This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses XHTML/Unicode to format the display. If you think special symbols are not displaying correctly, see our guide Displaying Special Characters.
last substantive content change

The Biological Notion of Self and Non-self

Fundamental to biology are (1) defining the characteristics of identity which distinguish individual organisms from those of similar kind, and (2) describing the mechanisms that defend organisms from their predators. Immunology is the science devoted to these problems. A progeny of late 19th-century pathology and microbiology, immunology did not attain a formal theoretical construction until after World War II, when “the self” was introduced to provide a ready and convenient metaphor for deciphering immune reactivity. In the original formulation, normally, host constituents are ignored by the immune system, while “the other”—pathogens, foreign substances, altered host elements—are processed and destroyed. By the late 1970s, “the self” became the foundation of immune theorizing, and immunology dubbed itself the science of “self/non-self discrimination.” But this dominant model has recently been challenged, for the self is polymorphous and ill-defined. Contemporary transplantation biology and autoimmunity have demonstrated phenomena that fail to allow strict adherence to such a dichotomy of self/non-self, and as new models are emerging, “the self” has been left exposed as a metaphor, whose grounding—philosophically and scientifically—is unsteady and thus increasingly elusive as the putative nexus of immunology's doctrines.

1. Introduction

At an important nexus of pathology, clinical medicine, and basic biology, immunology has served several research agendas and thus defies a single, unifying experimental framework. Rather it is (and has been) characterized by multiple, even competing thought-styles (Crist and Tauber 1997), each requiring a different methodological apparatus to order its experimental program. But underlying each branch of immunology, the concept of an identified and protected “self,” a theoretical construction and fecund metaphor, has served as the central theme which integrates this diverse discipline. Indeed, the fate of “the self” in immunology offers a historical understanding of how the science has evolved.

Immunology during the first half of the twentieth century was pre-occupied with the more focused chemical questions of immune specificity, and the broader biological questions concerning immune identity remained unformulated. But after World War II, transplantation and autoimmunity became increasingly relevant both to basic immunologists and clinicians. These later concerns required a theoretical apparatus that explicitly addressed the question of biological identity and individuality. It was at this juncture that Sir Frank Macfarlane Burnet introduced the “self” into the immunological lexicon (Burnet and Fenner 1949), and upon that metaphor erected a theory of immunological tolerance that still dominates the field.

“Tolerance” refers to the immune system's “silence” to potential targets of destruction, thus allowing host constituents and some foreign elements an adopted co-equal status within the organism. Tolerance and autoimmunity are two sides of the proverbial coin: In one instance, the immune system is seen to ignore the host, and even foreign components, while in the other modality, the immune system attacks what is regarded by the outside observer as “self.” These findings challenged the notion of a “one-directional” schema of immune reactivity, for tolerance was shown to be more than a passive silence of immune function, but required a more complex balance of responses. By the 1990s, immunologists increasingly appreciated that an immune self, representing a fortress from which attacking lymphocytes might sally forth to destroy invaders, offered a naive depiction of what was, in fact, a dynamic equilibrium in which “attacked” and “tolerated” were not easily predicated.

The simple model of immunity as committed to discerning those mechanisms by which the “self” discriminates host elements from the foreign requires revision. No longer is the identity of the host organism given or assumed, and, indeed, immune selfhood embraces diverse definitions. The designation of “self” and the “other” ignores that such neat divisions or boundaries were adopted, or at best, were drawn with a certainty that remained problematic. In fact, early discrepancies accompanying the full embrace of a self/non-self discriminatory mode to explain immune function remain vexing. So, while in Burnet's original formulation, the host organism, perceiving an invasion by microbial pathogens, mounts a defensive response, contemporary immunology has broadened this agenda to include surveillance of the body for malignant, effete, damaged, or dead host constituents (altered “normal” cells), as well as auto-immune processes directed against undamaged elements—some of which may be part of ordinary physiological economy, while others are pathological. The challenges to define a basis for immune identity, within the coupled ambiguities of autoimmunity and tolerance, has consequently generated debate about selfhood as an organizing concept for the discipline.

So when immunology is summarily defined as the science of self/non-self discrimination, and Burnet's theory by which selfhood is currently understood, “with only slight modification…has passed from the status of theory to that of paradigm” (Golub and Green 1991, p. 15) and “no longer a theory but a fact” (Klein 1990, p. 335), a vast body of experimental data and explanation is ignored. Despite such dogma, the immune self, an implicit entity in the late 19th century (Tauber and Chernyak 1991; Mazumdar 1995), has became a hotly contested one today (Langman 2000), and offers a rich philosophical topic, both in terms of its epistemological standing, as well as its metaphysical foundations (Tauber 1994; 1999).

This article will outline, in a historical analysis, the two principle theories governing immunology's research program—the theory of immune identity, and a more recent one that challenges the very notion of selfhood. (Critics of this reading [Cohn 1998a; 1998b; Howes 1998] have been answered elsewhere [Tauber 1998b; 1999; 2000]). In those theoretical constructions are reflected the prevailing attempts to define the concept of organism. Note, while the immune self is rooted historically in the problematics of biological individuality (Loeb 1945; Buss 1987), its philosophical attention is distinct from those concerns (Wilson 1999) and subsumed to the broader questions of reductionism.

2. Historical Antecedents

The first medical use of the term “immunity” (originally a legal designation conferring exemption and distinction) appears in 1775, when Van Sweiten, a Dutch physician, used “immunitas” to describe the effects induced by an early attempt at variolization (Moulin 1991, p. 24). But the concept was not developed until the mid-19th century, when Claude Bernard set the theoretical stage for the autonomous organism (E. Cohen 2001). In contradistinction to an animal in humoral balance with a pervasive environment, Bernard postulated the primacy of the organism's essential independence. Physiology became the mode of inquiry for medical experimentation, one that instantiated a reductive strategy based on positivist principles. Later, biochemistry and genetics pursued this methodological and theoretical approach, thereby providing medicine with its modern experimental basis.

Bernard furnished biology with a new concept of the organism, one which would have wider ramifications than the establishment of a scientific method. Obviously, interchange with the environment was a necessary requirement for life, but Bernard emphasized how boundaries provided the crucial metabolic limits required for normal physiological function. With his concept of the milieu interieur, the body was envisioned as a demarcated, inter-dependent yet autonomous entity (“corporeal atomism” [E. Cohen 2001, p. 190]), thereby establishing the theoretical grounding that became the sine qua non for the development of the models for infectious diseases, genetics, neurosciences, and immunology in all of its various guises. He thus introduced a revolutionary approach to the study of the organism, and immunology became one of its defining sciences, indeed, immunity was alien to the older humoral view.

Given the inclusive and fluid metaphoric system underlying pre-modern medicine, to speak of “immunity” with respect to embodied states would not only be improper but nonsensical. If disease signified a relation among elemental qualities and humors that were materially constitutive of both the living organism and its life context, then “exemption from” on the model of juridico-political immunity would be a non sequitur at best. (E. Cohen 2001, p. 183)
By radically changing the inside/outside topology so that the organism's interior becomes the determining context of function, Bernard effectively isolated the organism from its environment, and joined a complex cultural movement of redefining the body more generally.

Bernard's notion of the body as independent of the environment complemented Malthusian economics, liberal political philosophy, and Comtian sociology. From these and other disparate sources, the autonomous body as a political, social, economic and medical entity was redefined in the 19th century (Foucault 1973; Agamben 1998), and Bernard played a central role in providing a theoretical biological foundation for its critical use in various discourses. Notwithstanding that “independence” is a political term, and neither fairly represents the dialectical relationships of the organism and its environment (Levins and Lewontin 1985), nor the evolutionary peculiarities of individuality itself (Buss 1987), the formulation has served as the touchstone for various cultural constructions of identity. Indeed, culture critics have seized on immunology as paradigmatic for the modern notions of identity, where boundaries are contested and the body becomes the localized site of battle between self and other (Haraway 1989, Martin 1994). The warfare metaphors—“attack,” “defense,” “invaders”—so prevalent in immunology's lexicon, dramatically illustrate this construction, both in terms of the self/other dichotomy, as well as the privileged regard of individuality over community.

3. Origins of the Immune Self

Immunology's history is generally regarded as intimately tied to those discoveries leading to the elucidation of the bacterial etiology of infectious diseases, which draws together twin disciplines—microbiology, the study of the offenders, and immunology, the examination of host defense. Thus, in this pathological context, immunology began as the study of how a host animal reacts to pathogenic injury and defends itself against the deleterious effects from such microbial insult. This is the typical historical account of immunology as a clinical science, a tool of medicine, and as such it focused almost exclusively on the role of immunity as a defender of the infected. The paradigmatic host is the patient, an infected “self,” which is the critical element for the power of this view. The clinical orientation, which assumes a given entity—the self—is obviously a dominant organizing perspective, but another perspective turns this assumption into a question or a problem: Rather than the science that seeks to discern the basis of self/non-self discrimination, immunology may also be regarded as more fundamentally concerned with the establishment of organismal identity.

This latter point of view was offered by Elie Metchnikoff, who came to the nascent field of immunology from an unexpected theoretical and methodological perspective—an embryologist, who sought to discover genealogical relationships in the context of Darwinism (Tauber and Chernyak 1991; Gourko, Williamson, and Tauber 2000). Intrigued with the problem of how divergent cell lineages were integrated into a coherent, functioning organism, Metchnikoff was thus preoccupied with the problems of development as process, which he regarded as analogous to Darwinian inter-species struggle: Cell lineages were inherently in conflict to establish their own hegemony, but unlike nature writ large he hypothesized that a regulatory system was required to impose order, or what he called “harmony” on the disharmonious elements of the animal. He found such an agent in the phagocyte, which retained its ancient phylogenetic eating function, to devour effete, dead, or injured cells that violated the phagocyte's sense of organismal identity. When pathogenic microbes were discovered in the 1870s, Metchnikoff soon applied the phagocyte the new role of defending the organism against invaders. Indeed, on this view, the phagocyte became an exemplar combatant of Darwinian struggle, now occurring within the organism.

In Metchnikoff's theory, immunity was a particular case of physiological inflammation, a normal process of animal economy. But there was a more subtle message: 1) immunity was an active process with the phagocyte's response seemingly mounted with a sense of independent arbitration, and 2) organismal identity was a problem bequeathed from a Darwinian perspective that placed all life in an evolutionary context. In short, Metchnikoff combined a Darwinian sensibility to a Bernardian conceptualization of autonomy.

Metchnikoff's overall representation constituted the phagocyte as an agent (Crist and Tauber 2001), an actor that is the cause of its own action—as a matter of endogenously generated and directed behaviors. The portrayal of the phagocyte as autonomous is largely derivative from the linked features of its capacity to sense its environment and move freely within it, and the various degrees of unpredictability and meaningfulness that characterize this behavior. The play of these features assemble an entity that is irreducibly the center of its own actions, one seen as analogous to the more complex organism with multiple functions: sensibility, locomotion, engulfment, ingestion, digestion, and excretion. Indeed, the phagocyte, as an agent, becomes a metaphorical “self,” a primordial microcosmic expression of what later immunologists would extend into an epistemology of biological identity. But while placing the identity function at the core of immunology's concerns, Metchnikoff failed to provide the necessary pre-conditions for those who would seek to demonstrate those reactions that conferred protection of such an entity. Much of the subsequent history of immunology may be traced to the attempts of establishing a definition of organismal identity and providing an experimental basis that would describe identity-making functions. These were scientific aspirations 19th-century biology could not fulfill.

4. Twentieth Century Constructions of the Immune Self

The first half of 20th-century immunology was devoted to establishing the chemical basis of immunity, leaving the parameters of selfhood tacit and assumed (Silverstein 1989). This chemical perspective dominated immunology until shortly after World War II, when transplantation and autoimmunity became increasingly relevant both to basic immunologists and clinicians. It was at this juncture that Sir Frank Macfarlane Burnet formally introduced the “self” into the immunological lexicon, and upon that metaphor erected a theory of immunological tolerance that was to henceforth dominate the field (Burnet and Fenner 1949; Tauber 1994). From this perspective, the foreign is destroyed by immune cells and their products, whereas the normal constituents of the animal are ignored. In other words, the host organism was a given identity within the Bernardian construct, one with implicit boundaries as defined by immune reactivity. What was “attacked” was “other;” that which was regarded by immune silence became “the self.”

As currently understood, "self" and "nonself" may be discerned by either arm of the immune system. The more phylogenetically ancient phagocyte and its associated recognition proteins (together comprising the components of ‘innate immunity’) rely on at least three strategies to distinguish the host from "other" (Medzhitov and Janeway, 2002): 1) Recognizing "microbial nonself" depends on the ability of the host to identify conserved products of microbial metabolism that are unique to pathogens and are not produced by the host animal. These invariant structures are referred to as pathogen-associated molecular patterns, and their recognition plays a crucial role in host defense against bacteria. 2) Identifying "missing self" relies on the detection of "markers of normal self" which are dedicated gene products and metabolic products unique to the host. Missing such markers may initiate immune destruction, whereas recognizing such normal self-markers requires that immune reactivity is coupled to inhibitory pathways of immune activation. (Interestingly, certain microbes have assumed such markers by horizontal gene transfer to encode self-markers and thus avoid detection.) 3) Markers of "altered self" may be induced by infection and cellular transformation, so when such "neo-antigens" arise they become targets for immune destruction. This mechanism is the principle "house cleaning" function of phagocytes that ingest apoptotic (dying) and necrotic (dead) cells.

Historically, the innate system has not been the focus of immunology, and, correspondingly, the mechanisms of how the innate immune system distinguishes self and nonself have only recently been discerned. Immunologists have, instead, been preoccupied with lymphocyte biology, whose so-called mechanisms of "acquired immunity" are characterized by the ability to 1) mount an increasingly robust immune reaction once appropriate lymphocytes "learn" of pathogen insult, and 2) "remember" such insult so that upon repeated invasion, the lymphocyte-antibody response is both quickened and augmented. This was the immunology that intrigued Burnet, who was intent on explaining how immune reactivity develops in three stages - recognition, amplification, and memory - and more fundamentally, how self and nonself were discerned by this system. He invoked "tolerance" to explain how auto-destructive immune reactivity was controlled, or more specifically, he proposed a hypothesis that might explain how the immune system ignores host constituents. He thereby provided immunology with a theory of the self: Tolerance, the negative image of the self (or that which is absent in the space of immune recognition), became the central motif of understanding immune reactivity.

Unlike Metchnikoff, Burnet sought a firm definition of the immune self. Burnet's theory proposed that the animal, during prenatal development, exercised a purging function of self-reactive lymphocytes (the cells responsible for synthesizing reactive antibodies and mediating so-called cellular reactions) so that all antigens (substances that initiate immune responses) encountered during this period would attain a neutrality status. Thus lymphocytes with reactivity against host constituents are putatively destroyed during development, and only those “tolerant” lymphocytes that are non-reactive are left to engage the antigens of the foreign universe. Accordingly, potentially deleterious substances would select lymphocytes with high affinity for them, and through clonal amplification a population of lymphocytes differentiates and expands to combat the offending agents. The hypothesis (first presented in 1949 and later developed into the “clonal selection theory” (CST [Burnet 1959]) contained two key challenges which dominated contemporary immunology: 1) How was tolerance induced and auto-immunity controlled? and 2) What was the mechanism that accounted for antibody and lymphocyte diversity? The latter issue was solved by molecular biologists by the mid-1980s (Podolsky and Tauber 1997); the former question, involving systems analysis, apparently requires a comprehensive model of the immune system as a whole and while theories of immune tolerance abound, the issue remains unresolved.

Aside from incomplete accounts of tolerance, there were early discrepancies arising from a continuum of auto-immune reactions, ranging from normal physiological and inflammatory processes to uncontrolled disease initiated by an immune reaction gone awry.

During this century, the evolution of concepts on autoimmunity could be summarized by “never, sometimes, always.” Thus from the early “horror autotoxicus” [Ehrlich] to the 1960s, immune autoreactivity was simply not considered…. With the first identification of autoreactive antibodies in patients and the subsequent conceptual association with autoaggressive immune behaviors, the “sometimes” phase was entered, necessarily equated with disease. By this time, immunology had laid its foundation on the clonal selection theory, which forbids autoreactive clones in normal individuals. Immunologists thereafter devoted 30 years discovering ways by which autoreactive lymphocyte clones can be deleted and why they fail to be deleted in autoimmune patients…. In the 1970s at least three sets of observations and ideas began to alter this course of events and to herald the “always” period. (Coutinho and Kazatchkine 1994, pp. 1-2)
Bountiful evidence in recent years has shown that autoimmunity is also a normal finding, and in these newer views, such functions are regarded as integrated within a more complex normal physiology (Schwartz and Cohen 2000; Horn et al 2001). Thus, immune reactivity, rather than functioning only in an “other-directed” mode is in fact bidirectional. This position contrasts with the “one-way” definition of selfhood, where there is a genetic self, whose constitutive agents see the foreign, and immune reactivity arises from this polarization with attack directed only against non-self (Tauber 1998a). Not unexpectedly, in this turn inwards, the immune self becomes increasingly difficult to define, unable to accommodate these new appraisals easily. There are at least half a dozen different conceptions of what constitutes the immune self (Matzinger 1994, p.993): 1) everything encoded by the genome; 2) everything under the skin including/excluding immune “privileged” sites; 3) the set of peptides complexed with T-lymphocyte antigen-presenting complexes of which various sub-sets vie for inclusion; 4) cell surface and soluble molecules of B-lymphocytes; 5) a set of bodily proteins that exist above a certain concentration; 6) the immune network itself, variously conceived (detailed below). While these versions may be situated along a continuum between a severe genetic reductionism and complex organismal constructions (Tauber 1998; 1999), each shares an unsettled relationship to Burnet's original dichotomous model of self and other (Langman 2000).

5. The Deconstruction of the Immune Self

Well before the current debate about the immune self, Niels Jerne attempted to dispel the many ad hoc caveats and paradoxes encumbering it by deconstructing the self concept altogether. He went beyond the current notion of the immune network composed of lymphocyte subsets, secreting immuno-stimulatory and inhibitory substances (essentially a simple mechanical model with interlaced, first order feedback loops) to propose a novel conception of immune regulation (Jerne 1974). His network theory was, from its very inception, a complex amalgam of fitting the pieces of the regulation puzzle in place, with an overriding desire of understanding the immune system as a cognitive enterprise, one that spawned different formulations (e.g., Varela et al 1988; Atlan and Cohen 1989; Stewart 1994a). In introducing this metaphoric construction of the immune system as analogous to the nervous system as early as 1960, Jerne set the stage for understanding newer immune metaphors—recognition, memory, learning—which built on that parallel with human cognition.

Jerne's idiotypic network theory hypothesis proposed that antibodies formed a highly complex interwoven system, where the various specificities “referred” to each other (Jerne 1974). Under the general rubric of “cognition,” he conceived of the immune system as self-regulating, where antibody not only recognizes foreign antigen, but is capable of recognizing self constituents as antigens (the so-called idiotopes). There was no essential difference between the “recognized” and the “recognizer,” since any given antibody might serve either, or both, functions. In other words, immune regulation was based on the reactivity of antibody (and later lymphocytes) with its own repertoire forming a set of self-reactive, self-reflective, self-defining immune activities. Strong experimental support notwithstanding (Horn et al 2001), the relative importance of Jerne's network compared to other systems models remains contested, not the least for it radical reformulation of immune identity.

According to Jerne's model, the “self” and “other” dichotomy collapses, for the system is complete unto itself. Consisting of interlocking recognizing units, each component reacts with certain other constituents to form a complex network. When the system is perturbed by the introduction of a substance that is “recognized” (i.e., it reacts with a members of the system), this disturbance initiates the immune response. Thus foreignness per se does not exist in this formulation. In short, the system “knows” only itself. In Burnet's simplified world of self/non-self discrimination, the immune system learned host/foreign distinctions, generated an army of reactive antibody and lymphocytes, and acted accordingly when “antigen” was encountered. But Jerne coupled the simple antibody-antigen interactions to the far more complex and non-discriminatory functions of the immune system that built upon self-recognition. On his view, “autoimmunity,” instead of an aberrancy, became the organizational rule to explain immune function. Strikingly, there is no explicit mechanism for self/non-self discrimination, and this apparent lacuna served as the nexus of critiques (reviewed in Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Tauber 1999; 2000). But for Jerne, the need to define the “self” as distinct from the “other” receded from his primary theoretical concerns, and this posture was to have important repercussions.

When the immune system is regarded as essentially self-reactive and interconnected, the “meaning” of immunogenicity, that is reactivity, must be sought in some larger framework. Antigenicity then is only a question of degree, where “self” evokes one kind of response, and the “foreign” another, based not on its intrinsic foreignness, but rather because the immune system sees that foreign antigen in the context of invasion or degeneracy. There is no foreignness per se, because if a substance was truly foreign, it would not be recognized, i.e., there would be no image by which the immune system might engage it. So in the Jernian network, “foreign” is defined as perturbation of the system above a certain threshold. Only as observers do we designate “self” and “non-self.” From the immune system's perspective, it only “knows” itself (Varela et al 1988). In this scheme, the immune system both disqualifies and abdicates any responsibility for discriminating “self” and “other.” Indeed, for Jerne, if one “needed” a self, it was the immune system itself. Most importantly, the singular defensive purpose of immunity was widened to include an array of physiological functions, each of them now regarded as fully integrated within the immune system itself (Matzinger 1994; Anderson and Matzinger 2000a; 2000b). If eventually successful, this move heralds a decisive shift in immunology's theoretical foundations, one more attuned to the diversity of immune functions which contribute to evolutionary fitness (I. Cohen 1992; 1994; Stewart 1994a). While host defense is a critical function, it is hardly the only one of interest. Indeed, the immune system might be regarded as primarily fulfilling an altogether different role if its phylogeny is carefully examined. On this basis, John Stewart has provocatively suggested that the immune system became defensive only after its primordial neuroendocrine communicative capabilities (Rabin, 1999; Ader, Felton, and Cohen 2001) were usurped for ‘immunity’ (Stewart 1994b).

In this spirit, Irun Cohen, and other contemporary theorists, refer to an “immune dialogue,” where the immune system continuously exchanges molecular signals with its interlocutor, the body (I. Cohen 1992; 1994). This “contextualist sensibility” highlights attention to complex systems that function in a self-organizing, dialectical interchange within itself (however its boundaries are drawn) and with its “outside” world (Levins and Lewontin 1985). No longer content with only defining the elements of the system and the local interactions of those components, biologists have increasingly come to appreciate that such systems are highly integrated within larger wholes and require analysis of how adjustments are made in relation to these other systems. This means, simply, that immune reactivity is determined by context (I. Cohen 1994; Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Grossman and Paul 2000), where agent and object play upon each other. In other words, as applied to the problem of self/non-self discrimination, from this ecological perspective, there can be no circumscribed, self-defined entity that is designated the Self, but rather there is an organism that is under constant challenge to respond along a continuum of behaviors, and it adapts and changes accordingly. In the case of the immune system, reactivity may vary from a full fledged immune response to mild irritation to quiescence.

Powerful molecular support for this contextual (or in another sense, ecological) orientation has been gathered. Consider the dominant model concerning lymphocyte activation, where it is generally appreciated that specific recognition of antigen by a lymphocyte receptor is not sufficient for activation, and that additional signals determine whether a cellular response or cell inactivation follows. In short, an antigen is neither self nor non-self except as it attains its “meaning” within a broader construct. Orthodox immune theory encompasses this idea in the so-called “two-signal model,” which does not require any of Jerne's hypotheses to fulfill its agenda. But there are more radical readings of the “contextualist” setting by which antigens are sensed, and debate concerning what constitutes the milieu of “meaning” of antigenicity and ensuing reaction have spawned certain provocative, and potentially important models of immune regulation (reviewed in Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Tauber 2000).

6. But Why Does the Immune Self Linger?

If we look at the “big picture,” as a chapter of biology, immunology is, on the one hand, adjusting to the twin demands of increasing molecular elucidation, and, on the other hand, an “ecological” sensibility. In both contexts, the “self” has slipped into an archaic formulation: From the molecularists' perspective, atomic delineations have outstripped explanations of immune regulation so that no molecular “signature” of selfhood suffices to explain the complex interactions of immunocytes, their regulatory products, and the targets of their actions. Reactivity has become the functional definition of immune identity. But when non-reactivity occurs, this may be because of active or implicit tolerance, which in turn is determined by many factors beyond Burnet's original formulation. Indeed, a new metaphor, “danger,” has been introduced to account for the integration of the immune system into the body as a whole, so that immune reactivity is regarded as determined not by a police function arbitrating self and non-self, but rather as a response to repair damage and defend against further deleterious agents of any kind—microbial, chemical, mechanical, etc. (Matzinger 1994).

