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Counterfactual Theories of Causation

The basic idea of counterfactual theories of causation is that the meaning of a singular causal claim of the form "Event c caused event e" can be explained in terms of counterfactual conditionals of the form "If c had not occurred, e would not have occurred". Analyses along these lines have become popular in the last quarter of the twentieth century, especially since the development in the 1970's of possible world semantics for counterfactuals. The best known counterfactual analysis of causation is David Lewis's (1973b) theory. However, intense discussion over twenty years has cast doubt on the adequacy of any simple analysis of singular causation in terms of counterfactuals. Recent years have seen a proliferation of different refinements of the basic idea to achieve a closer match with commonsense judgements about causation.

1. Early Counterfactual Theories

The first explicit definition of causation in terms of counterfactuals was, surprisingly enough, given by Hume, when he wrote: "We may define a cause to be an object followed by another, and where all the objects, similar to the first, are followed by objects similar to the second. Or, in other words, where, if the first object had not been, the second never had existed." (1748, Section VII). It is difficult to understand how Hume could have confused the first, regularity definition with the second, very different counterfactual definition.

At any rate, Hume never explored the alternative counterfactual approach to causation. In this, as in much else, he was followed by generations of empiricist philosophers. The chief obstacle in empiricists' minds to explaining causation in terms of counterfactuals was the obscurity of counterfactuals themselves, owing chiefly to their reference to unactualised possibilities. Starting with J. S. Mill (1843), empiricists tried to analyse counterfactuals ‘metalinguistically’ in terms of implication relations between statements. The rough idea is that a counterfactual of the form "If it had been the case that A, it would have been the case that C" is true if and only if there is an auxiliary set S of true statements consistent with the antecedent A, such that the members of S, when conjoined with A, entail the consequent C. Much debate centred around the issue of the precise specification of the set S. (See N. Goodman (1983).) Most empiricists agreed that S would have to include statements of laws of nature, while some thought that it would have to include statements of singular causation. While the truth conditions of counterfactuals remained obscure in these ways, few empiricists thought it worthwhile to try to explain causation via counterfactuals.

Indeed, the first real attempts to present rigorous counterfactual analyses of causation came only in the late 1960's. (See A. Lyon's (1967).) Typical of these attempts was J. L. Mackie's counterfactual analysis in Chapter 2 of his seminal book The Cement of the Universe (1974). As well as offering a sophisticated regularity theory of causation ‘in the objects’, Mackie presented a counterfactual account of the concept of a cause as "what makes the difference in relation to some background or causal field" (1980, p.xi). Mackie's account of the concept of causation is rich in insights, especially concerning its relativity to a field of background conditions. However, his account never gained as much attention as his regularity theory of causation ‘in the objects’, no doubt because his view of counterfactuals (in his (1973)), as condensed arguments that do not have truth values, compounded empiricists' scepticism about counterfactuals.

The true potential of the counterfactual approach to causation did not become clear until counterfactuals became better understood through the development of possible world semantics in the early 1970's.

2. Lewis's 1973 Counterfactual Analysis

The best known and most thoroughly elaborated counterfactual theory of causation is David Lewis's theory in his (1973b), which was refined and extended in articles subsequently collected in his (1986a). In response to doubts about the theory's treatment of preemption, Lewis has recently proposed a fairly radical revision of the theory . (See his Whitehead Lectures published in his (2001a), and in a shortened form in his (2000).) In this section we shall confine our attention to the original 1973 theory, deferring for later consideration the recent changes he has proposed.

2.1 Counterfactuals and Causal Dependence

Like most contemporary counterfactual theories, Lewis's theory employs a possible world semantics for counterfactuals. Such a semantics states truth conditions for counterfactuals in terms of relations among possible worlds. Lewis famously espouses a realism about possible worlds, according to which non-actual possible worlds are real concrete entities on a par with the actual world. (See Lewis's defence of modal realism in his (1986e).) However, most contemporary philosophers would seek to deploy the explanatorily fruitful possible worlds framework while distancing themselves from full-blown realism about possible worlds themselves. For example, many would propose to understand possible worlds as maximally consistent sets of propositions; or even to treat them instrumentally as useful theoretical entities having no independent reality.

The central notion of a possible world semantics for counterfactuals is a relation of comparative similarity between worlds (Lewis (1973a)). One world is said to be closer to actuality than another if the first resembles the actual world more than the second does. Shortly we consider the respects of similarity that Lewis says are important for the counterfactuals linked to causation. For now we simply note two formal constraints he imposes on this similarity relation. First, the relation of similarity produces a weak ordering of worlds so that any two worlds can be ordered with respect to their closeness to the actual world, with allowance being made for ties in closeness. Secondly, the actual world is closest to actuality, resembling itself more than any other world resembles it.

In terms of this similarity relation, the truth condition for the counterfactual "If A were (or had been) the case, C would be (or have been) the case", symbolised as A counterfactually implies C, is stated as follows:

(1) A counterfactually implies C is true in the actual world if and only if (i) there are no possible A-worlds; or (ii) some A-world where C holds is closer to to the actual world than is any A-world where C does not hold.
We shall ignore the first case in which the counterfactual is vacuously true. The fundamental idea of this analysis is that the counterfactual A counterfactually implies C is true just in case it takes less of a departure from actuality to make the antecedent true along with the consequent than to make the antecedent true without the consequent.

In terms of counterfactuals, Lewis defines a notion of causal dependence between events, which plays a central role in his theory (1973b).

(2) Where c and e are two distinct possible events, e causally depends on c if and only if c occurs counterfactually implies e occurs and c does not occur counterfactually implies e does not occur.
This condition states that whether e occurs or not depends on whether c occurs or not. Where c and e are actual occurrent events, this truth condition can be simplified somewhat. For in this case it follows from the second formal condition on the comparative similarity relation that the counterfactual "c occurs counterfactually implies e occurs" is automatically true: this formal condition implies that a counterfactual with true antecedent and true consequent is itself true. Consequently, the truth condition for causal dependence becomes:
(3) Where c and e are two distinct actual events, e causally depends on c if and only if c does not occur counterfactually implies e does not occur.
The right hand side of this condition is, of course, Hume's second definition of causation. Lewis's official definition of causation differs from it, for he defines causation not in terms of causal dependence directly, but in terms of chains of causal dependence.

There are two immediate things to note about the definition of causal dependence. First, it takes the primary relata of causal dependence to be events. Lewis's own theory of events (1986b) construes events as classes of possible spatiotemporal regions. However, very different conceptions of events are compatible with the basic definition. Indeed, it even seems possible to formulate it in terms of facts rather than events. (For instance, see Mellor  (1996).) Secondly, the definition requires the causally dependent events to be distinct from each other. This qualification is important if spurious non-causal dependences are to be ruled out. (For this point see J. Kim (1973).) For it may be that your saying "Hello" loudly depends on your saying "Hello"; and your writing "Larry" depends on your writing "Lar". But neither dependence counts as a causal dependence since the paired events are not distinct from each other.

2.2 The Temporal Asymmetry of Causal Dependence

What constitutes the direction of the causal relation? Why is this direction typically aligned with the temporal direction from past to future? In answer to these questions, Lewis argues (1979) that the direction of causation is the direction of causal dependence; and it is typically true that events causally depend on earlier events but not on later events. He emphasises the contingency of the latter fact because he regards backwards or time-reversed causation as a conceptual possibility that cannot be ruled out a priori. Accordingly, he dismisses any analysis of counterfactuals that would deliver the temporal asymmetry by conceptual fiat.

Lewis's explanation of the temporal asymmetry of counterfactual dependence is based on a de facto asymmetry about the actual world. He defines a determinant for an event as any set of conditions jointly sufficient, given the laws of nature, for the event's occurrence. (Determinants of an event may be causes or traces of the event.) He observes it is contingently true that events typically have very few earlier determinants but very many later determinants. For example, a spherical wavefront expanding outwards from a point source is a process where each sample of the wave postdetermines what happens at the point at which the wave is emitted. The opposite process in which a spherical wave contracts inward with each sample of wave predetermining what happens at the point the wave is absorbed would obey the laws of nature, but seldom happens in actual fact.

Lewis combines this de facto asymmetry of overdetermination with his analysis of the comparative similarity relation (1979). According to this analysis, the most similar worlds are those in which the actual laws of nature are never violated. But exact similarity with respect to particular matters of facts in some spatiotemporal region is also an important aspect of similarity if it can be achieved at the cost of a small, local miracle, but not at the cost of a big, diverse miracle. There is no built-in time bias in this account. That comes only when it is combined with the asymmetry of overdetermination.

To see how the two parts combine consider the famous example of Nixon and the Nuclear Holocaust. An early objection to Lewis's account of counterfactuals (K. Fine (1975)) was that, counterintuitively, it makes this counterfactual false:

(4) If Nixon had pressed the button, there would have been a nuclear war.
The argument is that a world in which Nixon pressed the button, but some minute violation of the laws then prevented a nuclear war, is much more like the actual world than one in which Nixon pressed the button and a nuclear war took place. Lewis replies (1979) that this does not accord with his account of the similarity relation. On this account, a button-pressing world that diverges from the actual world by virtue of a miracle is more like the actual world than a button-pressing world that converges with the actual world by virtue of a miracle. For in view of the asymmetry of overdetermination, the divergence miracle that allows Nixon to press the button need only be a small, local miracle, but the convergence miracle required to wipe out the traces of Nixon's pressing the button must be a very big, diverse miracle. Of course, if the asymmetry of overdetermination went in the opposite temporal direction, the very same standards of similarity would dictate the opposite verdict.

In general, then, the symmetric analysis of similarity, combined with the de facto asymmetry of overdetermination, implies that it is easier to reconcile a hypothetical change in the actual course of events by preserving the past and allowing for a divergence miracle rather than shielding the future from change by having a convergence miracle. This fact in turn implies that, where the asymmetry of overdetermination obtains, the present counterfactually depends on the past, but not on the future.

2.3 Transitivity and Preemption

Lewis says that though causal dependence between actual events is sufficient for causation, it is not necessary (1973b). Counterfactual dependence is not transitive, so it can happen that three actual events c, d and e are such that d would not have occurred without c, and e would not have occurrred without d, but e would still have occurred without c. We consider an example shortly. Nonetheless, Lewis insists that causation is transitive so that c must be a cause of e if c is a cause of d and d is a cause of e.

To overcome this problem he extends causal dependence to a transitive relation in the usual way by taking its ancestral. He defines a causal chain as a finite sequence of actual events c, d, e,... where d depends causally on c, e on d, and so on throughout the sequence. Then causation is finally be defined in these terms:

(5) c is a cause of e if and only if there exists a causal chain leading from c to e.
This definition has the virtue of killing two birds with one stone. Not only does it ensure the transitivity of causation, but it also appears to solve an additional problem to do with preemption that is illustrated by the following example. Suppose that two crack marksmen conspire to assassinate a hated dictator, agreeing that one or other will shoot their victim on a public occasion. Acting side-by-side, assassins A and B find a good vantage point, and, when the dictator appears, both take aim. A pulls his trigger and fires a shot that hits its mark, but B desists from firing when he sees A pull his trigger. Here assassin A's actions are the actual cause of the dictator's death, while B's actions are a preempted potential cause. (Lewis distinguishes these cases from cases of symmetrical overdetermination in which two processes terminate in the effect, with neither process preempting the other. Lewis believes that these cases are not suitable test cases for a theory of causation since they do not elicit clear judgements.) The problem seems to be that both actions are on a par from the point of view of causal dependence: if neither A nor B acted, then the dictator would not have died; and if either had acted without the other, the dictator would have been killed.

However, given the definition of causation in terms of causal chains, Lewis is able to distinguish the preempting actual cause from the preempted potential cause. There is a causal chain running from A's actions to the dictator's death. For consider the intermediary event occurring between A's taking aim and the dictator's death: the bullet in mid-trajectory. The bullet's trajectory depends causally on A's action and the dictator's death depends causally on the bullet's trajectory. Hence, we have a causal chain, and so causation. But no corresponding intermediary can be found between B's actions and the dictator's death; and so for this reason B's actions do not count as an actual cause of the death.

2.4 Chancy Causation

So far we have considered how the counterfactual theory of causation works under the assumption of determinism. But what about causation when determinism fails? Lewis (1986c) argues that chancy causation is a conceptual possibility that must be accommodated by a theory of causation. Indeed, contemporary physics tells us the actual world abounds with probabilistic processes that are causal in character. To take a familiar example (1986c): suppose that you mischievously hook up a bomb to a radioactive source and geiger counter in such a way that the bomb explodes when the counter registers a certain number of clicks. If it happens that the counter registers the required number of clicks and the bomb explodes, your act caused the explosion, even though there is no deterministic connection between them.

In order to accommodate chancy causation, Lewis (1986c) defines a more general notion of causal dependence in terms of chancy counterfactuals. These counterfactuals are of the form A o-> Pr (C) = x, where the counterfactual is an ordinary world-counterfactual, interpreted according to the semantics above, and the Pr operator is a probability operator with narrow scope confined to the consequent of the counterfactual. Lewis interprets the probabilities involved as temporally indexed single-case chances. (See his (1980) for the theory of single-case chance).

The more general notion of causal dependence reads:

(6) Where c and e are distinct events, e causally depends on c if and only if, if c had not occurred, the chance of e's ocurring would have been much less than it actually was (given that c occurred).
This definition covers cases of deterministic causation in which the chance of the effect with the cause is 1 and the chance of the effect without the cause is 0. But it also allows for cases of irreducible probabilistic causation where these chances can take non-extreme values. It is similar to the central notion of probabilistic relevance used in probabilistic theories of causation, except that it employs chancy counterfactuals rather than conditional probabilities. (See the discussion in Lewis (1986c) for the advantages of the counterfactual approach over the probabilistic one.)

The rest of the theory of chancy causation follows the outlines of the theory of deterministic causation. Causal dependence is extended to a transitive notion by taking its ancestral. As before, we have causation when we have one or more steps of causal dependence.

3. Problems for Lewis's Counterfactual Theory

In this section we consider the principal difficulties for Lewis's theory that have emerged in discussion over the last twenty years.

3.1 Context-sensitivity

One relatively overlooked aspect of the concept of causation is its sensitivity to contextual factors. In so far as Lewis's theory overlooks this context-sensitivity, it represents a problem for the theory.

The theory assumes that causation is an absolute relation whose nature does not vary from one context to another. (This follows from the way the counterfactuals that define the central notion of causal dependence are governed by a unique, context-invariant system of weighted respects of similarity.) According to the theory, any event but for which an effect would not have occurred is one of the effect's causes. But this generates some absurd results. For example, suppose a person develops lung cancer as a result of years of smoking. It is true that if he had not smoked he would not have got lung cancer. But it is also true that if he had not possessed lungs or had not been born, he would not have got lung cancer. Commonsense draws a distinction between causes and background conditions, ranking the person's smoking among the former and the person's birth and possession of lungs among the latter.

In their seminal work Causation in the Law  (1965; 2nd ed 1985), H. L. A. Hart and A. Honor argue that the distinction between causes and conditions is relative to context in at least two different ways. One form of relativity might be called relativity to the context of occurrence. If a building is destroyed by fire, the presence of oxygen would be cited as a mere condition of the building's destruction. On the other hand, if a fire breaks out in a laboratory where oxygen is deliberately excluded, it may be appropriate to cite the presence of oxygen as a cause of the fire. The second form of relativity might be called relativity to the context of enquiry. For example, the cause of a great famine in India may be identified by the Indian peasant as the drought, but the World Food Authority may identify the Indian government's failure to build up reserves as the cause, and the drought as a mere condition.

For the most part, Lewis ignores these subtle context-sensitive distinctions. In his view (1986d), every event has an objective causal history consisting of a vast structure of events ordered by causal dependence. The human mind may select parts of the causal history for attention, perhaps different parts for different purposes of enquiry. However, Lewis does not specify the ‘principles of invidious selection’ by which some parts of the causal history are selected for attention, except to mention the relevance of Grice's maxims of conversation. But Grice's maxims of conversation are not well suited to explaining the context-sensitive distinctions involved in our causal judgements. As many philosophers have pointed out (A. Garfinkel (1981); C. Hitchcock (1996); P. Lipton (1990); J. Woodward (1984); and B. Van Fraassen (1981)), the contextual principles behind our causal judgements seem to rely on considerations concerning which class of situations the effect is contrasted with. As general principles of rational information exchange, Grice's maxims miss out on these causation-specific principles. (For discussion of the relevance of contrastive explanation to the causes/conditions distinction see Menzies (2001).)

3.2 Temporal Asymmetry

There have been several important critical discussions of Lewis's explanation of the temporal asymmetry of causation. (See P. Horwich (1987, Chap. 10); H. Price (1992) and (1996, Chap. 6); and D. Hausman (1998, Chap. 6).)

One kind of criticism has focused on the psychological implausibility of Lewis's explanation. (See Horwich (1987).) Recall that the explanation appeals, on the one hand, to a system of weighted respects of similarity between possible worlds that is delivered by a priori conceptual analysis and, on the other hand, to an asymmetry of overdetermination that is established a posteriori as a contingent truth about the actual world. The two-part explanation is supposed to employ facts that are sufficiently well known to play a role in the explanation of our linguistic use of counterfactuals. However, it is psychologically implausible that the intricate system of weighted respects of similarity involving comparison of miracles of different sizes could capture the intuitive similarity relation used in counterfactual reasoning. Why should we have developed such a baroque notion of similarity? Moreover, the asymmetry of overdetermination is an esoteric scientific finding that is not common knowledge to everyone using counterfactuals. Long before the discovery of the asymmetry of overdetermination, our ancestors used counterfactuals and assumed their temporal asymmetry. So it is very unlikely that this scientific finding could account for their mastery of this aspect of the use of counterfactuals. (For Lewis's reply to this criticism see Postscript E to "Counterfactual Dependence and Time's Arrow" in his (1986a, p. 66).)

Another criticism is that the de facto asymmetry of overdetermination is not sufficiently extensive to constitute the objective basis for the temporal asymmetry of causal dependence. Lewis concedes this asymmetry is a contingent feature of the actual world which may not obtain in other worlds. For example, in a simple world inhabited by a single atom, the asymmetry of overdetermination fails to obtain. Convergence to this world takes no more of a varied and widespread miracle than divergence from it, so that counterfactuals about what happens in this world are not temporally asymmetric. However, Lewis's use of the asymmetry of overdetermination has been criticised on the grounds that it fails not only in simple worlds of this kind but also in the actual world. (See Price (1992) and (1996).) This asymmetry, like the related fork asymmetry (correlated events typically have an earlier common cause but seldom a later common effect), is a product of thermodynamic asymmetries. The example of radiation that Lewis offers as a paradigm of the asymmetry of overdetermination depends on the fact that the sources of radiation stem from big disturbances in the initial conditions, but not in the final conditions of the system in question. If the system were a closed system in thermodynamic equilibrium, there would be no asymmetry. This means that the asymmetry of overdetermination, as a feature of thermodynamic disequilibrium, is a large-scale, statistical asymmetry, appearing at the macroscopic but not mircoscopic level. However, the commonplace judgement of physicists is that microphysical processes are causal and temporally asymmetric in character. In view of the failure of the asymmetry of overdetermination at the microscopic level, Lewis's theory is powerless to explain this fact.

3.3 Transitivity

As we have seen, Lewis builds transitivity into causation by defining it in terms of chains of causal dependence. However, a number of counter-examples have been presented which cast doubt on transitivity. (Lewis (2001a) presents a short catalogue of these counterexamples.).

Here is an example due to Michael McDermott (1995). A and B each have a switch in front of them, which they can move to the left or right. If both switches are thrown into the same position, a third person C receives a shock. A does not want to shock C. Seeing B's switch in the left position, A moves her switch to the right. B does want to shock C. Seeing A's switch thrown to the right, she now moves her switch to the right as well. C receives a shock. Clearly, A's throwing her switch to the right causes B to throw her switch to the right, which in turn causes C to receive the shock. But A attempted to prevent the shock so that it seems unreasonable to say that A's move causes C to be shocked.

Here is one more example, due to Ned Hall (2001).  A person is walking along a mountain trail, when a boulder high above is dislodged and comes careering down the mountain slopes. The walker notices the boulder and ducks at the appropriate time. The careering boulder causes the walker to duck and this, in turn, causes his continued stride. (This second causal link involves double prevention: the duck prevents the collision between walker and boulder which, had it occurred, would have prevented the walker's continued stride.) However, the careeering boulder is the sort of thing that would prevent the walker's continued stride and so it seems counterintuitive to say that it causes the stride.

Lewis has noted (2000) that all counterexamples to transitivity have a common structure. An event c occurs that initiates a process that threatens to prevent some later event e. However, c also causes another event d which cuts short the threatening process but also causes e to occur anyway. (Hall (2000), while noting this common structure, also observes that examples involving double prevention have distinctive features which make them easier to deflect as counterexamples to transitivity.)

The strategy Lewis adopts in his (2000) is to defend transitivity by diagnosing the sources of our inclination to accept them. For example, he points out that the examples typically involve a structure in which a c-type event generally prevents an e-type but in the particular case the c-event actually causes another event that causes the e-event. If we mix up questions of what is generally conducive to what, with questions about what caused what in this particular case, he says, we may think that it is reasonable to deny that c causes e. But if we keep the focus sharply on the particular case, we must insist that c does in fact cause e.

3.4 Preemption

As we have seen, Lewis employs his strategy of defining causation in terms of chains of causal dependence not only to make causation transitive, but also to deal with preemption examples. However, there are preemption examples that this strategy cannot deal with satisfactorily. Difficulties concerning preemption have proven to be the biggest bugbear for Lewis's theory.

In his (1986c), Lewis distinguishes cases of early and late preemption. In early preemption examples, the process running from the preempted alternative is cut short before the main process running from the preempting cause has gone to completion. The example of the two assassins, given above, is an example of this sort. The theory of causation in terms of chains of causal dependence can handle this sort of example. In contrast, cases of late preemption are ones in which the process running from the preempted cause is cut short only after the main process has gone to completion and brought about the effect. The following is an example of late preemption due to Hall (2001).

Billy and Suzy throw rocks at a bottle. Suzy throws first so that her rock arrives first and shatters the glass. Without Suzy's throw, Billy's throw would have shattered the bottle. However, Suzy's throw is the actual cause of the shattered bottle, while Billy's throw is merely a preempted potential cause. This is a case of late preemption because the alternative process (Billy's throw) is cut short after the main process (Suzy's throw) has actually brought about the effect.

Lewis's theory cannot explain the judgement that Suzy's throw was the actual cause of the shattering of the bottle. For there is no causal dependence between Suzy's throw and the shattering, since even if Suzy had not thrown her rock, the bottle would have shattered due to Billy's throw. Nor is there a chain of stepwise dependences running cause to effect, because there is no event intermediate between Suzy's throw and the shattering that links up them into a chain of dependences. Take, for instance, Suzy's rock in mid-trajectory.  Certainly, this event depends on Suzy's initial throw, but the problem is that the shattering of the bottle does not depend on it, because even without it the bottle would still have shattered because of Billy's throw.

To be sure, the bottle shattering that would have occurred without Suzy's throw would be very different from the bottle shattering that actually occurred with Suzy's throw. For a start, it would have occurred later. Following Lewis, let us call an event fragile to the extent that it could not have occurred at a different time, or in a different manner. One response to the problem of late preemption is to insist that the events involved should be construed as fragile events. Accordingly, it will be true rather than false that if Suzy had not thrown her rock, then the actual bottle shattering, taken as a fragile event with an essential time and manner of occurrence, would not have occurred. Lewis himself does not endorse this response on the grounds that a uniform policy of construing events as fragile would go against our usual practices, and would generate many spurious causal dependences. For example, suppose that a poison kills its victim more slowly and painfully when taken on a full stomach. Then, the victim's eating dinner before he drinks the poison would count as a cause of his death since the time and manner of the death depend on the eating of the dinner. (See his (1986c) for discussion.)

When we turn from preemption examples involving deterministic causation to those involving chancy causation, we see that the problems for Lewis's theory multiply. One particularly recalcitrant problem is described in Menzies (1989). (See also J. Woodward (1990).) Suppose that two systems can produce the same effect, perhaps at the same time and in the same manner. (It does not matter whether this is an example of early or late preemption.) However, one system is much more reliable than the other. The reliable system starts and, left to itself, will very probably produce the effect. But you do not leave it to itself. You throw a switch that shuts down the reliable system and turns on the unreliable one. As luck would have it, the unreliable system works and brings about the effect. This kind of example presents a problem for the probabilistic generalisation of the counterfactual theory because the preempting actual cause decreases the chance of the effect while the preempted potential cause increases its chance. In addition to the problem of explaining how the preempting cause qualifies as a cause when the effect does not causally depend on it, the probabilistic counterfactual theory faces the problem of explaining how the preempted cause is not really a cause when the effect does causally depend on it.

4. Recent Developments

In this section we shall consider some recent developments of the counterfactual approach to causation, which have been motivated by the desire to overcome the deficiencies in Lewis's 1973 theory, especially with respect to preemption.

4.1 Lewis's 1999 Theory

In an attempt to deal with the various problems facing his 1973 theory, Lewis has recently presented a revised version of the theory. The new version was first presented in his Whitehead Lectures at Harvard University in March 1999. (For the lectures see his (2001); a shortened version has appeared as his (2000).)

Counterfactuals play as central a role in the new theory as in the old. But the counterfactuals it employs do not simply state dependences of whether one event occurs on whether another event occurs. The counterfactuals state dependences of whether, when, and how one event occurs on whether, when, and how another event occurs. A key idea in the formulation of these counterfactuals is that of an alteration of an event. This is an actualised or unactualised event that occurs at a slightly different time or in a slightly different manner from the given event. An alteration is, by definition, a very fragile event that could not occur at a different time, or in a different manner without being a different event. Lewis stipulates that one alteration of an event is the very fragile version that actually occurs.

The central notion of the new theory is that of influence.

(7) Where c and e are distinct events, c influences e if and only if there is a substantial range of c1, c2, ... of different not-too-distant alterations of c (including the actual alteration of c) and there is a range of e1, e2, ... of alterations of e, at least some of which differ, such that if c1 had occurred, e1 would have occurred, and if c2 had occurred, e2 would have occurred, and so on.
Where one event influences another, there is a pattern of counterfactual dependence of whether, when, and how upon whether, when, and how. As before, causation is defined as an ancestral relation.
(8) c causes e if and only if there is a chain of stepwise influence from c to e.
One of the points Lewis advances in favour of this new theory is that it handles cases of late as well as early pre-emption. (The theory is restricted to deterministic causation and so does not address the example of probabilistic preemption described in section 3.4.) Reconsider, for instance, the example of late preemption involving Billy and Suzy throwing rocks at a bottle. The theory is supposed to explain why Suzy's throw, and not Billy's throw, is the cause of the shattering of the bottle. If we take an alteration in which Suzy's throw is slightly different (the rock is lighter, or she throws sooner), while holding fixed Billy's throw, we find that the shattering is different too. But if we make the same alterations to Billy's throw while holding Suzy's throw fixed, we find that the shattering is unchanged.

Another point in favour of the new theory is that it handles a type of preemption Lewis calls trumping. (Trumping was discovered by Jonathan Schaffer: see his (2000).) Lewis gives an example involving a major and a sergeant who are shouting orders at the soldiers. The major and sergeant simultaneously shout "Advance"; the soldiers hear them both and advance. Since the soldiers obey the superior officer, they advance because the major orders them to, not because the sergeant does. So the major's command preempts or trumps the sergeant's. Where other theories have difficulty with trumping cases, Lewis's argues his new theory handles them with ease. Altering the major's command while holding fixed the sergeant's, the soldier's response would be correspondingly altered. In contrast, altering the sergeant's command, while holding fixed the major's, would make no difference at all.

There is, however, some reason for scepticism about whether the new theory handles the examples of late preemption and trumping completely satisfactorily. In the example of late preemption, Billy's throw has some degree of influence on the shattering of the bottle. For if Billy had thrown his rock earlier (so that it preceded Suzy's throw) and in a different manner, the bottle would have shattered earlier and in a different manner. Likewise, the sergeant's command has some degree of influence on the soldiers' advance in that if the sergeant had shouted earlier than the major with a different command, the soldiers would have obeyed his order. In response to these points, Lewis must say that these alterations of the events are too-distant to be considered relevant. But some metric of distance in alterations is required, since it seems that similar alterations of Suzy's throw and the major's command are relevant to their having causal influence.

It has also been argued that the new theory generates a great number of spurious instances of causation. (For discussion see J. Collins (2000); I. Kvart (2001); and P. Dowe (2001).) The theory implies that any event that influences another event to a certain degree counts as one of its causes. But commonsense is more discriminating about causes. To take an example of Jonathan Bennett (1987): rain in December delays a forest fire; if there had been no December rain, the forest would have caught fire in January rather than when it actually did in February. The rain influences the fire with respect to its timing, location, rapidity, and so forth. But commonsense denies that the rain was a cause of the fire, though it allows that it is a cause of the delay in the fire. Similarly, in the example of the poison victim discussed above, the victim's ingesting poison on a full stomach influences the time and manner of his death (making it a slow and painful death), but commonsense refuses to countenance his eating dinner as a cause of his death, though it may countenance it as a cause of its being a slow and painful death. Pace Lewis, commonsense does not take anything that affects the time and manner of an event to be a cause of the event simpliciter.

4.2 Causation as Intrinsic Relation

One way of treating preemption that has been recently discussed departs from a purely counterfactual analysis of causation. It has been argued that preemption examples highlight the intuitive idea that causation is an intrinsic relation between events, which is to say it is a local relation depending on the intrinsic properties of the events and what goes on between them, and nothing else. The proferred treatments of preemption marry this intuitive idea with a crucial deployment of counterfactuals.

At one time Lewis himself resorts to this way of treating late preemption examples when he invoked the notion of quasi-dependence. (See his (1986c).) To explain this notion consider a case that resembles the case of Billy and Suzy throwing rocks at a bottle. Suzy throws a rock and shatters the bottle in exactly the same way in which she does in the original case. But in this case Billy and his rock are entirely absent. Lewis argued that since the process in the original case and the process in the comparison case are intrinsically alike (and also obey the same laws), both or neither must be causal. However, the comparison process is surely a causal process since, thanks to Billy's absence, it exhibits a causal dependence. Accordingly, the process in the original case must be a causal process too, even though it does not exhibit a causal dependence. In such examples Lewis has said that the actual process that does not exhibit causal dependence is, nonetheless, causal by courtesy: it exhibits quasi-dependence in virtue of its intrinsic resemblance to the causal process in the comparison case.

A related idea is pursued in Menzies (1996 and 1999). Menzies argues that there is an element in our concept of causation that resists capture in purely counterfactual terms. This element consists in the idea that causation is a structural relation that underlies and supports causal dependences. This idea can be captured by treating the concept of causation as the concept of a theoretical entity. Applying a standard treatment of theoretical concepts, he argues that causation should be defined as the unique occupant of a certain characteristic role given by the platitudes of the folk theory of causation. One platitude is that causation is an intrinsic relation between events. Another platitude is that it is typically, but not invariably, accompanied by causal dependence. Accordingly, causation is defined in the following way:

(9) c causes e if only if the intrinsic relation that typically accompanies causal dependence holds between c and e.
On this account, causation is not constituted by causal dependence. It is, in fact, a distinct relation for which causal dependence is, at best, a defeasible marker. The relation may be identified a posteriori with some physically specificable relation such as energy-momentum transfer. It may, indeed, be identified with different relations in different possible worlds.

This definition is supposed to explain commonsense intuitions about preemption examples. For example, Suzy's throw, and not Billy's throw, caused the shattering of the bottle, because the intrinsic relation that typically accompanies causal dependence connects Suzy's throw, but not Billy's throw, with the shattering of the bottle.

Lewis has since rejected his approach to preemption via quasi-dependence in favour of his current theory in terms of influence. (See his (2001a; 2001b).) He now claims that theories of causation as an intrinsic relation do not do justice to the full range of our intuitions about causation. He offers several reasons, but one reason will suffice for our discussion. He notes that the intuition that causation is an intrinsic matter does not apply to cases of double prevention. Consider a case of double prevention due to Hall (2001). A fighter is escorting a bomber on a raid. The pilot of the fighter shoots down an interceptor that would otherwise have shot down the bomber. The fighter pilot's action counts as a cause of the successful bombing because the action prevented something that would have prevented the bombing. Lewis observes that the causation in such cases of double prevention is partly an extrinsic matter. If the interceptor had been about to receive a radio order to return to base without attacking the bomber, the fighter pilot's action would not have been a cause of the bombing. Moreover, he notes that much of the spatiotemporal region between the pilot's shooting down of the interceptor and the successful bombing is simply empty so that there is no chain of events to serve as a connecting process between cause and effect. The intuition that causation is an intrinsic relation does not apply in this case. More generally, he argues that theories of causation as an intrinsic relation are overhasty generalisations of one specific kind of causation, and they fail to do justice to our intuitions about causation involving absences (as causes, effects or intermediaries).


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causation: causal processes | causation: probabilistic | conditionals: counterfactual | determinism: causal | events | facts | Hume, David | implicature | intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties | possible worlds | probability, interpretations of | rationalism vs. empiricism | scientific explanation | time: thermodynamic asymmetry in

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