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Backward Causation

Sometimes also called retro-causation. A common feature of our world seems to be that in all cases of causation, the cause and the effect are placed in time so that the cause precedes its effect temporally. Our normal understanding of causation assumes this feature to such a degree that we intuitively have great difficulty imagining things differently. The notion of backward causation, however, stands for the idea that the temporal order of cause and effect is a mere contingent feature and that there may be cases where the cause is causally prior to its effect but where the temporal order of the cause and effect is reversed with respect to normal causation, i.e. there may be cases where the effect temporally, but not causally, precedes its cause.

The idea of backward causation should not be confused with that of time travel. These two notions are related to the extent that both agree that it is possible to causally affect the past. The difference, however, is that time travel involves a causal loop whereas backward causation does not. Causal loops for their part can only occur in a universe in which one has closed time-like curves. In contrast, backward causation may take place in a world where there are no such closed time-like curves. In other words, an ordinary system S taking part in time travel would preserve the temporal order of its proper time during its travel, it would keep the same time sense during its entire flight (a watch measuring S's proper time would keep moving clockwise); but if the same system S were to become involved in a process of backward causation, the order of its proper time would have to reverse in the sense that the time sense of the system would become opposite of what it was before its back-in-time travel (the watch will start to move counter-clockwise). So neither backward causation nor time travel logically entails each other and time travel is distinct from back-in-time travel.

1. History

The philosophical debate about backward causation is relatively new. Only little consideration of the problem can be found in the philosophical literature before Michael Dummett and Anthony Flew initiated their discussion in the mid 1950s. The reason for this is twofold. No empirical phenomena seem to demand a notion of backward causation for our understanding of them. And for a long time it was thought that such a notion involved either a contradiction in terms or a conceptual impossibility. David Hume's definition of the cause as the one of two events that happens before the other thus rules out that the cause can happen after its effect. Moreover, according to Kant's idea of synthetic a priori truth the claim that the cause temporally precedes its effect was considered to state such a truth. In 1954 Michael Dummett and Anthony Flew had a discussion about whether an effect can precede its cause. Dummett defended the idea whereas Flew argued that it involved contradictions in terms.

Two years later, Max Black (1956) presented an argument against backward causation, which became known as the bilking argument, and later attempts to meet the argument seemed to generate all kinds of paradoxes. Imagine B to be earlier than A, and let B be the alleged effect of A. Thus we assume that A causes B even though A is later than B. The idea behind the bilking argument is that whenever B has occurred, it is possible, in principle, to intervene in the course of events and prohibit A from occurring. But if this is the case, A cannot be the cause of B; hence, we cannot have backward causation. Since then philosophers have debated the effectiveness of the bilking argument in particular and, in general, the validity and the soundness of the concept of backward causation.

In the 1960s and 1970s, physicists began to discuss the possibilities of particles travelling with a speed greater than light, the so-called tachyons, and as a consequence a similar debate about paradoxes involving backward causation arose among them. In case superluminal particles, like tachyons, exist and could be used to generate signals, it seemed possible to communicate with the past because tachyons going forward in time with respect to one set of reference frames would always be seen as travelling backwards in time from another set of reference frames.

2. Philosophy

A general notion of backward causation raises two sets of questions: those concerning conceptual problems and those that relate to empirical or physical matters. Among the first sets of questions that require a satisfactory answer are the following:

(i) Can metaphysics provide a notion of time that allows that the effect precede its cause? A proper notion of backward causation requires a static account of time in the sense that there is no objective becoming, no coming into being such that future events exist on the par with present and past events. It means that the future is real, the future does not merely consist of unrealised possibilities or even nothing at all. Ordinarily we may think of the past as a nothing that once was a something. But when asked what makes sentences about the past true or false, we would probably also say that it is the facts of the past that make present sentences about the past either true or false. The fact that I went to the cinema yesterday makes it true today when I say that I went to the cinema yesterday. This view is a realist one with respect to the past. If backward causation is to be conceptually possible it forces us to be realists with respect to the future. The future must contain facts, events with certain properties, and these facts can make sentences about the future true or false. Such a realist account is provided by static and tenseless theories of time. A static theory holds that the participation of time into the past, the present and the future depends on the perspective we human beings put on the world. The attribution of pastness, presentness and futureness to events is determined by what we take to exist at times earlier than and times later than the time of our experience.

(ii) Does backward causation mean that a future cause is changing something in the past? Even most protagonists consider it an unwarranted consequence that the notion, if true, involves the idea that the future is able to change the past. Their answer has therefore usually been that if we have the power to bring something about in the past, what came about really already existed when the past was present. We have to make a distinction between changing the past so it becomes different from what it was and influencing the past so it becomes what it was. A coherent notion of backward causation only requires that the future is able to have an influence on what happens in the past.

(iii) Can the cause be distinguished from its effect so that the distinction does not depend on a temporal ordering of the events? The adherents have usually tried to give an account of causation in which the cause and the effect are not seen as regularities between types of events. Various alternative proposals refer to counterfactuals, probabilities, manipulation and intervention, common cause or causal forks. It is, apparently, only a Humean notion of causation that needs the temporal identification of the cause and the effect.

(iv) Can the bilking argument be challenged in such a way that the mere possibility of intervention does not generate any serious paradoxes? The force of the bilking argument can, it seems, be weakened in various ways. First, one may hold that it is not a problem for our notion of backward causation that we can in principle intervene in the course of the events. If we actually do so and prevent A after B has occurred, then of course a particular later A (which does not exist) cannot be the cause of a particular earlier B (which exists). But in all those cases where nobody actually intervenes, events of the same type as A may be the cause of events of the same type as B. This is not different from what can happen in some cases of forward causation. Assume that P causes Q in the relevant circumstances. We may still prevent a particular P from happening, but at the same time a particular Q may nevertheless occur because in the given circumstances it is caused by another event than P. Second, if a later event A really causes an earlier one B, then it would be impossible to intervene into the cause of the event after B has happened and therefore impossible to prevent A from happening. If someone tries, she will by all means fail. It may intuitively sound strange as long as we think of backward causation as consisting of something we can control directly by our everyday actions. But if backward causation is a notion that is applicable only to processes that human beings are unable to control in any foreseeable way the notion would not provoke our intuitions so much.

3. Physics

The notion of backward causation raises a very different set of questions that need to be answered before a physically adequate notion has been developed.

(i) What, if anything, would in physical terms characterize backward causation? One has to remember that causality as such is an everyday notion that has no natural application in physics. How we could physically identify backward causal processes depends very much on which feature we take our ordinary notion of causation to apply to a physical process. In physics we may be tempted to associate it with different physical notions of processes. Four suggestions have been put forward: (a) the causal link can be identified with the transference of energy; (b) it can be identified with the conservation of physical quantities like charge, linear and angular momentum; (c) it can be identified with interaction of forces; or (d) it can be identified with the microscopic notion of interaction. It appears with respect to all four suggestions, however, that the involved descriptions are invariant under the time reversal operation.

The most fundamental laws of nature are time reversal invariant in the sense that our physical theories allow description of the fundamental reactions and processes in terms of the time reversed order. Such processes are said to be reversible in time. Maxwell's theory of electromagnetism, for instance, admits two kinds of mathematical solutions for the equations describing the radiation of energy in an electromagnetic field. One is called the retarded solution where radiation appears as outgoing concentric waves, the other is named the advanced solution according to which radiation appears as incoming concentric waves.   Apparently the advanced solution describes the temporal inverse phenomena of the retarded solution so that these two solutions are usually regarded as the time reverse solution of the other. Nevertheless, retarded waves, like the increase of entropy in quasi-closed systems, appear to be de facto irreversible although they are described in terms of time invariant laws. Nature seems to prefer certain processes rather than their temporally inversed counterparts in spite of the fact that the laws of nature do not show such a preference. Light, radiation and ripples on a pond always spread outwards from their source rather than inwards just like entropy of a quasi-closed system is always moving from lower to higher states.

3.1 The Wheeler-Feynman Absorber Theory

Why do we not see any advanced waves in nature? Wheeler and Feynman (1945) came up with an answer. If we assume, they said, that radiation from an isolated accelerated charged particle is equally retarded and advanced, that is half retarded and half advanced to be exact, we can explain why it appears to be fully retarded in terms of the influence distant absorbers make on the source. The absorber consists of charged material that reacts with the source field by radiating with half retarded and half advanced waves. It is this half advanced field of the charged particles of the absorber which is added to the half retarded field of the source. The advanced waves of the absorber interfere constructively with the retarded waves of the source, whereas the same waves cancel out the advanced waves of the source in a destructive interference. Thus one of the consequences of Wheeler and Feynman Absorber Theory is the idea that emitters are intrinsically symmetric, another is that there is no intrinsic difference between so-called emitters and so-called absorbers. In other words, if this theory is true we have to conclude that radiation from a source is a time symmetric process but the presence of an absorber makes it asymmetric.

The Wheeler-Feynman theory takes for granted that outgoing, expanding waves are identical with retarded radiation and incoming, contracting waves with advanced radiation. But is such identification without any problems? Not quite. An example with retarded and advanced emitters illustrates clearly why. Think of a stone being thrown directly into the middle of a circular pond. The ripples move outwards from the point where the stone hits the water (the source) in a coherent, organized wave front and eventually reach the edges (the absorber). Moreover, the source acts earlier than the absorber.  What will the inverse process look like? It depends on how we understand such a process, whether or not we consider a case that includes a reversed source and a reversed absorber. (A) If they are included, the edges of the pond will now act as the source and the converging waves will eventually reach the middle of the pond. We may create something like this if we dropped a big ring horizontally into the pond. Inside the ring the waves would move inwards in an organized wave front towards the centre.   In this case the source (the drop of the ring) would still act earlier than the absorber (the ripples meeting at the middle of the pond from all sides). (B) But if our understanding of the inverse process does not include an exchange of the source with the absorber and vice versa, then the ripples reach the edges of the pond (the absorber) earlier than the stone plunges into the water (the source). This is definitely not a state of affairs we could bring about. Furthermore, if we were to observe such a process, the ripples would seem to move inwards as contracting waves. The problem is that both kinds of inverse processes would seem to appear to us as organized incoming waves but one would be a case of retarded radiation and the other of advanced radiation.

This may not be the only problematic assumption of the Wheeler and Feynman theory. Huw Price (1996) has singled out other problems. Among them is the question of how we may experience the difference between retarded and advanced waves. When Wheeler and Feynman attributed to the source a field of half retarded and half advanced waves, they assumed that the field actually consists of retarded as well as an advanced component. Price objects, however, that there is no measurable difference between the two kinds of waves, and we cannot justify such a distinction by an appeal to the nature of the source because both emitters and absorbers can be associated with retarded as well as advanced waves. Instead he believes that these components are fictitious and that Wheeler and Feynman's formalism merely offer two different descriptions of the same wave. The problem of the asymmetry, as he sees it, has nothing to do with the fact that transmitters are associated with outgoing radiation rather than incoming radiation but that transmitters are centered on organized outgoing wave fronts whereas receivers are not centered on similar organized incoming wave fronts.

3.2 Tachyons

When the discussion of tachyons began to appear in physics in the 1960s, it was soon noticed that such particles according to some frames of reference were associated with negative energies going backwards in time. To understand how, consider the trajectory of the same tachyon in relation of three different reference frames, S, S*, and S** in the Minkowski-space. Now assume that A is, in relation to S, the emission of a tachyon at t1 and B is the absorption of the tachyon at t2. According to an observer in S, A will be earlier than B and the tachyon will carry positive energy forward in time. Nevertheless it is always possible to select a reference frame S* in relation to which an observer will see A happen simultaneously with B and yet another reference frame S** in relation to which an observer sees A happens at t2** whereas B happens at t1**. According to the observer in S**, A will take place later than B and the tachyon carries negative energy backwards in time (See Figure 1).

spacetime diagram of tachyon
Figure 1

In Figure 1 the planes represent the hypersurfaces of simultaneity. In relation to frame S the taychon source is at rest, and a tachyon is emitted at event A, with a superluminal but finite velocity. The absorption of the tachyon, event B, will accordingly occur later than A in relation to the observer in S, and the arrow of trajectory is for that reason pointing into the future above the hypersurface passing through A and standing perpendicular to the world-line of the source. But neither with respect to the frame S* nor S** is the tachyon source at rest and the hypersurfaces are therefore tilted in relation to the arrow of trajectory. An observer in S* observes the tachyon to have infinite speed, and therefore the hypersurface is tilted so much that it coincides with the arrow. The observer in S** is moving so fast with respect to the tachyon source that the hypersurface becomes titled so much that the arrow points into the past below the hypersurface.

E. Recami (1978) tried to avoid the idea that tachyons could move backwards in time by introducing the so-called reinterpretation principle according to which all negative energy tachyons should be interpreted as if they have positive energy and move forward in time. This would mean that the causal order of tachyons should not be regarded objective since both A and B sometimes denoted the emission and sometimes the absorption depending on the frame of reference. There are, however, good reasons to believe that this suggestion does not solve the problems it was intended to (Faye, 1981/1989).

3.3 Quantum Mechanics

Other physical candidates for backward causation can be founded in the physics literature. Richard Feynman once came up with the idea that the electron could go backwards in time as a possible interpretation of the positron (Feynman, 1949). In fact he imagined the possibility that perhaps there were only one electron in the world zig-zaging back and forth in time. An electron moving backwards in time would carry negative energy whereas it would with respect to our ordinary time sense have positive charge and positive energy. But few consider this as a viable interpretation today (Earman, 1967, 1976).

More recently the Bell type experiments have by some been interpreted as if quantum events could be connected in such a way that the past light cone might be accessible under non-local interaction; not only in the sense of action at a distance but as backward causation. Costa de Beauregard (1977, 1979), for instance, has suggested that when a system of two photons in a singlet state is measured by two observers in two regions separated by a space-like distance, then it is precisely the act of observation that produces the past of the measuring process in the sense that it influences the source that emitted the two photons. de Beauregard's idea is that the element of reality being revealed in the formulation of the EPR paradox is real only because it was created by actually performed acts of observation that was propagated backwards in time with one of the two correlated quantum objects from the measuring device to the source of the photons. Several other philosophers and physicists have come forward with similar ideas. The basic assumption behind all of them is that in the micro-world we find only causal symmetry and this fact together with proper boundary conditions can be used to give an explanation of outcomes that seem otherwise paradoxical. Such quantum correlation experiments can, however, be interpreted in many other ways.

3.4 Two alternatives

These alleged examples of backward causation have one thing in common. They are all based on the idea that fundamental physical processes are by themselves symmetric in nature. Our ordinary notion of causation does not track any nomological feature of the world. What counts as the cause and the effect depends on the observer's projection of his or her temporal sense onto the world. So it is still an open question how a coherent notion of backward causation can fit into this general understanding of nature. The question we therefore have to answer is the following:

(ii) How can we distinguish between forward causation and backward causation if all basic physical processes are time symmetric according to our description of nature? Two very different reactions to this problem seem possible.

3.4.1 Boundary Conditions

One proposal is to say that if we came across reversed cases of de facto irreversible processes, such as running a film backwards in which the cream converged in a coffee cup, such cases should be interpreted as examples of backward causation (Price, 1996). The point is here to argue that it is the absence of the right initial or boundary conditions that makes backward causation so rare or nearly empirically impossible. This interpretation is based on three basic assumptions: (i) there is no objective asymmetry in the world, causal processes are intrinsically symmetric in nature, or causation is bidirectional, and therefore the fundamental processes of the micro-world are temporally symmetric; (ii) causal asymmetry is subjective in the sense that any attribution of an asymmetry between cause and effect depends on our use of counterfactuals and our own temporal orientation; (iii) backward causation, or advanced action, is nonetheless possible because sometimes the correlation of certain past events depends on the existence of causally symmetric processes and some future boundary conditions. For instance, advanced actions in electrodynamics require that the existence of transmitters in the future are centered on organized incoming wave fronts; and advanced actions in quantum mechanics require that their present states are in part determined by the future conditions (measurements) they are to encounter. This feature is then taken to explain Bell's results in quantum mechanics.

A simple consideration seems to support this interpretation. Think of a particle travelling between two boxes. The normal observer and the counter-observer who has an inverse time sense will describe the exchange in conflicting terms. To the normal observer Box 1, say, will be considered as the emitter because it loses energy before anything in Box 2 happens. Therefore, Box 2 will be considered as the receiver since it gains energy at a later time. So in relation to the normal observer, the particle travels from Box 1 to Box 2. The counter-observer, however, sees the situation with opposite eyes. In relation to him, Box 2 loses energy and not until thereafter does Box 1 gain a similar amount of energy. Accordingly, in relation to the counter-observer, the particle moves from Box 2 to Box 1. In other words whether a box is considered to be an emitter or a receiver depends on the observer's time sense.

3.4.2 Nomic conditions

The other proposal denies that basic physical processes are time symmetric and argues, in contrast, that the causal asymmetry is objective and therefore that there exists an intrinsic difference between the cause and the effect of all physical processes. Hence backward causation should not be considered as a notion about boundary conditions but as a notion concerned with processes that nomically distinguish themselves from forward causal processes. Thus, if there are processes in the world that might be seen as a manifestation of backward causation, these are not to be depicted by a description that leaves them to be time reversed cases of ordinary forward causal processes (Faye, 1981/1989, 1997, 2002). This alternative interpretation rests on a basic claim and four assumptions.

The fundamental claim is that for any observer it is possible to identify experimentally the cause and the effect so that these remain the same even in relation to counter-observers, i.e. observers having the opposite time sense of ours. In support of this claim consider the following thought experiment. Two boxes, each having a shutter, are facing each other. Assume, ex hypothesis, that Box 1 is the particle source and Box 2 is the particle receiver. The question is how a normal observer and a counter-observer can come to agreement that particles move from Box 1 to Box 2. The answer can be found through a series of manipulations with the shutters, I would say. There are four possible combinations of the two shutters: open-open, close-close, open-close, close-open. Let us call any change of energy in Box 1, regardless of whether it emits or receives a particle, A and, similarly, any change of energy in Box 2 B. Whether A or B stand for a gain or a loss of energy can be determined by weighing the two boxes. (i) In case both boxes are closed, no particle will leave Box 1 and no particle is received by Box 2, thus no gain or loss of energy occurs, and both the normal observer and the counter-observer see a situation of not-A, not-B. (ii) In case both boxes are open a particle leaves Box 1 and is received by Box 2. Again this can be observed by measuring the change of energy in the two boxes. Thus the observers will see a situation of both A and B. (iii) In case Box 1 is closed and Box 2 is open, they will observe no change of energy in Box 1 (because it is closed) and, since no particle is leaving Box 1, no particle will reach Box 2 although its shutter is open. Hence the observers measure no energy change in this box. Thus they see not-A and not-B. (iv) Finally, if Box 1 is open and Box 2 is closed, a particle leaves Box 1, but none is received by Box 2. In other words, there is a loss or a gain of energy in Box 1, but no loss or gain of energy in Box 2. So the observers see A and not-B. The upshot of this toy experiment is that the normal observer as well as the counter-observer experience two As but only one B, and one not-A but two not-Bs; therefore both will agree that the particles move from Box 1 to Box 2.

This means that what a normal observer identifies as a forward causal process will be regarded as a backward causal process in relation to the counter-observer in the sense that the very same event acting as a past cause for the normal observer will act as a future cause for the counter-observer. This indicates, too, that in relation to a normal observer forward causation and backward causation cannot be regarded as two different manifestations of nomologically reversible (but de facto irreversible) processes since both manifestations - the common process and the very improbable reversed process - would develop forward in time. If this claim is true, it implies that the description of physical processes should reflect such an intrinsic asymmetry in a way that the nomic description varies according to whether the process in question goes forward or backwards in time. Moreover, we must also be able to distinguish theoretically (and not only experimentally) between the normal observer's report and the counter-observer's report of the same process by a separate convention in respect to whether the process is forward moving or backward moving. What we want is a characterization of every physical process so that the invariance of cause and effect corresponds to nomological irreversibility.

In order to establish a nomic, intrinsic distinction between forward causal processes and backward causal processes one has to take departure in four assumptions. (i) Process tokens and process types are distinct in the sense that only process types are reversible, process tokens are not. (ii) A normal observer will describe causal processes propagating forward in time in terms of positive mass and positive energy states pointing into her future whereas she will describe the same tokens in terms of negative mass and energy states pointing into her past. This reflects two possible solutions of the four-momentum vector in the theory of relativity. (iii)Thus, one must distinguish between a passive time reversal operation and an active time reversal operation. The passive transformation is applied to the same process token by describing it in terms of opposite coordinates and opposite energy states. The active transformation, in contrast, brings about another token of the same process type in virtue of some physical translation or rotation of the system itself, both tokens having the same energy sign pointing in the same direction of time. (iv) The description in terms of positive mass and the possitive energy flow corresponds to the intrinsic order of the propagation.

Now, let us try to apply the nomic interpretation to the above consideration concerning the exchange of a particle between two boxes. In relation to the normal observer who describes the particle in terms of its positive energy component, it travels from Box 1 to Box 2 because Box 1 looses energy at an earlier time and Box 2 gains energy at a later time. The same situation is by the counter-observer described in terms of the particle's negative energy component as a situation where something happens in Box 2 before it happens in Box 1. In relation to the counter-observer, Box 2 would not, as the boundary interpretation suggests, loose energy. On the contrary, Box 2 would seem to gain energy, but the counter-observer would describe the particle as a series of negative energy states reaching into his future supposing the particle to be moving from Box 2 to Box 1 carrying negative energy. But, as we have just argued, the particle really moves from Box 1 to Box 2, from the counter-observer's future into his past carrying positive energy.

Consequently, the nomic interpretation holds that in relation to our normal time sense the causal direction of ordinary processes is identical with that of their reversed processes. In other words, take two tokens of a nomologically reversible process type, say A and B, and let B be the actively time reversed process of A, then this interpretation claims that A and B causally develop in the same direction of time. So, according to this view, neither incoming, contracting electromagnetic waves nor the decrease of entropy would count as examples of backward causation as long as such processes involve ordinary types of matter, i.e., matter that possesses positive mass and/or energy pointing, in relation to our normal time sense, towards the future. The notion of backward causation should instead be applied to matter of a different type, particles that appear to have, according to usual conventions, negative mass and/or energy pointing, in relation to our normal time sense, towards the future but positive mass and/or energy pointing towards the past. Such advanced matter, if it exists, should be distinguished from both ordinary retarded matter as well as tachyons by always being described with respect to our time sense in terms of negative mass and energy stretching forward in time. A consequence is that a world in which advanced matter exists together with retarded matter, and where advanced matter is able to interact directly with the same amount of retarded matter, both would, in case they actually did interact, annihilate without leaving any trace of energy.

How and whether the notion of backward causation has a role to play in physics has yet to be seen. But as long as no common agreement exists among philosophers and physicists about what in the physical description of the world corresponds to our everyday notion of causation, it would still be a matter of theoretical dispute what counts as empirical examples of backward causation.


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causation: causal processes | space and time: being and becoming in modern physics | time | time travel: and modern physics


Thanks to John Norton for his editorial suggestions and for his drawing of Figure 1.

Copyright © 2001
Jan Faye

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