When perceived as an attack on the centrality of self/non-self discrimination, much controversy has ensued (e.g., Langman 2000). While some detractors have generously called for a pluralistic approach (Vance 2000), and others have regarded the crisis over the self as overblown (e.g., Silverstein and Rose 2000), most would agree, at the very least, that immune selfhood is increasingly a polymorphous and ill-defined construct. Contemporary transplantation biology and autoimmunity have demonstrated phenomena that fail to allow faithful adherence to a strict dichotomy of self/non-self discrimination (Horn et al, 2001), and as new models are emerging, the immune self has been left exposed as a metaphor, whose grounding is unsteady and thus increasingly elusive as the putative nexus of immunology's doctrines. Quite simply, the immune system, now regarded as fully integrated with all the systems of the organism, no longer is seen as exclusively serving a separate “policing” function, one that protects a Self. Instead of searching for criteria of “self” and “other,” immune responses are increasingly studied as arising within a complex context which determines reactivity or dormancy. Self/non-self discrimination recedes as a governing principle when immunity is appreciated as both “outer-directed” against the deleterious, and “inner-directed” in an on-going communicative system of internal homeostasis. From this dual perspective, immune function falls on a continuum of reactivity, where the character of the immune “object” is determined by the context in which it appears, not its character as “foreign” per se.

Central to the context question, immunology must successfully integrate two, hitherto conceptually separate systems of inflammation. Virtually all attention regarding immune identity has been paid to the lymphocyte and its product, antibody. But there is an older phylogenetic system of immunity, the so-called “innate system” (as opposed to the “acquired” immunity of lymphocyte/antibody reactivity), which employs an ancient protein attack complex—complement (named originally as complementary to antibody)—and lectin proteins that together serve as opsonizing (coating) recognition proteins for phagocytes. This innate system is, in fact, the first line of defense against invading pathogens, and while it lacks the exquisite specificity of the lymphocyte system, the phagocyte with its attendant co-factors readily recognizes bacteria, some viruses, fungi, and protozoans, and also responds to non-specific damage to body tissues. The interesting issue for this discussion is that the innate system of immunity lacks the ability to distinguish self from non-self in the terms defined for lymphocyte biology, yet a second (or perhaps third) signal is required from these non-distinguishing antigen-presenting phagocytes to activate lymphocytes. And there lies the rub. How are the two systems integrated to account for identity discrimination? The “danger” theorists maintain that these second signals must arise from such non-specifying sources so that the “self” concept essentially deconstructs, while the protectors of the self concept argue that the immune system simply needs to broaden its scope to integrate such “non-discriminatory” signals into a more discriminating system. In either case, a new theoretical consensus seems to be emerging as the “self” is either bypassed or expanded beyond its original formulation. (For review of contending theories see Anderson and Matzinger 2000b)

These developments continue a trajectory of two major theoretical developments: Originally, Metchnikoff regarded immunology as effecting dual functions: first, establishing organismal identity, and then protecting its integrity. His immunochemical contemporaries and their direct heirs followed the second agenda to the exclusion of the first. The primacy of the identity issue was re-introduced by Burnet, and his program defined immunology for the latter half of the 20th century. The second theoretical advance was made by Jerne, who moved past the identity issue altogether. No longer in service to a “self,” on his view the immune system functioned within a greater whole as a cognitive faculty, perceiving only what it might know—itself. Jerne thus introduced, perhaps ironically, a revision of the self metaphor, not its final elimination. For him, patterns, context, and interlocution become organizing principles, so that the self, assuming a Jernian perspective, is eclipsed by another catch-all metaphor, cognition, a direct descendent of the self concept, which itself readily lends to the scientific dictionary a host of meanings borrowed from other human experience (Tauber 1994; 1997; 1999). Without pursuing the ramifications of the cognitive approach to immunity, it is still evident that this turn in the language—“perception,” “memory,” “learning”—are in service to a more elusive “knowing entity.” Thus hidden within new formulations, the self still resides, reflecting a deep struggle over the character of biology, one that has its roots in Bernard's original understanding of autonomy, and now linked to our own more complex ecological views of agency and determinism.

