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Philosophy and Christian Theology

Many of the doctrines and concepts central to Christianity have important philosophical implications or presuppositions. In this article we will take a closer look at some of the central doctrines and concepts, and their philosophical relevance.

Of course, many philosophically laden doctrines and concepts are relevant to Christianity, and we cannot discuss them all here. Rather, our focus will be on those concepts and doctrines that are distinctively Christian, and which have been the focus of a good deal of recent discussion in the philosophical literature. Thus, although theism is a central Christian concept, it is not distinctively Christian and so will not be covered here. Further, although views about the Eucharist, a central Christian concept, have held a significant place in the philosophical dialogue in former times, it will not be discussed here since it has not been a significant focus of recent discussions. As a result, we will concentrate on three distinctive and central Christian concepts which have received significant attention in the recent literature: the doctrines of the Trinity and the Incarnation, and views on the nature of atonement.

1. Philosophy and Christian Theology

Before we begin, it is worthwhile to consider in brief the general relationship between philosophy and Christian religious dogma. In the history of Christian theology, philosophy has sometimes been seen as a natural complement to theological reflection, while at other times the advocates for the two disciplines have regarded each other as mortal enemies. Some early Christian thinkers such as Tertullian were of the view that any intrusion of secular philosophical reason into theological reflection was out of order. Thus, even if certain theological claims seemed to fly in the face of the standards of reasoning defended by philosophers, the religious believer should not flinch. Other early Christian thinkers, such as St. Augustine of Hippo, argued that philosophical reflection complemented theology, but only when these philosophical reflections were firmly grounded in a prior intellectual commitment to the underlying truth of the Christian faith. Thus, the legitimacy of philosophy was derived from the legitimacy of the underlying faith commitments.

Into the High Middle Ages, Augustine's views were widely defended. It was during this time however that St. Thomas Aquinas described another model for the relationship between philosophy and theology. According to the Thomistic model, philosophy and theology are distinct enterprises. The primary difference between the two is their intellectual starting points. Philosophy takes as its data the deliverances of our natural mental faculties: what we see, hear, taste, touch, and smell. These data can be accepted on the basis of the reliability of our natural faculties with respect to the natural world. Theology, on the other hand takes as its starting point the divine revelations contained in the Bible. These data can be accepted on the basis of divine authority, in a way analogous to the way in which we accept, for example, the claims made by a physics professor about the basic facts of physics.

On this way of seeing the two disciplines, if at least one of the premises of an argument is derived from revelation, the argument falls in the domain of theology; otherwise it falls into philosophy's domain. Since this way of thinking about philosophy and theology sharply demarcates the disciplines, it is possible in principle that the conclusions reached by one might be contradicted by the other. According to advocates of this model, however, any such conflict must be merely apparent. Since God both created the world which is accessible to philosophy and revealed the texts accessible to theologians, the claims yielded by one cannot conflict with the claims yielded by another unless the philosopher or theologian has made some prior error.

Since the deliverances of the two disciplines must then coincide, philosophy can be put to the service of theology (and perhaps vice-versa). How might philosophy play this complementary role? First, philosophical reasoning might persuade some who do not accept the authority of purported divine revelation of the claims contained in religious texts. Thus, an atheist who is unwilling to accept the authority of religious texts might come to believe that God exists on the basis of purely philosophical arguments. Second, distinctively philosophical techniques might be brought to bear in helping the theologian clear up imprecise or ambiguous theological claims. Thus, theology might provide us with information sufficient to conclude that Jesus Christ was a single person with two natures, one human and one divine, but leave us in the dark about exactly how this relationship between divine and human natures is to be understood. The philosopher can provide some assistance here, since, among other things, he or she can help the theologian discern which models are, for example, logically inconsistent and thus not even candidates for understanding the relationship of divine and human natures in Christ.

For most of the twentieth century, the vast majority of English language philosophy went on without much interaction with theology at all. While there are a number of complex reasons for this divorce, three are especially important. The first is that atheism was the predominant opinion among English language philosophers throughout much of that century.

A second, quite related reason is that, philosophers in the twentieth century regarded theological language as either meaningless, or, at best, subject to scrutiny only insofar as that language had a bearing on religious practice. The former belief (i.e., that theological language was meaningless) was inspired by a tenet of logical positivism, according to which any statement that lacks empirical content is meaningless. Since much theological language, for example, language describing the doctrine of the Trinity, lacks empirical content, such language must be meaningless. The latter belief, inspired by Wittgenstein, holds that language itself only has meaning in specific practical contexts, and thus that religious language was not aiming to express truths about the world which could be subjected to objective philosophical scrutiny.

The third reason is that a great deal of academic theology moved away from defending the claims of orthodox Christian theism in traditional ways, often seeking devices for re-interpreting these claims in ways congenial to contemporary modes of thought which often ran contrary to the methods employed in analytic philosophy.

In the last twenty years, however, philosophers have returned to many of the traditional claims of orthodox Christianity and have begun to apply the tools of contemporary philosophy in ways that are somewhat more eclectic than those described in the Augustinian or Thomistic models described above. In keeping with the recent academic trend, contemporary philosophers of religion have been unwilling to maintain hard and fast distinctions between the two disciplines. As a result, it is often difficult in reading recent work to distinguish what the philosophers are doing from what the theologians of past centuries regarded as strictly within the theological domain. However, like theologians of the medieval period, much recent work in philosophy of religion seems to fall into one of two categories. The first category includes attempts to demonstrate the truth of religious claims by appeal to evidence available apart from purported divine revelations. The second category includes attempts to demonstrate the consistency and plausibility of theological claims using philosophical techniques. In what follows, we will be considering work that falls into this second category.

2. Trinity

From the beginning, Christians have affirmed the claim that there is one God and that three persons are God: God the Father, God the Son, and God the Holy Spirit. In AD 675, the Council of Toledo framed this pair of claims as follows:

Although we profess three persons we do not profess three substances but one substance and three persons … If we are asked about the individual Person, we must answer that he is God. Therefore, we may say God the Father, God the Son, and God the Holy Spirit; but they are not three Gods, he is one God … Each single Person is wholly God in himself and … all three persons together are one God.

Such formulations set forth the Christian doctrine of the Trinity. Cornelius Plantinga, Jr., reflecting on the Council of Toledo's profession, remarks that it “possesses great puzzling power” (Plantinga 1989, 22). No doubt this is an understatement. The Christian doctrine is puzzling, and this has led some of Christianity's critics to advance the claim that it is, in fact, incoherent.

Perhaps the initial puzzling power of the doctrine of the Trinity is not immediately obvious. After all, someone might think that one thing, Fred, can be “many things” all at the same time, for example, a butcher, a baker, and a candlestick maker. So why can't God be Father, Son, and Holy Spirit all at the same time? Likewise, multiple distinct things can all be “one thing” at the same time. Thus, each member of the Baltimore Orioles baseball team can be Orioles taken individually, as well as “the Orioles” taken collectively. One might then think that defenders of the Trinity might be able to construct models out of such examples that would preserve the logical coherence of the doctrine. But things will not be quite that easy. To see why, we can take a brief detour and then come back to the two examples above.

Traditional Christian theologians have held that however the doctrine of the Trinity is understood, there are two extreme positions that are to be ruled out. These positions are modalism and tritheism. According to modalism, God is one single entity, object, or substance, and each person of the Trinty is simply a mode or a “way in which the one divine substance manifests itself.” This view has been rejected because it seems to sacrifice the distinctness of the divine persons in order to maintain the notion of divine unity. According to tritheism, on the other hand, the divine persons are each distinct individual persons which are so closely related that they together count as a single thing in some fashion. Nonetheless, despite this oneness, the three persons are still three gods. This view has been rejected for the opposite reason, namely, it preserves the distinctness of persons without maintaining any robust sense of the “oneness” of God.

One can now see why the “butcher, baker, candlestick maker” and the “Orioles” examples will not help us in providing a model for the Trinity. The first, like modalism, leans too heavily towards oneness at the expense of the distinctness of the three persons. It holds, that is, that there is really only one Fred, but that Fred can manifest himself in different ways by carrying out three different tasks. The second, like tritheism, leans too far in the opposite direction. On this example, the individual Orioles only form the “single team” because of certain agreements they have made to act cooperatively on the baseball team. There is no genuine, organic unity here.

Nonetheless, most models of the Trinity that have been proposed and defended have leaned in modalist or tritheistic directions. In order to help sort out which models can be regarded as plausible, one needs first to get clear about just what the Christian means to affirm in confessing the existence of three persons and one God. What is “a person” according to the doctrine, and what is “a God”? One can easily see some initial difficulties in even these questions. Even if we can come up with a single coherent description of God, we are still left with the ambiguous notion of person. Sometimes we use the word “person” in a metaphysical sense, to refer to an individual, rational substance. Other times we use it in a psychological sense to refer to a “center of consciousness or rational awareness.” In other cases we might have in mind a functional notion of person, according to which a person is whatever sort of thing is capable entering into certain sorts of relationships, such as love, friendship, and so forth. Or we might use “person” in a moral or forensic sense, according to which a person is a subject or moral accountability, praise, or blame. And there are others.

Since Christians claim that the doctrine of Trinity is discovered through divine revelation, perhaps the relevant conception of person should be drawn from revealed texts. Unfortunately, the Bible itself does not seem to narrow down the alternatives to a single candidate. As a result, there is a good deal of remaining latitude in constructing a model for the Trinity.

Recent defenses of orthodox conceptions of the Trinity understand the notion in a way that highlights the centrality of persons as distinct centers of rational, conscious, and morally significant volitional activity. Most have concluded that this conception of personhood is incompatible with regarding the three divine persons as somehow mere aspects or modes of presentation of an underlying singular entity. As a result, these recent defenses have leaned in the direction of regarding the divine persons as distinct entities whose unity arises in virtue of certain necessary relations that exist among them. In this way, these models lean more in the tritheistic direction. Still, the necessary relations that these models attribute to the divine persons unify them in special and unique ways.

Richard Swinburne, for example, defends a view according to which each of the three divine persons has all of the essential characteristics of divinity: omniscience, omnipotence, omnipresence, moral perfection, and so forth (Swinburne 1994, ch. 8). He further claims that the persons have necessarily harmonious wills, so that their volitions never come into conflict, and that there is a perfectly loving relation that also necessarily obtains among them. Further, this view is compatible with traditional claims of dependence relations among members of the Trinity. Traditional formulations of the doctrine hold that the Father generates the Son and that Father and Son jointly give rise to (or spirate, literally “breathe forth”) the Holy Spirit. Such relations are possible as long as one causes the other in such a way that the causing relation has always obtained, and it is impossible for the relation not to obtain.

On this sort of view, there is one God because the community of divine persons is so closely inter-connected that, though they are three distinct persons, they nonetheless count as a single entity in another respect. For if we were to consider a set of three human persons, for example, who exhibited these characteristics of necessary unity, volitional harmony, and love, it is hard to regard them as distinct in the way we do ordinary persons. And that is, of course, just what the doctrine aims to put forth.

Perhaps this view seems to lean too strongly in the tritheistic direction. How could the social Trinitarian respond to this worry? One way would be to focus attention on exactly what is required in order for many “things” to jointly constitute another single “thing.” My (one) body is composed of (many) atoms. My (one) car is composed of (many) parts. In order to assess whether or not social Trinitarianism is viciously tritheistic, one needs to ask what principles govern the relationship between parts and wholes generally. We know many atoms can make a single body and many ingredients can make a single cake. Can many persons constitute a single divine entity? One thing is sure: the answer is not an obvious “no.” And this, perhaps, leaves the door open for the social Trinitarian to make the case that divine unity is not lost on his view after all. Saving such unity, however, will require more metaphysical work.

3. Incarnation

The doctrine of the Incarnation concerns Jesus Christ, the second person of the Trinty. Specifically, the doctrine holds that, at a time roughly two thousand years in the past, the divine person took on himself a second, fully human nature. As a result, he was a single person in full possession of two distinct natures, one human and one divine. The Council of Chalcedon in 451 put forth the canonical statement of the doctrine as follows:

We confess one and the same our Lord Jesus Christ … the same perfect in Godhead, the same in perfect manhood, truly God and truly man … acknowledged in two natures without confusion, without change, without division, without separation–the difference of natures being by no means taken away because of the union, but rather the distinctive character of each nature being preserved, and combining into one person and hypostasis—not divided or separated into two persons, but one and the same Son and only begotten God, Word, Lord Jesus Christ.

Critics have held this doctrine to be “impossible, self-contradictory, incoherent, absurd, and unintelligible.” The central difficulty for the doctrine is that it seems to attribute to one person characteristics that are not logically compatible. For example, it seems on the one hand that human beings are necessarily created, finite, not-omnipresent, not-omniscient, not-omnipotent, and so forth. On the other hand, divine beings are essentially the opposite of all those things. Thus, one person could bear both natures, human and divine, only if such a person could be both finite and not-finite, created and uncreated, and so forth. And this is surely impossible.

Two main strategies have been pursued in an attempt to resolve this apparent paradox. The first is the kenotic strategy. The kenotic view (from the Greek kenosis meaning ’to empty’) finds its motivation in a New Testament passage which claims that Jesus “who, though he was in the form of God, did not count equality with God a thing to be grasped, but emptied himself, taking the form of a servant, being born in the likeness of men. And being found in human form he humbled himself and became obedient unto death…” (Phillipians 2:6-8). According to this view, in becoming incarnate, God the Son voluntarily and temporarily laid aside some of his divine attributes in order to take on a human nature and thus his earthly mission.

The main difficulty with this basic version of the kenotic view is that it entails that a thing can lay aside properties essential for it's being a member of a certain kind and still remain a member of that kind. In other words, it allows that God the Son could (temporarily) be non-omnipotent, non-omniscient, and so forth, and still be God. But if those attributes are essential to divinity, that is, essential for something's being counted as God, then this solution is simply mistaken. Some have offered more refined versions of the kenotic theory, arguing that the basic view mischaracterizes the divine attributes. Rather, God's properties should be characterized as: omniscient-unless-incarnate, omnipotent-unless-incarnate, and so forth. Thus, when the powers of omnipotence are laid aside at the incarnation, Jesus can be fully human while retaining these divine attributes without contradiction. (Feenstra 1989, 128-152)

The other main strategy, defended recently by Thomas V. Morris, is the “two minds view” (Morris 1986, 63-73, 102-7). This view unfolds in two steps, one defensive, the other constructive. First, Morris claims that the incoherence charge against the incarnation rests on a mistake. The critic assumes that, for example, humans are essentially non-omniscient. But what are the grounds for this assertion? Unless we think that we have some special direct insight into the essential properties of human nature, our grounds are that all of the human beings we have encountered have that property. But this merely suffices to show that the property is common to humans, not that it is essential. As Morris points out, it may be universally true that all human beings, for example, were born within ten miles of the surface of the earth, but this does not mean that this is an essential property of human beings. An offspring of human parents born on the international space station would still be human. If this is right, the defender of the incarnation can reject the critic's characterization of human nature, and thereby eliminate the conflict between divine attributes and human nature so characterized.

This merely provides a way to fend off the critic, however, without supplying any positive model for how the incarnation should be understood. In the second step, then, Morris proposes that we think about the incarnation as the realization of one person with two minds: a human mind and a divine mind. If possession of a human mind and body is sufficient for something's being a human, then “merging” the divine mind with a human mind and conjoining both to a human body will yield one person with two natures. During his earthly life, Morris proposes, Jesus Christ had two minds, with consciousness centered in the human mind. This human mind had partial access to the contents of the divine mind, while God the Son's divine mind had full access to the corresponding human mind.

The chief difficulty the view faces is the coherence of holding that a single person can possess two distinct minds. Does this view propose an Incarnate Christ with multiple personality disorder? Morris claims that this objection lacks merit. In fact, contemporary psychology seems to provide resources which support the viability of such a model. As Morris points out elsewhere, the human mind is typically characterized as a system of somewhat autonomous subsystems. The normal human mind, for example, includes the workings of the conscious mind, the seat of awareness, and the unconscious mind. Morris proposes that similar sorts of relations can be supposed to obtain between the divine and human mind of Christ.

4. Atonement

Traditional Christianity holds that sin separates human creatures from God, and that reconciliation can occur in virtue of something that happens through the incarnation, life, death, and resurrection of Jesus Christ. But how are these claims of separation and reconciliation to be understood? The answer to these questions makes up the doctrine of atonement. Throughout the history of Christian theology, a variety of models have been proposed. Most of these models fall into one of four types. Ransom theories contend that sin has rendered humans enslaved to the Devil. In order to free his beloved creatures from this enslavement God was required to pay a ransom, and the price was the death of his sinless incarnate Son. Penal Substitution models contend that through sin humans have incurred a moral debt which needs to be paid. These views hold that the price to be paid is spiritual death and separation from God. No one man can pay the debt of any other since all men have sinned equally. Thus, God chose to send his incarnate Son, free from original or committed sin, to die on behalf of others, and so satisfy their debt.

Sacrifice models are similar to substitution models, but differ in that they do not think that any moral debt of human creatures can be transferred and satisfied by another. Sacrifice theories acknowledge that wrongdoers incur an obligation to “make things right” with the person wronged. Sometimes this means making restitution. Other times it means undertaking acts of penance which demonstrate the wrongdoer's genuine remorse. Thus, if I, in a fit of anger, throw a brick through the window of your house, I might come to seek forgiveness. In doing so I agree to fix the broken window (restitution) but might also do something more, such as bring you a gift as way of demonstrating my genuine remorse. This latter is the act of penance. However, sometimes restitution and suitable penance cannot be carried out by the wrongdoer himself because restitution or suitable penance is beyond his means. In the case of human sinfulness towards God, this is exactly the case. As a result, God sent Christ to earth, where Christ willingly offered his life as a restitution and penance for the sin of the world. Thus, although human sinful creatures cannot make restitution or penance for their wrongdoing on their own, they can, in their repentance, offer up to God the sacrifice of Christ which was made on their behalf.

Finally, Moral Exemplar theories hold that the atonement is secured by moral reform of the sinner. But such moral reform was not fully possible without someone to set the moral example for fallen creatures. Christ became incarnate, on these theories, in order to set this example and thus provide a necessary condition for moral reform and thus restoration of the relationship between creature and Creator.

Ransom theories have no defenders in the recent literature. While each of the remaining theories has defenders, each faces certain key difficulties as well. Substitution theories, for example, require a few central controversial claims. For one, these theories seem to entail that a person can incur an infinite moral debt for a finite amount of earthly wrongdoing. Second, they entail that the moral debt in question cannot simply be forgiven by God, but that it must be settled by full payment. Some have argued that this entails that God does not forgive sin at all. (Stump 1988, 61-5) Forgiveness involves remitting some of the payment owed. On these theories however, the debt is paid in full. Most controversial, however, is the claim that moral debts of the sort in question here are transferable. That is, on this view it seems that the punishment of one can be fairly borne by another. While this might be acceptable in certain cases where monetary fines are involved, many think that it cannot apply to specifically moral debts.

Sacrifice theories do not encounter these difficulties. Instead they, like moral exemplar theories, face difficulties of two main sorts. First, both views seem unable to account for the Biblical emphasis on the necessity of Christ's passion to remedy the problems brought forth by sin. It is hard to see why Christ's passion plays any essential role in establishing him as moral exemplar. Further, it is hard to see why Christ's death would provide a suitable sacrifice. Why would it not suffice for Christ to dwell among us and live a perfect human life, resisting all earthly temptation? Second, both views seem unable to account for the necessity of the horrible nature of Christ's death on the cross. The reason for this is that both hold that God either could or does forgive the sin of creatures without such grave sacrifices being offered. As a result, one is left to wonder why a solution which does not involve such horrific suffering is preferred to simple forgiveness. This is especially problematic for the moral exemplar theories, which lay almost exclusive emphasis on the importance of Christ's moral example during his life and on the centrality of creaturely moral reform for reconciliation with God.

Defenses of substitution models seem to be on the wane in recent literature, with sacrifice and exemplar theories becoming more widely defended. Can the substitution models overcome the difficulties posed for it above? Some have defended substitution models according to which punishment is a fitting response to human sin, and yet also such that it might nonetheless be fairly borne by a surrogate, in this case, the perfect Christ. Stephen Porter, for example, argues that our moral intuitions generally incline us to view punishment of a surrogate as a bad thing, and that some case needs to be made for its permissibility in this instance (Porter 2001). In run of the mill cases of punishment, the good reasons for punishment (such as reform of the wrongdoer, making reparation, deterrence, and so forth) usually weigh in favor of not transferring the punishment to a surrogate. But here, Porter argues, the good reasons for punishing human sinners are not undercut, and that, in fact, there are outweighing reasons for allowing Christ to bear the punishment due human sinners.

Specifically, Porter claims that the goods that come from God's punishment of sin (namely, reparation, manifesting an objective correction to distorted human values, and moral education/reform) justify the punishment. What is more, Porter claims, these ends are more fittingly served through the suffering of Christ on our behalf. The reasons for this are two-fold. First, were we to bear the punishment directly, it might further serve to alienate us from God. Second, the gravity of human sin against an infinite God cannot be suitably expressed by punishment of merely finite humans. Punishment of an infinite God-man better expresses the seriousness of sin.

In Porter's account we have an attempt to respond to the three objections raised earlier against substitution views. First, the (infinite) severity of the punishment is required in order to adequately express the gravity of human sin against an infinite and perfect God. Concerning the second objection (namely, that paying the full price of sin means that there is no forgiveness on God's part), Porter can reply that the objection is simply misguided. God can forgive without any punishment being exacted. However, certain goods arise as a result of punishment being meted out, and God thus metes out punishment suitable for securing those goods. The third difficulty (i.e., the non-transferrability of moral debts) initially seemed to be the most formidable of the three. Porter argues, however, that as long as (a) offender, offended, and surrogate are willing participants, and (b) the goods of punishing can be secured through the punishment of the surrogate, then substitution is permissible, perhaps even preferable. The reason it is permissible, however, is not because the moral debt is “transferred” from sinner to Christ (as the objection assumes) but simply because punishing wrong is a good and punishing a surrogate can equally or better serve the aims of punishing.





Other Internet Resources

Links on the Trinity

Links on the Incarnation:

Links on Atonement

Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | atonement | Augustine, Saint | faith

Copyright © 2002
Michael Murray

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