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Supplement to Aristotle and Mathematics

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It has long been a tradition to read Aristotle's treatment of first
principles as reflected in the first principles of Euclid's
*Elements* I. There are similarities and differences. Euclid
divides his principles into **Definitions**
(*horoi*), **Postulates**
(*aitêmata*), and **Common Notions**
(*koinai ennoiai*). The definitions are a grab bag of claims,
some of which have the form of stipulations and some of which include
several assertions which are not definitions, such as the claim (def.
17) that a diameter divides a circle in half, as well as pairs of
definitions, where one can easily be read as a claim (e.g., def. 2: "A
line is breadthless length," and def. 3, "The extremities of a line are
points" or def. 6, "The extremities of a surface are lines."). Euclid's
five postulates include three construction rules. Many have seen these
as corresponding to Aristotle's hypotheses of existence. The other two,
that right angles are equal and the parallel postulate, are not. This
is not an objection to a correlation if existence assumptions in
geometry for Aristotle are construction assumptions and if not all
hypotheses are existence assumptions. Finally, all but one of the
common notions do correspond to some of Aristotle's axioms, with the
possible exception of claim (8) that things which coincide are equal.
Yet this too could be conceived as applying equally to geometrical
figures and to numbers. In any case, it may not have been in the
original text. Nonetheless, this correspondence between Aristotle's
conception of first principles and Euclid's in *Elements* i is
tenuous at best. Elsewhere in Greek mathematics, and even in the
*Elements*, we find other treatments first principles, some of
which are closer in other ways to Aristotle's conceptions. For example,
Archimedes' *On the Sphere and Cylinder* opens with existence
hypotheses (that certain lines exist) and stipulations (that they
should be called such-and-such).

A more fundamental distinction between Aristotle's treatment of
first principles and those found in Greek mathematics is that Aristotle
seems to think that each first principle has both a logical and an
explanatory role in a treatise. Yet it is typical, especially in
treatises which are introductory to a topic, to have principles which
serve a logical and explanatory role, but also to have principles whose
only explicit role is pedagogical. For they serve no obvious role in
the demonstrations. Such might be the definitions of point and line in
*Elements* i. Hence, if there is a relation between Aristotle's
conception of first principles and those of the mathematicians,
Aristotle provides an ideal framework based on contemporary
mathematical practice and which may or may not have been noticed by
authors such as Euclid.

Henry Mendell hmendel@calstatela.edu |

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy