This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses XHTML/Unicode to format the display. If you think special symbols are not displaying correctly, see our guide Displaying Special Characters.
last substantive content change

John Austin

John Austin is considered by many to be the creator of the school of analytical jurisprudence, as well as, more specifically, the approach to law known as "legal positivism." Austin's particular command theory of law has been subject to pervasive criticism, but its simplicity gives it an evocative power that cannot be ignored.

1. Life

John Austin's life (1790-1859) was filled with disappointment and unfulfilled expectations. His influential friends (who included Jeremy Bentham, James Mill, John Stuart Mill and Thomas Carlyle) were impressed by his intellect and his conversation, and predicted he would go far. However, in public dealings, Austin's nervous disposition, shaky health, tendency towards melancholy, and perfectionism combined to end quickly careers at the Bar, in academia, and in government service. (Hamburger 1985, 1992)

Austin was born to a Suffolk merchant family, and served briefly in the military before beginning his legal training. He was called to the Bar in 1818, but he took on few cases, and quit the practice of law in 1825. Austin shortly thereafter obtained an appointment to the first Chair of Jurisprudence at the recently established University College London. He prepared for his lectures by study in Bonn, and evidence of the influence of continental legal and political ideas can be found scattered throughout Austin's writings.

Lectures from the course he gave were eventually published in 1832 as "Province of Jurisprudence Determined." (Austin 1995) However, attendance at his courses was small and getting smaller, and he gave his last lecture in 1833. A short-lived effort to give a similar course of lectures at the Inner Temple met the same result. Austin resigned his University College London Chair in 1835. He later briefly served on the Criminal Law Commission, and as a Royal Commissioner to Malta, but he never found either success or contentment. He did some occasional writing on political themes, but his plans for longer works never came to anything during his lifetime, due apparently to some combination of perfectionism, melancholy, and writer's block. His changing views on moral, political, and legal matters also apparently hindered both the publication of a revised edition of "Province of Jurisprudence Determined," and the completion of a longer project started when his views had been different.

Much of whatever success Austin found during his life, and after, must be attributed to his wife Sarah, for her tireless support, both moral and economic (during the later years of their marriage, they lived primarily off her efforts as a translator and reviewer), and her work to publicize his writings after his death (including the publication of a more complete set of his Lectures on Jurisprudence) (Austin 1873).

While Austin's work was influential in the decades after his death, its impact seemed to subside substantially by the beginning of the twentieth century. A significant portion of Austin's current reputation derives from H.L.A. Hart's use (1958, 1994) of Austin's theory as a foil for the explanation of Hart's own, more nuanced approach to legal theory. In recent decades some theorists have revisited Austin's work, offering new characterizations and defenses of his ideas (e.g., Morison 1982, Rumble 1985).

2. Analytical Jurisprudence and Legal Positivism

Early in his career, Austin came under the influence of Jeremy Bentham, and Bentham's utilitarianism is evident (though with some differences) in the work for which Austin is best known today. On Austin's reading of utilitarianism, Divine will is equated with Utilitarian principles: "utility is the index to the law of God ... . To make a promise which general utility condemns, is an offense against the law of God" (Austin 1873: Lecture VI, p. 307; see also Austin 1995: Lecture II, p. 41). This particular reading of utilitarianism, however, has had little long-term influence, though it seems to have been the part of his work that received the most attention in his own day (Rumble 1995: p. xx). Austin early on shared many of the ideas of the Benthamite philosophical radicals; he was "a strong proponent of modern political economy, a believer in Hartleian metaphysics, and a most enthusiastic Malthusian." (Rumble 1985: pp. 16-17)

Austin's importance to legal theory lies elsewhere -- his theorizing about law was novel at three different levels of generality. First, he was arguably the first writer to approach the theory of law analytically (as contrasted with approaches to law more grounded in history or sociology, or arguments about law which were secondary to more general moral and political theories). Analytical jurisprudence emphasizes the analysis of key concepts, including "law," "(legal) right," "(legal) duty," and "legal validity." Though analytical jurisprudence has been challenged by some in recent years (e.g., Leiter 1998), it remains the dominant approach to discussing the nature of law. Analytical jurisprudence, an approach to theorizing about law, has sometimes been confused with what the American legal realists (an influential group of theorists prominent in the early decades of the 20th century) called "legal formalism" -- a narrow approach to how judges should decide cases. The American legal realists saw Austin in particular, and analytical jurisprudence in general, as their opponents in their critical and reform-minded efforts. In this, the realists were simply mistaken; unfortunately, it is a mistake that can still be found in some contemporary legal commentators.

(There is some evidence that Austin's views later in his life may have moved away from analytical jurisprudence towards something more approximating the historical jurisprudence school. (Hamburger 1985: pp. 178-91))

Second, within analytical jurisprudence, Austin was the first systematic exponent of a view of law known as "legal positivism." Most of the important theoretical work on law prior to Austin had treated jurisprudence as though it were merely a branch of moral theory or political theory: asking how should the state govern? (and when were governments legitimate?), and under what circumstances did citizens have an obligation to obey the law? Austin specifically, and legal positivism generally, offered a quite different approach to law: as an object of "scientific" study, dominated neither by prescription nor by moral evaluation. Subtle jurisprudential questions aside, Austin's efforts to treat law systematically gained popularity in the late 19th century among English lawyers who wanted to approach their profession, and their professional training, in a more serious and rigorous manner (Cotterrell 1989: pp. 79-81).

Legal positivism asserts (or assumes) that it is both possible and valuable to have a morally neutral descriptive (or "conceptual" -- though this is not a term Austin used) theory of law. (The main competitor to legal positivism, in Austin's day as in our own, has been natural law theory.) Legal positivism does not deny that moral and political criticism of legal systems are important, but insists that a descriptive or conceptual approach to law is valuable, both on its own terms and as a necessary prelude to criticism.

There were theorists prior to Austin who arguably offered views similar to legal positivism or who at least foreshadowed legal positivism in some way. Among these would be Thomas Hobbes, with his amoral view of laws as the product of Leviathan (Hobbes 1996); David Hume, with his argument for separating "is" and "ought" (which worked as a sharp criticism for some forms of natural law theory, which purported to derive moral truths from statements about human nature) (Hume 2000); and Jeremy Bentham, with his attacks on judicial lawmaking and on those, like Sir William Blackstone, who justified such lawmaking with natural-law-like justifications (Bentham 1970, 1996).

Austin's famous formulation of what could be called the "dogma" of legal positivism is as follows:

The existence of law is one thing; its merit or demerit is another. Whether it be or be not is one enquiry; whether it be or be not conformable to an assumed standard, is a different enquiry. A law, which actually exists, is a law, though we happen to dislike it, or though it vary from the text, by which we regulate our approbation and disapprobation. (Austin 1995: Lecture V, p. 157)
Third, Austin's version of legal positivism, a "command theory of law" (which will be detailed in the next section) has also been influential. Austin's theory had similarities with the views developed by Jeremy Bentham, whose theory could also be characterized as a "command theory." However, Austen's work was more influential in this area, because Bentham's jurisprudential writings did not appear in an even-roughly systematic form until well after Austin's work had already been published. (Bentham 1970, 1996; Cotterrell 1989: pp. 52-53)

3. Austin's Views

Austin's basic approach was to ascertain what can be said generally, but still with interest, about all laws. Austin's analysis can be seen as either a paradigm of, or a caricature of, analytical philosophy, in that his discussions are dryly full of distinctions, but are thin in argument. The modern reader is forced to fill in much of the meta-theoretical, justificatory work, as it cannot be found in the text. Where Austin does articulate his methodology and objective, it is a fairly traditional one: he "endeavored to resolve a law (taken with the largest signification which can be given to that term properly) into the necessary and essential elements of which it is composed." (Austin 1995: Lecture V, p. 117)

As to what is the core nature of law, Austin's answer is that laws ("properly so called") are commands of a sovereign. He clarifies the concept of positive law (that is, man-made law) by analyzing the constituent concepts of his definition, and by distinguishing law from other concepts that are similar:

Austin also wanted to include within "the province of jurisprudence" certain "exceptions," items which did not fit his criteria but should nonetheless be studied with other "laws properly so called": repealing laws, declarative laws, and "imperfect laws" - laws prescribing action but without sanctions (a concept Austin ascribes to "Roman [law] jurists"). (Austin 1995: Lecture I, p. 36)

In the criteria set out above, Austin succeeded in delimiting law and legal rules from religion, morality, convention, and custom. However, also excluded from "the province of jurisprudence" were customary law (except to the extent that the sovereign had, directly or indirectly, adopted such customs as law), public international law, and parts of constitutional law. (These exclusions alone would make Austin's theory problematic for most modern readers.)

Within Austin's approach, whether something is or is not "law" depends on which people have done what: the question turns on an empirical investigation, and it is a matter mostly of power, not of morality. Of course, Austin is not arguing that law should not be moral, nor is he implying that it rarely is. Austin is not playing the nihilist or the skeptic. He is merely pointing out that there is much that is law that is not moral, and what makes something law does nothing to guarantee its moral value. "The most pernicious laws, and therefore those which are most opposed to the will of God, have been and are continually enforced as laws by judicial tribunals." (Austin 1995: Lecture V, p. 158).

In contrast to his mentor Bentham, Austin had no objection to judicial lawmaking, which Austin called "highly beneficial and even absolutely necessary." (Austin, 1995: Lecture V, p. 163) Nor did Austin find any difficulty incorporating judicial lawmaking into his command theory: he characterized that form of lawmaking, along with the occasional legal/judicial recognition of customs by judges, as the "tacit commands" of the sovereign, the sovereign's affirming the "orders" by its acquiescence. (Austin 1995: Lecture 1, pp. 35-36).

4. Criticisms

As many readers come to Austin's theory mostly through its criticism by other writers (prominently, that of H.L.A. Hart), the weaknesses of the theory are almost better known than the theory itself:

(Austin was aware of some of these lines of attack, and had responses ready; it is another matter whether his responses were adequate.) It should also be noted that Austin's work shows a silence on questions of methodology, though this may be forgivable, given the early stage of jurisprudence. As discussed in an earlier section, in many ways, Austin was blazing a new path.

When H.L.A. Hart revived legal positivism in the middle of the 20th century (Hart 1958, 1994), he did it by criticizing and building on Austin's theory: for example, Hart's theory did not try to reduce all laws to one kind of rule, but emphasized the varying types and functions of legal rules; and Hart's theory, grounded partly on the distinction between "obligation" and "being obliged," was built around the fact that some participants within legal systems "accepted" the legal rules as reasons for action, above and beyond the fear of sanctions.

5. A Revisionist View?

Some modern commentators appreciate in Austin elements that were probably not foremost in his mind (or that of his contemporary readers). For example, one occasionally sees Austin portrayed as the first "realist": in contrast both to the theorists that came before Austin and to some modern writers on law, Austin is seen as having a keener sense of the connection of law and power, and the importance of keeping that connection at the forefront of analysis. (cf. Cotterrell 1989: pp. 57-79) When circumstances seem to warrant a more critical, skeptical or cynical approach to law and government, Austin's equation of law and force will be attractive - however distant such a reading may be from Austin's own liberal-utilitarian views at the time of his writing, and his even more conservative political views later in his life. (Hamburger, 1985)


Primary Sources

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

legal philosophy | nature of law | nature of law: legal positivism

Copyright © 2001
Brian Bix

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy