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Category Theory
Category theory now occupies a central position not only in
contemporary mathematics, but also in theoretical computer science and
even in mathematical physics. It can roughly be described as a general
mathematical theory of structures and sytems of structures. However, it
is still evolving and the precise meaning of category theory, that is
what it is in the end about, remains to be fully clarified. It is at
the very least a very powerful language or conceptual framework which
allows us to see, among other things, how structures of different kinds
are related to one another as well as the universal components of a
family of structures of a given kind. Beside its intrinsic mathematical
interest and its role in the development of contemporary mathematics,
thus as an object of study for the epistemology of mathematics itself,
the theory is philosophically relevant in many other ways. As a general
formal tool, it can be used to study and clarify fundamental concepts
such as the concept of space, the concept of system or even the concept
of truth. It can also be applied for the study of logical systems,
which in this context are called "categorical doctrines", both at the
syntactic level, and more generally the prooftheoretical level, and at
the semantic level. As a framework, it is considered by many as
constituting an alternative to set theory as a foundation for
mathematics. As such, it raises many issues with respect to the nature
of mathematical entities and mathematical knowledge. Thus, there is
much for philosophers and philosophical logicians to learn, to use and
to think about.
Categories are algebraic structures with many different complementary
nature, e.g., geometric, logical, computational, combinatorial, just as
groups are manyfaceted algebraic structures. When categories were
introduced by Eilenberg and Mac Lane in 1945, they were entirely
auxiliary and were defined simply to provide a formal ground for
functors and natural transformations. As such, and as Eilenberg and Mac
Lane themselves recognized, they were at first entirely dispensable in
practice. The very definition of a category changed through time and
varied according to the choice of metamathematical framework one
decided to work in and the goals one had. Eilenberg and Mac Lane first
gave a purely abstract definition of a category, along the lines of an
axiomatic definition of a group, but then soon after and for practical
reasons, various mathematicians decided to define categories in a
settheoretical framework. (See, for instance Grothendieck 1957 or
Freyd 1964.) An alternative, initiated by Lawvere already in his Ph.D.
thesis in 1963 and developed in his paper published in 1966, consists
in characterizing the category of categories and to stipulate that a
category is an object of that universe. The latter approach, being
presently developed by various mathematicians, logicians and
mathematical physicists for different purposes, leads to what are now
called "higher dimensional categories". (See, for instance, Baez 1997,
Baez & Dolan 1998a, Batanin 1998, Leinster 2002, Hermida et. al.
2000, 2001, 2002.) The very definition of a category is not without
philosophical importance, since one of the objections to category
theory as a foundational framework is the claim that since categories
are defined as sets, category theory cannot provide a
philosophically enlightening foundation for mathematics.
In terms of collections, a category C can be
described as a collection Ob, the objects of
C, which satisfy the following conditions:
For every pair a, b of objects, there is
a collection Mor(a, b), namely, the
morphisms from a to b in C (when
f is a morphism from a to b, we
write f: a → b);
For every triple a, b and c of objects,
there is a partial operation from pairs of morphisms in
Mor(a, b) X
Mor(b, c) to morphisms in
Mor(a, c), called the composition of
morphisms in C
(when f: a → b and
g: b → c, (g o
f): a → c is their
composition);
For every object a, there is a morphism
ida in Mor(a, a), called
the identity on a.
Furthermore, morphisms have to satisfy two axioms:
Associativity: if f: a →
b, g: b → c and
h: c → d, then
h o (g o f) =
(h o g) o f
Identity: if f: a → b, then
(idb o f) =
f and (f o
ida) = f.
One of the interesting features of category theory is that it
provides a uniform treatment of the notion of structure. This can be
seen, first, by considering the variety of examples of categories.
Almost every known example of a mathematical structure with the
appropriate structure preserving map yields a category. Thus, sets with
functions between them constitute a category, usually called the
category of sets. Groups with group homomorphisms constitute a
category. Topological spaces with continuous maps constitute a
category. Vector spaces and linear maps constitute a category.
Differential manifolds with smooth maps constitute a category. And so
on. It is important to note that what characterizes a category is its
morphisms and not its objects. Thus, the category of topological spaces
with open maps is a different category than the category of
topological spaces with continuous maps. In particular, the latter will
have different properties as a category than the former. The previous
examples have something in common: the objects are all structured sets
with structure preserving maps. However, any entity satisfying the
conditions given in the definition is a category. Thus, any preordered
set is a category. For, given two elements p, q of
the preordered set, there is a morphism f: p
→ q if and only if p is less than or equal to
q. Hence, a preordered set is a category in which there is at
most one morphism between any two objects. A deductive system such that
the entailment relation is reflexive and transitive is a category. Any
monoid (and thus any group) can be seen as a category: in this case,
the category has only one object and the morphisms of the category are
given by the elements of the monoid. Composition of morphisms
corresponds to multiplication of elements of the monoid. It is easily
checked that the axioms of a monoid corresponds to the axioms of a
category in this particular case. It can therefore be said that the
notion of a category is a generalization of the concept of preorder
and at the same time a generalization of the notion of monoid.
These two classes of examples also show that a categery need not be a
collection of structured sets and structure preserving functions. A
slightly different example of this phenomenon is provided by the
following important case: the category hTop has as its
objects topological spaces and as morphisms equivalence
classes of homotopic functions between spaces.
Let us briefly come back to the case of deductive systems. A
category can be defined as a deductive system satisfying certain
equations. We first start with the notion of a graph: it
consists of two classes Arrows and Objects and two
mappings between them, s: Arrows →
Objects and t: Arrows →
Objects, namely the source and the target mappings. The arrows
are usually called the "oriented edges" and the objects "nodes" or
"vertices". Then, a deductive system is a graph with a
specified arrow
R1. ida:a →
a
and a binary operation on arrows
R2. given f: a → b
and g: b → c, the composition
of f and g is (g o f): a
→ c.
Of course, as usual, the objects of a deductive system are thought of
as formulas, the arrows are thought of as proofs or
deductions and operations on arrows are thought of as
rules of inference. A category is then defined as a
deductive system in which the following equations hold between proofs:
for all f: a → b,
g: b → c and
h: c → d,
E1. f o ida =
f, idb o f
= f, h o (g o
f) = (h o g) o
f.
Thus, by imposing an adequate equivalence relation on proofs, any
deductive system can be turned into a category. It is therefore
legitimate to think of a category as an algebraic encoding of a
deductive system. This phenomenon is already wellknown to logicians,
but probably not to its full extent. Indeed, the LindenbaumTarski
algebra of a theory in classical propositional logic is a Boolean
algebra. Since the latter is a poset, it is also a category. This in
itself is merely a change of vocabulary. Things become more interesting
when firstorder and higherorder logics are considered. For, the
LindenbaumTarski algebra for these systems yield, when properly
carried out, categories, sometimes called "conceptual categories" or
"syntactic categories". (See Mac Lane & Moerdijk 1992, Makkai &
Reyes 1977, Pitts 2000.)
Categories also appear at the semantical level. Even for
propositional logics, models of such systems are usually algebras,
e.g., Boolean or Heyting algebras, and as such they are categories. The
collections of such models also form categories, e.g., the category of
distributive lattices, the category of Heyting algebras, the category
of Boolean algebras. It can be shown that completeness theorems for
propositional systems are equivalent to representation theorems for the
appropriate category of algebras. For instance, the completeness
theorem for classical propositional logic becomes equivalent to Stone's
representation theorem for boolean algebras. Similar results can be
provided for intuitionistic logic and Heyting algebras and various
modal logics. (See, for instance, Ghilardi 1989, Ghilardi &
Zawadowski 2002, Makkai & Reyes 1995, Reyes & Zawadowski 1991,
Reyes & Zolfaghari 1991, 1996.) Again, this can be lifted to higher
order levels and completeness theorems are again equivalent to
representation theorems, but this time of categories.
Category theory unifies mathematical structures in a second, perhaps
even more important, manner. Once a type of structure has been defined,
it quickly becomes imperative to determine how new structures can be
constructed out of the given one and how given structures can be
decomposed into more elementary substructures. For instance, given two
sets A and B, set theory allows us to construct their cartesian product
A X B. For an example of the second sort, given a finite abelian group,
it can be decomposed into a product of some of its subgroups. In both
cases, it is necessary to know how structures of a certain kind
combine. The nature of these combinations might appear to be
considerably different when looked at from too close. Category theory
reveals that many of these constructions are in fact special cases of
objects in a category with what is called a "universal property".
Indeed, from a categorical point of view, a settheoretical cartesian
product, a direct product of groups, a direct product of abelian
groups, a product of topological spaces and a conjunction of
propositions in a deductive system are all instances of a categorical
concept: the categorical product. What characterizes the latter is a
universal property. Formally, a product for two objects a and
b in a category C is an object c of
C together with two morphisms, called the
projections, p: c → a and
q: c → b such that, and this is
the universal property, for all object d with morphisms
f: d → a and
g: d → b, there is a unique
morphism h: d → c such that
p o h = f and
q o h = g. Notice
that we have defined a product for a and b and not
the product for a and b. Indeed, products and, in
fact, every object with a universal property, are defined up to (a
unique) isomorphism. Thus, in category theory, the nature of the
elements constituting a certain construction is irrelevant. What
matters is the way an object is related to the other objects of the
category, that is, the morphisms going in and the morphisms going out,
or, put differently, how certain structures can be mapped into it and
how it can map its structure into other structures of the same
kind.
Another crucial aspect of category theory is that it allows to see
how different kind of structures are related to one another. For
instance, in algebraic topology, topological spaces are related to
groups by various means (homology, cohomology, homotopy, Ktheory). It
was precisely in order to clarify how these connections are made and to
compare them with one another that Eilenberg and Mac Lane invented
category theory. Indeed, topological spaces with continuous maps
constitute a category and similarly groups with group homomorphisms. In
the very spirit of category theory, what should matter here are the
morphisms between categories. These are given by functors and are
informally structure preserving maps between categories. This simply
means that, given two categories C and
D, a functor F from C to
D, should send objects of C to
objects of D and morphisms of C to
morphisms of D in such a way that composition of
morphisms in C is preserved, i.e.,
F(g o f) = F(g) o
F(f), and identity morphisms are preserved, i.e.,
F(ida) = idFa. It
follows immediately that a functor preserves commutativity of diagrams
between categories. Homology, cohomology, homotopy, Ktheory are all
example of functors. A more direct example is provided by the power set
operation which yields two functors on the category of sets, depending
on how one defines its action on functions. Thus, given a set X, P(X)
is the usual set of subsets of X and given a function f: X → Y,
P(f): P(X) → P(Y) takes a subset A of X and maps it to B = f(A),
the image of f restricted to A in Y. It is easily verified that it is a
functor. There are in general many functors between two given
categories and it becomes natural to ask how they are connected. For
instance, given a category C, there is always the
identity functor from C to C which
sends every object of C to itself and every morphism
of C to itself. In particular, there is the identity
functor over the category of sets. Now, the identity functor is related
to the power set functor described above in a natural manner. Indeed,
given a set X and its power set P(X), there is a function hX which
takes an element x of X and send it to the singleton set {x}, a subset
of X, i.e., an element of P(X). This function in fact belongs to a
family of functions indexed by the objects of the category of sets {hY:
Y → P(Y) Y in Ob(Set)}. Moreover, it satisfies
the following commutativity condition. Given any function f: X →
Y, the identity functor yields the same function Id(f): Id(X) →
Id(Y). The commutativity condition thus becomes: hY o Id(f) = P(f) o
hX. Thus the family of functions h() relates the two functors in a
natural manner. Such families of morphisms are called natural
transformations between functors.
The above notions constitute the elementary concepts of category
theory. However it should be noted that they are not fundamental
notions of category theory. These are arguably the notions of
limits/colimits which are, in turn, special cases of what is certainly
the cornerstone of the theory, the concept of adjoint functors. We will
not present the definition here. Suffice it to say that adjoint
functors pervade mathematics and this pervasiveness is certainly one of
the most mysterious fact that category theory reveals about mathematics
and probably thinking in general.
It is difficult to do justice to the short but intricate history of the
field, in particular it is not possible to mention all those who have
contributed to its rapid development. This warning being given, here
are some of the main threads that have to be mentioned.
Categories, functors, natural transformations, limits and colimits
appeared almost out of nowhere in 1945 in Eilenberg & Mac Lane's
paper entitled "General Theory of Natural Equivalences". We said
"almost", because when one looks at their 1942 paper "Group Extensions
and Homology", one discovers specific functors and natural
transformations at work, limited to groups. In fact, it was basically
the need to clarify and abstract from their 1942 results that Eilenberg
& Mac Lane came up with the notions of category theory. The central
notion for them, as the title indicates, was the notion of natural
transformation. In order to give a general definition of the latter,
they defined the notion of functor, borrowing the terminology from
Carnap, and in order to give a general definition of functor, they
defined the notion of category, borrowing this time from Kant and
Aristotle. After their 1945 paper, it was not clear that the concepts
of category theory would be more than a convenient language and so it
remained for approximately fifteen years. It was used as such by
Eilenberg and Steenrod in their influential book on the foundations of
algebraic topology, published in 1952 and by Cartan and Eilenberg in
their ground breaking book on homological algebra, published in 1956.
(It is interesting to note, however, that although categories are
defined in Eilenberg & Steenrod's book, they are not in Cartan
& Eilenberg's work! They are simply assumed in that latter.) These
books allowed new generations of mathematicians to learn algebraic
topology and homological algebra directly in the categorical language
and to master the method of diagrams. Indeed, many results published in
these two books seems to be inconceivable, or at the very least
considerably more intricate, without the method of diagram chasing.
Then, in 1957 and in 1958, the situation radically changed. In 1957,
Grothendieck published his landmark "Sur quelques points d'algebre
homologique" in which categories are used intrinsically to define and
construct more general theories which are then applied to specific
fields, in particular, in the following years, algebraic geometry, and
in 1958 Kan published "Adjoint functors" and showed that the latter
concept subsumes the important concepts of limits and colimits and
could be used to capture fundamental conceptual situations (which in
his case were in homotopy theory). From then on, category theory became
more than a convenient language and this, for two reasons. First, using
the axiomatic method and the categorical language, Grothendieck defined
abstractly types of categories, e.g., additive and abelian categories,
showed how to perform various constructions in these categories and
proved various results for them. In a nutshell, Grothendieck showed how
a part of homological algebra could be developed in such an abstract
setting. From then on, a specific category of structures, e.g., a
category of sheaves over a topological space X, could be seen as being
a token of an abstract category of a certain type, e.g., an abelian
category, and one could therefore immediately see how the methods
homological algebra for instance could be applied in this case, e.g.,
in algebraic geometry. Furthermore, it made sense to look for other
types of abstract categories, types of abstract categories which would
encapsulate the fundamental and formal aspects of various mathematical
fields in the same way that abelian categories encapsulated fundamental
aspects of homological algebra. Second, mostly under the influence of
Freyd and Lawvere, category theorists progressively saw how pervasive
the concept of adjoint functors is. Not only can the existence of
adjoints to given functors be used to define abstract categories, and
presumably those which are defined by such means have a priviledged
status, but as we have mentioned, many important theorems and even
theories in various fields can be seen as being equivalent to the
existence of specific functors between particular categories. By the
early seventies, the concept of adjoint functors was considered to be
the central concept of category theory.
With these developments, category theory became an autonomous part
of mathematics, and pure category theory could be developed. And
indeed, it did grow rapidly as a discipline but also in its
applications, mainly in its original context, namely algebraic topology
and homological algebra, but also in algebraic geometry and, after the
appearance of Lawvere's thesis in 1963, in universal algebra. The
latter work also constitutes a landmark in this history of the field.
For it is in his thesis that Lawvere proposed the idea of developing
the category of categories as a foundation for category theory, set
theory and, thus, the whole of mathematics, as well as using categories
for the study of theories, that is the logical aspects of mathematics.
In the sixties, Lawvere outlined that basic framework for the
development of an entirely original approach to logic and the
foundations of mathematics: he proposed an axiomatization of the
category of categories (Lawvere 1966), an axiomatization of the
category of sets (Lawvere 1964), characterized cartesian closed
categories and showed their connections to logical systems and various
logical paradoxes (Lawvere 1969), showed that the quantifiers and the
comprehension schemes could be captured as adjoint functors to given
elementary operations (Lawvere 1969, 1970, 1971) and finally argued for
the role of adjoint functors in foundations in general, through the
notion of "categorical doctrines" (Lawvere 1969). At the same time,
Lambek described categories in terms of deductive systems and used
categorical methods for proof theoretical purposes. (See Lambek 1968,
1969, 1972.) All this work culminated in the development of an other
idea due to Grothendieck and his school: the notion of a topos.
Even though the concept of a topos was presented in the sixties in
the context of algebraic geometry, it was certainly Lawvere &
Tierney's work on the elementary axiomatization of the concept,
published in the early 1970s, which gave to the notion its foundational
status and impetus. Very roughly, a topos is a category which also
possess a rich logical structure, rich enough to develop most of
"ordinary mathematics", that is, most of what is taught in an
undergraduate degree in mathematics. Thus, as such, it can be thought
of as a categorical theory of sets. But it is also a generalized
topological space and thus provides a direct connection between logic
and geometry. The 1970s saw the development and application of the
concept in many different directions. (For more on the history of topos
theory, see McLarty 1992.) The very first applications outside
algebraic geometry were in set theory where various independence
results were given a topos theoretical analysis. (See, for instance
Tierney 1972, Bunge 1974 but also Blass & Scedrov 1989, Blass &
Scedrov 1992, Freyd 1980, Mac Lane & Moerdijk 1992, Scedrov 1984.)
Connections with intuitionistic mathematics were noticed early on and
toposes are still used to investigate models of various aspects of
intuitionism. (See, for instance, Lambek & Scott 1986, Mac Lane
& Moerdijk 1992, Van der Hoeven & Moerdijk 1984a, 1984b, 1984c,
Moerdijk 1984, Moerdijk 1995a, Moerdijk 1998, Moerdijk & Palmgren
1997, Moerdijk & Palmgren 2002.) More generally, toposes can be
used to investigate various forms of constructive mathematics or set
theory. (See, for instance, Joyal & Moerdijk 1995 and Taylor 1996.)
They are also used in the study of recursiveness and more generally
models of higher order type theories. The introduction of the socalled
"effective topos" and the search for axioms for synthetic domain theory
are worth mentioning. (See, for instance, Hyland 1982, Hyland 1988,
1991, Hyland et. al., 1990, Mc Larty 1992, Jacobs 1999, Van Oosten 2002
and the references therein.) Lawvere's early motivation was to provide
a new foundation for differential geometry, a lively research area
which is now called "synthetic differential geometry". (See, for
instance, Lawvere 2000, 2002, Kock 1981, Bell 1988, 1995, 1998,
Moerdijk & Reyes 1991.) This is only the tip of the iceberg, for
toposes could very well be to the twentyfirst century what Lie groups
have been to the twentieth century.
Finally, from the 1980s to this day, category theory found new
applications. On the one hand, it now has many applications to
theoretical computer science where it has firm roots and contributes,
among other things, to the development of the semantics of programming
and the development of new logical systems. (See, for instance Pitts
2000, Plotkin 2000, Scott 2000 and the references therein.) On the
other hand, its applications to mathematics are becoming more
diversified and it even touches upon theoretical physics where
higherdimensional category theory, which is to category theory what
higherdimensional geometry is to plane geometry, is used in the study
of the socalled "quantum groups", or in quantum field theory. (See,
for instance, Baez & Dolan 2001 and other publications by the same
authors.)
Category theory challenges philosophers in two nonexclusive ways.
On the one hand, it is certainly the task of philosophy to clarify the
general epistemological status of category theory and, in particular,
its foundational status. On the other hand, category theory can be used
by philosophers in their exploration of philosophical and logical
problems. These two aspects can be illustrated briefly in turn.
Category theory is now a common tool in the toolbox of
mathematicians. That much is clear. It is also clear that category
theory unifies and provides a fruitful organization of mathematics.
Given these simple facts, it remains to be seen whether category theory
should be "on the same plane", so to speak, with set theory, whether it
should be considered seriously as providing a foundational alternative
to set theory or whether it is foundational in a different sense
altogether. (The same question applies, in fact and even with more
force, to topos theory, but we will unfortunately ignore this area
here.) Arguments in favor of category theory and arguments against
category theory as a foundational framework have been advanced. (See
Blass 1984 for a survey of the relationships between category theory
and set theory. See Feferman 1977, Bell 1981 and Hellman 2003 for
arguments against category theory. See Marquis 1995 for a quick
overview and a proposal.) This is in itself a complicated issue which
is rendered even more difficult by the fact that the foundations of
category theory itself still have to be clarified. Given that most of
philosophy of mathematics of the last 50 years or so has been done
under the assumption that mathematics is more or less set theory in
disguise, the retreat of set theory in favor of category theory would
necessarily have an important impact on philosophical thinking.
The use of category theory for logical and philosophical studies is
already well underway. Indeed, categorical logic, the study of logic
with the help of categorical means, has been around for about 30 years
now and is still vigorous. On that front, many important results have
been obtained but are still largely ignored by philosophers. Suffice it
to mention the generalization of KripkeBeth semantics for
intuitionistic logic to sheaf semantics by Joyal, the discovery of the
socalled geometric or coherent logic, whose practical and conceptual
significance still has to be exposed, the notion and theorems of strong
conceptual completeness, the geometric proofs of the independence of
the continuum hypothesis and other strong axioms of set theory, the
development of synthetic differential geometry which provides an
alternative to standard and nonstandard analysis, the construction of
the socalled effective topos in which every funtion on the natural
numbers is recursive, categorical models of linear logic, modal logic
and higherorder type theories in general and the development of a
graphical syntax, called sketches. Category theory also provides
relevant information to more general philosophical questions. For
instance, Ellerman 1987 has tried to show that category theory
constitutes a theory of universals which has properties radically
different from set theory considered as a theory of universals. (See
also Marquis 2000.) If we move from universals to concepts in general,
we can see how category theory could be useful even in cognitive
science. Indeed, Macnamara and Reyes have already tried to use
categorical logic to provide a different logic of reference. (See, for
instance, Macnamara & Reyes 1994.) Awodey, Landry, Makkai, Marquis
and McLarty have tried to show how it sheds an interesting light on
structuralists approach to mathematical knowledge. (See Awodey 1996,
Landry 1999, 2001, Makkai 1995, 1999, Marquis 1993, 1995, 2000, McLarty
1993, 1994.)
Thus, category theory is philosophically relevant in many ways and
which will undoubtedly have to be taken into account in the years to
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