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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Aristotle and Mathematics
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The Infinite

This supplement places Aristotle's treatment of the infinite in the context of Greek mathematical thought. It is not intended to be exhaustive, however.

Preliminary Survey of Infinite Series

As a preliminary, it is useful to distinguish 3 types of series. Since we are dealing mostly with magnitudes, we shall think of a number, in context, as a number of units of measure. I shall mean by a convergent series, one that converges on a finite, positive value, and by a non-convergent series, one that increases ad infinitum. If the series is A0, A1, …, An, …, and a unit measure B, then for every number m, there is an n such that An > mB.

Note that Euclid, Elements x.1 treats convergence as: Given a series A0, A1, …, An, …, and a magnitude A, its limit, for any magnitude B, no matter how small, there is a member of the series, An < & a : b with a < b, representing e, such that eX = Y means that a : b = Y : X. Clearly, if a < b, then Y < X and Y exists. For convenience, think of e > p as meaning some appropriate translation of real numbers into the Greek language of ratios.

Note that unless A = B, A - B is a part of A. If B > A, then A - B is undefined.

Division/Addition series (keep in mind that this way of defining a series is very modern):
diagram4 e < 1 (in the diagram, e = 1/3)

B0 < A

A0 = A - B0

Bn+1 = e An

An+1 = An - Bn+1

Cn = B0 + … + Bn


A, A0, …, An, … and B0, …, Bn, … converge on either a point or a magnitude of less dimension than A. C0, …, Cn, … converges on A.

Simple modern proof:

For n > 0,
An = An-1 - Bn
= An-1 - e An-1
= An-1 (1-e)
= A0 (1-e)n
Bn = e An-1
= e (1-e)n-1
B0 + … + Bn + … = B0 + e A0 (1-e)0 + … + e A0 (1-e)n-1 + …
= B0 + e A0 [(1-e)0 + … + (1-e)n-1 + … ]
Since 0 < e < 1, it follows that 0 < 1 - e < 1, while for 0 < q < 1,
1 + q + … + qn + … = 1/(1-q).
B0 + … + Bn + … = B0 + e A0 (1/(1-(1-e))
= B0 + e A0 (1/e)
= B0 + A0
= A

Note that this series is different from the fundamental series used in Euclid, Elements x.1 as well as its applications in Elements x 12, where it allowed that the value of e can change. We can describe the series as follows: let e0, …, en, … be a series of portion-operator (see above), such that for all n, 0 < en < 1. Let A0 be a magnitude.

A0 = A - e0 An
An+1 = An - en An
Euclid needs the series A, A0, …, An, … to become arbitrarily small, but he must not require that e0 = …= en = … He is aware that if this series decreases fast enough, A, A0, …, An, … might converge on a finite magnitude. Hence, he arbitrarily fixes en > 1/2, a value which does not endanger his proofs.

Aristotle's classification of infinite series

Hence, we can have Aristotle's series described in two ways:

  1. Convergent series by division: We may start with A and take portions of A. Note that Aristotle uses ‘division’ instead of ‘subtraction’ because he conceives of the magnitude as being divided. The word does not mean ‘division’ in the sense of the arithmetic operation. The series A, A0, …, An, … , approaches a point or a magnitude of less dimension than A
  2. Convergent series by addition: We may start with B0 and add on the magnitudes Bn+1 that we take away from each An. In other words, C0, … , Cn, … converges on A, but never exceeds it.

It is also obvious, as Aristotle claims, that every convergent series by addition is identical with some convergent series by division.

Hence we also have a series by addition, which is not also a series by division:

  1. Non-convergent series by addition:
    diagram5 Let B0 be a part of A

    Bn+1 = e A

    C0 = B0

    Cn+1 = B0 + … + Bn+1

(Obviously, this could be generalized within the context of ancient Greek mathematics, but it would not be important to Aristotle's argument or theory.)

Aristotle recognizes, but does not treat separately a corresponding non-convergent series by division, where one starts with an infinite magnitude, such that even with an infinite division, one ends up with an infinite magnitude.

Aristotle distinguishes two further ways of looking at an infinite series.

  1. The infinite series in potentiality: The series is not actually ever completed. What make the series infinite is simply the fact that a next step in the series is always possible.
  2. The infinite series in actuality: We conceive of the series as completed.
When we combine the two notion of an infinite series by addition or by division with the notions of a potential or actual series to construct four notions of the infinite.

Many readers of Aristotle have wondered what this view does to Greek mathematics. Does a finite mathematical space violate the principle of non-revisionism (Section 6). Aristotle claims that it does not, that in any proof one can reduce the figure proportionally. One might well think that this requires an axiom of proportionality which makes clear what it is to preserve proportionality in a figure and which the properties of any figure are preserved. For one cannot extend the base of a triangle whose vertices are at the limit of the universe. In fact, Proclus, in his commentary on Euclid, Elements i, preserves many examples of attempts to prove theorems for a finite universe. Many readers of Aristotle also adopt a stronger principle, that Greek mathematics was finitistic, not in the strong Aristotelian sense that the universe is finite, but in the sense that only the infinite in potential (by division and by addition) are used. It is very difficult (perhaps impossible), however, to substantiate a claim that Greek mathematicians worried deeply about this issue in much of their normal work. In the Method, Archimedes treats solids as composed of infinite planes, and Pappus treats a solid in Collectio v as the aggregate of an infinite number of infinitely small solids, as we would expect in that type of work. These are sophisticated treatises, but even in Elements i, Euclid constructs an infinite line to avoid having to find where a circle will intersect a finite line.

Copyright © 2004
Henry Mendell

Supplement to Aristotle and Mathematics
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy