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Brentano's Theory of Judgement

One of Brentano's foremost aims in philosophy was to provide a new foundation for epistemology and logic as two closely related disciplines. He tried to achieve this by a systematic analysis of the mental phenomena involved in attaining knowledge and in drawing inferences. For Brentano knowledge is reached by judgements that are directly or indirectly evident, and logical inferences can contribute to our knowledge because they can make a judgement indirectly evident for us. Hence both epistemology and logic rely on a conception of judgements, how they differ from other mental phenomena, and how they are related to each other.

Brentano's view of the nature of judgement differs significantly from other views that can be found in Aristotle, Kant, or Frege. In contrast to Aristotle, Brentano emphasizes the importance of existential judgements with only one term, and claims that predicative judgements are a special case of existential ones. In contrast to Kant, he emphasizes the difference between presentations and judgements, rejecting their unification in the single category ‘thinking’. In contrast to Frege, he holds that judgements do not require the existence of complete thoughts or propositions which have to be grasped before a judgement can be made. It is the mental act of judging, not its object or content, which is the bearer of truth-values. In view of these differences Brentano's theory of judgement has been called existential (non-predicative), idiogenetic (non-reductionist), and reistic (non-propositional).

Today Brentano's theory does not have many adherents. The now dominant view is that propositions or sentences are the objects of belief, and that judgements occur when beliefs are acquired, manifested, or changed. Logical inferences are then defined as relations between propositions or sentences, abstracting from the mental attitudes that go along with them. Although this anti-psychological approach is widely accepted today, there is still an open question concerning the order of explanation here: Are beliefs and judgements true because they are directed at true propositions, or should we say that propositions (and sentences) are true because they express true beliefs and judgements? Once this question is raised, Brentano's theory of judgement remains an interesting alternative to the current mainstream in logic and epistemology.

The Nature of Judgement

The main elements of Brentano's theory of judgement can be found in chapter 7 and appendix IX of his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (1874; the appendix was added in the second edition 1911). A more elaborate exposition of his theory is contained in the logic lectures which Brentano held at the University of Wuerzburg (1869-71) and at the University of Vienna (1875-1889). Unfortunately Brentano never realized his plan -- announced in the second edition of the Psychology (Vol. II, p.77n/p.230n) -- to publish his elementary logic as a whole. Up to now only a small selection of his lecture notes, mixed with excerpts from other writings by Brentano and his pupil Franz Hillebrand, has been published in Die Lehre vom richtigen Urteil (1956).

Brentano's leading question was a psychological one: What happens in our minds when we make a judgement? Introspectively it is an act quite similar to making a decision, although its behavioral effects are different. Suppose you are uncertain what to think about the existence of extraterrestrial life. Some data suggest that life exists only on earth, others suggest that there may be intelligent beings somewhere else in the universe. Eventually you may become convinced one way or the other, and you either accept or reject the existence of extraterrestrial life. That is when you judge.

This example illustrates three crucial claims that Brentano makes:

(1) Judgements require that something (some object) is given in presentation, but not that something is predicated of it.

(2) Judgements are either positive or negative, depending on whether the presented object is accepted as existing, or rejected as fictitious or non-existing.

(3) Judgements are best expressed in sentences of the form ‘A exists’ or ‘A does not exist’, where the term ‘A’ denotes the presented object which is also the object of the judgement, and the rest of the sentence indicates its quality.

These three claims form the core of Brentano's theory of judgement: The foundational thesis (1) concerns the relation between judgement and predication, the polarity thesis (2) determines the place of negation in judgements, and the existential thesis (3) determines a canonical form in which all judgements can be expressed. Of course, these claims must be seen in the context of Brentano's overall theory of mental phenomena, in particular in the context of his account of intentionality. This background cannot be discussed here, but it is worth mentioning that the term ‘object of judgement’, as it is used here, always refers to an entity which is distinct from the judgement itself and not contained in it. It is also assumed here that judgements have a content or subject matter, which is not separable from the act itself, and which Brentano originally called the ‘immanent objectivity of a mental phenomenon’. The content of a judgement must not be conceived as a propositional entity, however, since Brentano explicitly denied that judgements have such entities as their contents. (Complex entities which are not propositional and which are just as ephemeral as the content of a judgement can already be found in Aristotle; see G. B. Matthews, 1982.)

All three of Brentano's claims above were already highly controversial among his immediate pupils. We find for instance in Husserl's fifth Logical Investigation an account of judgements which deviates from Brentano in all three respects. According to Husserl judgements are intentional acts with a propositional content directed at proposition-like entities which he calls Sachverhalte. Why Husserl deviated from his teacher in such a radical way, and whether he did so for good reasons, are questions still in discussion today. (See for instance Mulligan 1988).

The Foundational Thesis and the Judgement/Predication Distinction

The claim that judgements are based on presentations is a commonplace in philosophy, but it is a matter of controversy how this relationship should exactly be spelled out. Traditional logic suggests that two presentations must be involved in every judgement, since a judgement is made when something is attributed or denied of something else. Therefore the sentences that are traditionally used for expressing judgements have the subject-predicate form ‘S is P’ and ‘S is not P’.

Brentano rejects this traditional view by pointing out that judgements may arise also from a single presentation. When someone judges that extraterrestrials exist, he does not connect the notion of extraterrestrial life with the notion of existence. He merely thinks of such beings and accepts their existence, i.e. he has a presentation of such beings and accepts it as a presentation of something existing. Existential judgements are therefore not to be expressed in the subject-predicate form ‘S is P’, but in the simple form ‘A exists’, when ‘A’ is a singular term, and ‘A's exist’ or ‘Some A exist’, when ‘A’ is a general term. (Brentano mentions in a footnote that Aristotle himself may have acknowledged simple judgements of this form. Psychology Vol. II, p.54n/p.211n).

Existential judgements show that predication is not necessary for forming a judgement, but neither is it sufficient according to Brentano. Many philosophers have assumed that a predicative judgement is nothing more than ‘the putting together of two ideas’ -- in the case of ‘S is P’ -- or ‘the separating of two ideas’ -- in the case of ‘S is not P’. This view is sometimes called the ‘combinatorial theory of judgement’, and Brentano was not the first to point out the deficiences of this view. He refers to John Stuart Mill who already denied that judgements arise from a habit of associating or dissociating ideas. What Brentano adds to Mill's criticism is a precise diagnosis of the mistake: the combinatorial theory tries to locate the characteristic feature of a judgement in its content instead of locating it in its quality. When we combine a subject- and a predicate-term we just form a more complex idea which is again the content of a presentation. What is still missing is the qualitative moment of acceptance or rejection (see Psychology, Vol II, p.63/p.221).

Thus Brentano's theory draws a sharp line between judgement and predication in recognizing judgements with a non-predicational content and in taking subjectless sentences at face value. Sentences like ‘It is raining’ or ‘There is no water on the moon’ need not be paraphrased into subject-predicate form along the lines of ‘The weather is rainy’ or ‘The moon is lacking water’. They directly express a judgement by specifying an object which is given in presentation (rain, water on the moon) and by indicating whether this object is accepted or rejected. (This advantage of Brentano's theory was especially exploited by Marty 1884-1895).

Things get more complicated, however, when Brentano later (in appendix IX of the second edition of the Psychology) introduces so-called ‘double judgements’. In making a double judgement one first accepts the existence of something, and then adds to this first judgement a second one to the effect that the object, whose existence one already has accepted, either has or lacks some property. According to this refined view, a predication is made not by combining two ideas or presentations, but by combining two judgements.

The introduction of double judgements leaves the analysis of existential judgements intact, since in judging that S exists we do not first accept S as existing and then attribute existence or non-existence to it. However, one can now predicate P of S in two different ways: either by first forming the complex presentation of an object S which is P and then accepting this object, or by first accepting the existence of S and then attributing P to it, thus making the double judgement that S is P. In this latter case too, the attribution of P involves two steps: first the predicate P is connected merely in presentation with object S whose existence has been accepted, and then the object S is accepted once more, but this time together with P as one of its properties. That predication and judgement remain distinct acts also in the case of double judgements can be seen from the following fact: When we imagine a person (perhaps oneself) who is double-judging that S is P, we can disagree only with the second part of her judgement, and still form the complex presentation of an S which is P. And conversely, we can form the complex presentation of an S which is P and yet agree with the double judgement that S is not P. (See Psychologie, Vol. II, p.164/p.295. This point is further elaborated in Terrell 1976).

In its final form Brentano's account of the relation between judgement and predication turns out to be less straightforward than the standard Fregean account with its simple distinction between ‘grasping a proposition’ and ‘judging it to be true’. At no point did Brentano, however, lose sight of the claim that predication is not essentially connected with judging.

The Polarity Thesis and the Judgement/Negation Distinction

According to Brentano's second thesis, judgements are always positive or negative. In this respect they are like preferences and emotional attitudes which are for or against something. (Brentano holds the controversial view that feelings and acts of will belong to the same category and that they all involve such a polarity.) Presentations, on the other hand, are neither positive nor negative. They simply present an object to the mind without taking a stance towards it. This happens when we simply see or hear something, or when we imagine something in our phantasy. As long as no judgement is made (and no emotional evaluation and no preference is involved), there is nothing positive or negative about an act of presentation.

This essential difference tends to be overlooked when one uses the single category of ‘thinking’ for both judgements and presentations, as does the Kantian tradition. According to Brentano presentations and judgements are as different from each other as they are different from feelings and acts of will. Their difference is not just external -- having to do with the way in which they influence our actions -- it is an internal difference lying in the distinctive quality of judgements. Therefore, if one acknowledges that feelings or acts of will form a separate category besides the category of ‘thinking’, one should accept for the same reason that judgements and presentations form distinct categories as well.

With his polarity thesis Brentano not only dismisses the Kantian tradition, he also rejects a view that Frege made popular, namely that there are no negative judgements. When we deny the existence of something, e.g. the existence of extraterrestrial life, we still accept something as true, Frege would say, namely the negative thought that there are no extraterrestrials. Negation enters the formation of thoughts, it does not divide judgements into positive and negative.

Frege's elimination of negative judgements rests on the assumption that thoughts (or judgement-contents) can be true or false independently of being accepted or rejected, and therefore can also be negated. Brentano does not explicitly discuss this view, but his objection to it seems clear: The polarity between truth and falsity must be grounded in our ability to form opposite judgements. We first have to realize that from two opposing judgements with respect to the same subject matter, one will be true and the other one false. Only then can we understand what it means for a sentence, (a judgement content, a proposition, a thought, or whatever), to be true or false. (These issues are further discussed in Reinach 1911).

Brentano's treatment of negation has important further consequences. First, if the contrast between truth and falsity is explained along these lines, then the contrast between positive and negative concepts must also be explained at the level of judgements, not at the level of presentations. In his later writings Brentano took up this challenge when he tried to show that only positively conceived ‘things’ are properly regarded as objects of presentations. This became his ontological doctrine called reism. (On this issue see Körner 1978).

Secondly, if negation is completely eliminated from the level of presentaions, the analysis of categorial judgements has to be revised accordingly. Initially, Brentano paraphrased these judgements in existential form as follows:

I: Some S are P There is an S which is P
E: No S is P There is no S which is P
O: Some S are not P There is an S which is a non-P
A: All S are P There is no S which is a non-P
The negation in E-judgements poses no problem: it properly indicates that a negative judgement is made. The negative concept ‘non-P’ used in the paraphrases of O- and A-judgements is more problematic, however. Here a negation enters at the level of presentations, not at the level of judgement as the polarity thesis requires.

A more complicated analysis is required to get around this difficulty. In the case of O-judgements the introduction of double judgements will help. It then turns out that an O-judgement does not consist in predicating non-P of S, but in first accepting S and then making a negative judgement to the effect that S is not P, i.e. a judgement that denies the application of P to S. This still leaves the A-judgements as a problem case. At this point Brentano again invokes a higher-level presentation, namely the presentation of someone whose judgements are evaluated as right or wrong. With these additional tools at hand, Brentano arrives at the following analysis of the four categorical judgements (see Psychology, Vol. II, 164-169/pp.295-298):

I: Some S are P There is an S and that S is P
E: No S is P There is no one who correctly judges ‘Some S is P’
O: Some S are not P There is an S and that S is not P
A: All S are P There is no one who correctly judges ‘Some S are not P’
All negations here indicate that a negative judgement is made. This vindicates the claim that the polarity between positive and negative judgements is basic and provides the distinguishing mark that separates judgements from presentations. Brentano admits, however, that for practical reasons it may be convenient to use negative concepts, e.g. for simplifying inferences. When one does so, one should keep in mind however that these concepts do not properly pick out objects of presentation. Along these lines one could also justify the use of propositional clauses and thereby avoid all the complications of the existential analysis; but Brentano does not seem to have considered this more radical simplification (see Psychology, Vol. II, p.169/p.299).

The Existential Thesis

Brentano's third thesis says that all simple judgements (that involve only a simple act of judging) can be expressed in sentences of the form ‘A exists’ or ‘A does not exist’ (or ‘A's exist’ and ‘A's do not exist’ respectively). This thesis marks the contrast to all propositional theories of judgement. Propositional theories assume that a complete sentence (or a that-clause) is needed for expressing the content of a judgement. That a proposition (or sentence) is actually accepted, i.e. that a judgement is made, must therefore be indicated by an additional sign -- like Frege's judgement-stroke -- or it remains implicit in the assertive use of a declarative sentence.

On Brentano's theory, by contrast, only a simple or complex term is needed to express the content of a judgement, and hence a complete sentence can express both the content and the quality of a judgement. In making this claim, Brentano relies on the distinction between categorematic and syncategorematic expressions, i.e. between terms that purport to denote entities, and expressions like ‘is’, ‘and’, ‘or’, etc. that do not. The former specify the content of a judgement, whereas the latter are used for specifying its quality. This distinction also applies to sentences of the form ‘A exists’. Here the ‘exists’ does not purport to denote anything -- the property of existence -- rather it indicates which judgement is made: A positive judgement in present tense in the case of ‘A exists (now)’, a negative judgement in the present tense in the case of ‘A does not exist now’, a positive judgement in the past tense in the case of ‘A existed’, a negative apodictic judgement in the case of ‘A does necessarily not exist’, etc. (I consider here throughout only the most basic distinction between positive and negative cases.)

Brentano also introduces two special signs to separate those sentence parts that specify the content of a judgement from those that specify its quality. He uses the sign ‘+A’ to express the positive judgement that A exists, and the sign ‘A’ to express the negative judgement that A does not exist. These signs remind one of Frege's judgement stroke, but the theory behind them is quite different. Two important differences should be noted here:

Firstly, ‘+A’ is not be read as ‘it is accepted that A exists’. This would suggest that the sign ‘+’ functions as the operator ‘it is accepted that’, and that the term ‘exists’ expresses part of the content of the judgement. But the whole point of Brentano's theory is that the term ‘exists’ is syncategorematic and merely expresses the quality of the judgement. ‘A’ alone must therefore express the whole (non-propositional) content. This also tells against a suggestion made by Arthur Prior, namely to read ‘A exists’ as ‘Something is A’. It is not enough to treat ‘existence’ as a second-level predicate to avoid the misinterpretation that it contributes to the content of the judgement (see Prior 1976, p.115).

Secondly, ‘A’ should not to be read as ‘the existence of A is rejected’. This would suggest that there is a difference between ‘the existence of A is rejected’ and ‘the non-existence of A is accepted’, and equally between ‘A is rejected as existing’ and ‘A is accepted as non-existing’. Brentano's theory leaves no room for such distinctions. Otherwise it would reduce to the (non-controversial) claim that all categorial judgements are expressible in the form of existential propositions. Brentano's much stronger claim is however that no propositions at all are accepted in such judgements, not even existential ones.

What, then, is the best way to read the formulas ‘+A’ and ‘A’? There is no better way than reading them as ‘A exists/does not exist’ or as ‘A is accepted/rejected’. Whatever term we use for the symbols ‘+’ and ‘’, they will have no specific meaning beyond their function of indicating the quality of the judgement expressed.

Having noted these differences between Brentano's and Frege's symbolism, one may wonder whether Brentano really has a consistent theory here.

One problematic fact is that it is unclear how to interpret the formulas ‘+A’ and ‘A’ when they are not used, but merely mentioned. When such a formula is quoted, the expression ‘A’ is still meaningful and expresses the content of a judgement, but the signs ‘+’ and ‘’ become completely idle. This, of course, is also true of Frege's judgement stroke, which loses its function when it is not used to make an assertion.

However, there seems to be further difficulty that is peculiar only to Brentano's symbols. Whereas Frege's judgement-stroke is added to complete sentences, Brentano's symbols are parts of complete sentences. But every complete sentence can be used without expressing a judgement, for instance as the antecedent or consequent of a conditional. There is no obstacle in forming the complex judgement ‘If A exists, then B does not exist’, and yet we cannot symbolize it as ‘If +A, then B’. Apparently, then, the term ‘exist’ is not (or not merely) an indicator of the judgement-quality, as Brentano would have it. (This objection was raised in Geach 1965.)

In dealing with this objection one might appeal to Brentano's own treatment of conditional (or hypothetical) judgements. He reduces them to single existential judgements with a complex object. Thus, a judgement of the form ‘If A exists, then B does not exist’ gets analysed as ‘An A together with a B does not exist’, where ‘A together with B’ denotes the complex object which is rejected (see Psychology Vol. II, p.170/p.299; see also Lehre p.123).

But there is more to Geach's objection. It shows that on Brentano's theory the term ‘exists’, like the copula ‘is’, can be used in two different ways. It can either be used to express a judgement or to talk about a judgement made by someone (possibly by oneself). We have already seen how Brentano uses this distinction for separating judgement and presentation, and for analysing A-judgements without invoking negative concepts. He also needs to make use of this distinction when it comes to conditional judgements. The judgement ‘If A exists, then B does not exist’ might then be analysed as ‘It is impossible correctly both to accept A and to reject B’, which can be expressed in existential form as ‘Someone who can correctly accept A and reject B does not exist’. (This analysis is suggested in Chisholm 1982, p.36).

In this way Brentano's theory of judgement may be applicable to a wider range of complex judgements (see Pasquarella 1987). Even if these extensions are rejected as unnecessarily complicated however, Brentano's existential analysis offers a viable alternative to the propositional theory at least for some basic kinds of judgements, like the ones used in syllogistic. This may not be very significant from the point of view of modern logic, which does not distinguish between basic and non-basic judgements in this way, but it may have a considerable ontological significance. Brentano's theory shows how a commitment to propositional entities can be avoided at least within certain limits. Entities like ‘propositions’, ‘states of affairs’, ‘facts’, ‘Meinongian objectives’, etc. might therefore be introduced only for convenience, but they need not be taken ontologically seriously. Any stronger commitment to such entities remains therefore dubious, and it is for this reason that Brentano came to reject the correspondence theory of truth. Judgements are true, according to his existential thesis, because certain entities exist (or do not exist), not because certain entities ‘correspond’ to our judgements. (Advocates of a correspondence theory have criticized Brentano precisely for this reason. See Schlick 1925, pp.60ff and 176ff).

The Reform of Logic

In the second half of the 19th century logic freed itself from the constraints of the Aristotelian tradition. This move is often linked with the demise of ‘psychologism’, the view that logic needs to be based on psychology. Mathematical logicians like Bolzano and Frege established modern logic as a strictly non-psychological, ‘objective’ discipline. From this point of view Brentano appears as one of the last advocates of the ‘old logic’, and his theory as a final attempt at providing a psychological foundation for logic.

It is true that Brentano rejected the idea of a ‘mathematical logic’ as he found it in the writings of George Boole (see Psychology, Appendix X). Nevertheless, as we have noticed, there are important points of convergence between Brentano's and Frege's views (of which neither of them seems to have been aware): (1) judgement is distinct from predication, (2) existence is not a first-level predicate, (3) logical analysis must penetrate the linguistic expressions which often disguise the form of our judgements. But this is not all. There is even more agreement between Brentano and modern logic, however, when one compares them with the old syllogistic logic.

This further convergence becomes visible when one considers Brentano's criticism of the traditional square of opposition. This square is made up of the four categorial judgements A (‘All S are P’), E (‘No S are P’), I (‘Some S are P’), and O (‘Some S are not P’), among which the following relations have been claimed to hold:

(i) A contradicts O, and vice versa.

(ii) E contradicts I, and vice versa.

(iii) A and E can be false but not true together (= law of contrariety)

(iv) I and O can be true but not false together (= law of subcontrariety)

(v) A implies I (= subalternation)

(vi) E implies O (= subalternation)

(vii) I converts into ‘Some P are S’ (simple conversion)

(viii) E converts into ‘No P is S’ (simple conversion)

(ix) A converts into ‘All non-P are non-S’ (conversion by contraposition)

(x) O converts into ‘Some non-P are not non-S’ (conversion by contraposition)

Brentano rejects almost all of these claims. After translating the categorical judgements into existential form (leaving aside double-judgements for the moment), he reaches the following conclusions:

(i) and (ii) are the only logical relationships correctly identified by traditional logic.

(iii) to (vi) are mistaken: If S is an empty term, both A and E are true, and both I and O are false.

(vii) and (viii) are correct, but not because of a conversion of one judgement into another one, but only because one judgement is expressed in two ways.

(ix) and (x) are correct, but no contraposition is needed; only a simple conversion is used.

All these results emerge from one major shift in the underlying theory of judgements: Traditional logic takes A and I to be positive judgements, and E and O to be negative ones. According to Brentano all universal judgements (both A and E) are negative and therefore lack any existential import, whereas all particular judgements (both I and O) are positive and have such import. Once this ‘mistake’ is corrected, most of the traditional disputes about their logical relationships become obsolete. This is why Brentano said that his theory "leads to nothing less than a complete overthrow, and at the same time, a reconstruction of elementary logic. Everything then becomes simpler, clearer, and more exact" (Psychology Vol.II 77/230). (For a critical survey of Brentano's logic reform see Prior 1962, pp.166ff. and Simons 1987).

When we compare Brentano's results with the doctrines of modern logic, we see that they are in complete agreement concerning (i) - (vi). With respect to (vii) and (x) there is at least no major disagreement. It is still acceptable to say that the simple conversion of terms is only a change in the linguistic expression of a judgement, not in the judgement itself, and the same can be said about the conversion of an A-judgement. Here, too, no contraposition is needed, since in predicate logic an A-judgement can be either expressed as an implication or a negated conjunction.

In conclusion one may say that Brentano's psychological approach to logic did not prevent him from arriving at results very close to what modern logic teaches us. Perhaps, then, the major difference between Brentano and modern logic should not be seen in his psychologism, but rather in his focus on general terms. Frege changed this focus with his function/argument analysis of sentences, thereby replacing general terms with unsaturated expressions. This step is missing in Brentano's theory, and that is what sets it apart from the mainstream in contemporary logic and epistemology.


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assertion | negation | predication and instantiation | propositions | psychologism | reism | square of opposition | truth: correspondence theory of

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