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Notes to Autonomy in Moral and Political Philosophy
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1. Frankfurt's view is not explicitly an account of autonomy, but rather of freedom of the will. Nevertheless, the account has been absorbed into the literature on autonomy as a model of that notion (Frankfurt, 1987). See also Susan Wolf (1990), whose account of freedom has been taken by writers on autonomy to be relevant to accounts of that idea; this is despite her explicit claim that what she is modeling is not the concept of autonomy.

2. Partially in response to objections of this sort, Dworkin revised his view to exclude an explicit requirement of identification. For Dworkin, autonomy involves (among other things) the capacity to raise the question of whether one identifies with the desires in question (G. Dworkin 1988, 15).

3. This reply needs greater development of course, and it is not immune to problems that Arneson and others have raised. For example, it can be claimed that there is no non-arbitrary threshold in the possession of capacities for rational reflection that adequately explains why we put great weight on differences among people just below and just above such a threshold (concerning the capacities of rational reflection) but count as irrelevant vast differences among people above the line.

4. In discussions of this claim, it is often ambiguous whether the defender of such a social conception of the self intends the thesis as a metaphysical claim or merely a psychological one. For discussion, see Christman 2002, 133-34.

5. Although he does not couch his conception of liberalism in terms of autonomy, Dworkin's view can be understood as in this category: see R. Dworkin 2000, 237-84.

6. The characterization here reflects the Kantian strain in liberal thought. An arguably separable tradition of liberalism, which can be traced through the British Utilitarians, Isaiah Berlin and others, stresses the pluralism of moral viewpoints but looks skeptically upon the claim that “justice” can be determined independent of social realities and historical contingencies. This tradition, therefore, puts tolerance and the protection of individual liberty at the center of the liberal social order. (For discussion, see, in addition to Gaus (Liberalism ), Geuss 2002 and Ryan 1986.)

7. Paradoxically, use of a substantive conception of autonomy in order to exclude those participants living under (arguably) oppressive value systems &mdash such as women under some versions of religious fundamentalism for example &mdash implies that the victims of oppression have lower moral status, are less morally responsible for their choices, and (depending on one's view) less eligible for participation in democratic deliberation (if autonomy is necessary for all these) than their oppressors. For the latter will presumably enjoy the freedom from restrictions, abilities to resist authority, and the like which merit the label autonomy in a substantive sense. (This implication depends, of course, on the nature of the substantive condition specified by a particular model of autonomy.)

8. The disjunction here &mdash “some of us or all of us in some ways” &mdash is used because of the variety of critical views being covered. Some claim that all of us (as a matter of metaphysics or psychological fact) are socially constituted in ways that go unnoticed in liberal theories (communitarians make such claims for example, as discussed earlier). While others argue that there are persons and groups whose social positioning relative to past and ongoing oppression makes their place in a social nexus, and the identifying markers of such a place, salient in their self-conceptions (their race or gender in racist and patriarchal societies for example) (see Harstock 1997, Mills 1997).

Copyright © 2003
John Christman

Notes to Autonomy in Moral and Political Philosophy
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy