson's character Mary, a brilliant color scientist trapped in an entirely black-and-white laboratory, nonetheless becomes omniscient as regards the physics and chemistry of color, the neurophysiology of color vision, and every other public, objective fact conceivably relevant to human color experience.  Yet when she is finally released from her captivity and ventures into the outside world, she sees colors for the first time, and learns something: namely, she learns what it is like to see red and the other colors. Thus she seems to have learned a new fact, one that by hypothesis is not a public, objective fact. It is an intrinsically perspectival fact. This is what threatens materialism, since according to that doctrine, every fact about every human mind is ultimately a public, objective fact.

Upon her release, Mary has done two things:  She has at last hosted a red quale, and she has learned what it is like to experience a red quale. In experiencing it she has experienced a "what it's like" in the first of our two senses. But the fact she has learned has the ineffability characteristic of our second sense of "what it's like"; were Mary to try to pass on her new knowledge to a still color-deprived colleague, she would not be able to express it in English.

We have already surveyed the representational theory of qualia. But there are also representational theories of "what it's like" in the second sense. A common reply to the arguments of Nagel and Jackson (Horgan (1984), Van Gulick (1985), Churchland (1985), Tye (1986), Lycan (1987, 1990, 1996), Loar (1990), Rey (1991), Leeds (1993)) is to note that a knowledge difference does not entail a difference in fact known, for one can know a fact under one representation or mode of presentation but fail to know one and the same fact under a different mode of presentation. Someone might know that water is splashing but not know that H2O molecules are moving, and vice versa; someone might know that person X is underpaid without knowing that she herself is underpaid, even if she herself is in fact person X. Thus, from Mary's before-and-after knowledge difference, Jackson is not entitled to infer the existence of a new, weird fact, but at most that of a new way of representing.  Mary has not learned a new fact, but has only acquired a new, introspective or first-person way of representing one that she already knew in its neurophysiological guise.

(As noted above, the posited introspective modes of presentation for qualia in the Lewisian sense are strong candidates for the title of qualia in a distinct, higher-order sense of the term, and they may well be narrow rather than wide. This is what Rey (1998) seems to be talking about.)

This attractive response to Nagel and Jackson--call it the "perspectivalist" response--requires that the first-order qualitative state itself be represented (else how could it be newly known under Mary's new mode of presentation?). And that hypothesis in turn encourages a representational theory of higher-order conscious awareness and introspection. Since we have seen that representational theories of awareness face powerful objections, the perspectivalist must either buy into such a theory despite its liabilities, or find some other way of explicating the idea of an introspective or first-person perspective without appealing to higher-order representation. The latter option does not seem promising.


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William Lycan

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