On balance, notwithstanding the weakness of the metaphor, “self” maintains important uses despite its indistinct borders. Arguably, its elusive character is crucial to its utility and evocative power. But there is a deeper concern with the self's philosophical underpinnings, so that beyond the scientific rationale, the history of the concept of self suggests that the metaphor has specific uses not readily applied to the investigation of immune phenomena. Charles Taylor's description of “the punctual self” clarifies this issue (1989):

John Locke attempted to construct “the self” as an autonomous legal unit to fulfill certain seventeenth-century liberal political goals. To do so he extrapolated from a philosophical invention. The “punctual” self was part of the early modern scientific conceit that regarded the knowing subject as totally divorced from the world in order to attain objectivity. The self itself also became a subject of scrutiny, so that ordinary experience might be seen from afar, objectified, and thereby controlled. He thereby reified the mind to an extraordinary degree, adopting a kind of atomism. This construction of the thinking subject supported a radical disengagement of oneself with a view toward remaking the world: “the real self is ‘extensionless;’ it is nowhere but in the power to fix things as objects” (Taylor 1989, p. 172). This power reposes in consciousness, a theme traced to Hume and later to William James (Tauber 1994, pp. 207-15) and the phenomenologists (ibid., pp. 215-29).

Taylor argues that the self, as an object (or entity) must fulfill certain criteria: it must have objective status, standing independent of any description or interpretation, and be capturable in explicit description. Most importantly, an object can and must be understood without reference to its surroundings or contingent circumstances (Taylor 1989, pp. 34-5). The self of Locke and David Hume cannot fulfill these criteria. Taylor makes the critical point that “the self” is the answer to the question, “Who am I?”, which requires answers totally dependent on cultural or moral contexts, frameworks, or orientation—human categories of personal and social action, of value. Epistemological criteria are obviously operative, but the question of personal identity is a moral issue, not an epistemological one. The self, then, is a moral description or category, one that fulfills criteria of human identification.

Thus the “punctual” or “detached” self arose from two tributaries: the agent of a moral philosophy in post-Reformation England and the scientific actor who would scrutinize the world, and himself, apart from any constitutive concerns: The self's “only constitutive property is self-awareness. This is the self Hume set out to find and, predictably, failed to find” (Taylor 1989, p. 50). This identity over time is a construction that simply fails to fulfill the essential criteria of an entity given above. Most importantly, defining personal identity, the “Who am I?” question, can only be answered in the context of social and moral concerns. Context-determined, the self simply cannot be reduced to some single psychological construction of continuity, not only because self-consciousness cannot be captured or defined, but more fundamentally, as Hume himself realized, this was only a psychological conceit, a vague awareness of an identity function held together by psychological reflection. It was a useful invention, but it had no basis that could be defined by any analytical criteria.

The problematic status of “the self” in ascribing human agency perhaps should have alerted immunologists to the limits of its application to their science. Just as humans are loosely understood as selves, so too might scientists refer to immune identity in a similarly vulgar sense. There has been, to be sure, metaphorical utility in the term, but scientists seek to move from metaphor to more concrete and precise definitions. If theory is based on phenomena that indeed may be described more objectively, then those terms of discussion are adopted, because the scientific lexicon seeks more precise reference to natural entities and their relationships. And if metaphors become distorting to the evidence, they are abandoned. On the view presented here, immunology's cooption of the “self” was, from the very beginning, restricted by the metaphor's vague meanings, and immunology must—and, indeed, is—now moving beyond its original models to embrace new theories and novel metaphors to build its evolving theoretical edifice. In its wake, the science leaves us to ponder the significance of its failure to define the self and the cultural implications of the attempt (Haraway 1989; Martin 1994).


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

biology, philosophy of | biology: notion of individual | biology: notion of self | feminist (topics): perspectives on the self

Copyright © 2002
Alfred Tauber

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy