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Analysis has always been at the heart of philosophical method, but it has been understood and practised in many different ways. Perhaps in its broadest sense, it might be defined as disclosing or working back to what is more fundamental by means of which something can be explained (which is often then exhibited in a corresponding process of synthesis); but this allows great variation in specific method. The dominance of ‘analytic’ philosophy in the English-speaking world, and increasingly now in the rest of the world, might suggest that a consensus has formed concerning the role and importance of analysis. But this begs the question as to what ‘analysis’ means. On the other hand, Wittgenstein's later critique of analysis in the early (logical atomist) period of analytic philosophy, and Quine's attack on the analytic-synthetic distinction, for example, have led some to claim that we are now in a ‘post-analytic’ age. But such criticisms are only directed at particular conceptions of analysis. If we look at the history of philosophy (and even if we just look at the history of analytic philosophy), we find a rich and extensive repertoire of conceptions of analysis which philosophers have continually drawn upon and reconfigured in different ways. Analytic philosophy is alive and well precisely because of the range of conceptions of analysis that it involves. It may have fragmented into various interlocking subtraditions, but those subtraditions are held together by both their shared history and their methodological interconnections. It is the aim of this article to indicate something of the range of conceptions of analysis in the history of philosophy and their interconnections, and to provide a bibliographical resource for those wishing to explore analytic methodologies and the philosophical issues that they raise.

1. General Introduction

This section provides a preliminary description of analysis -- or the range of different conceptions of analysis -- and a guide to this article as a whole.

1.1 Characterizations of Analysis

If asked what ‘analysis’ means, most people today immediately think of breaking something down into its components; and this is how analysis tends to be officially characterized. In the Concise Oxford Dictionary (6th ed.), for example, ‘analysis’ is defined as the “resolution into simpler elements by analysing (opp. synthesis)”, the only other uses mentioned being the mathematical and the psychological. And in the Oxford Dictionary of Philosophy, ‘analysis’ is defined as “the process of breaking a concept down into more simple parts, so that its logical structure is displayed” (Blackburn 1996, 14). The restriction to concepts and the reference to displaying ‘logical structure’ are important qualifications, but the core conception remains that of breaking something down.

This conception may be called the decompositional or resolutive conception of analysis (see Section 4). But it is not the only conception, and indeed is arguably neither the dominant conception in the pre-modern period nor the conception that is characteristic of at least one major strand in ‘analytic’ philosophy. In ancient Greek thought, ‘analysis’ referred primarily to the process of working back to first principles by means of which something could then be demonstrated. This conception may be called the regressive conception of analysis (see Section 2). In the work of Frege and Russell, on the other hand, before the process of resolution could take place, the statements to be analyzed had first to be translated into their ‘correct’ logical form (see Section 6). This suggests that analysis also involves a transformative or interpretive dimension. This too, however, has its roots in earlier thought (see especially the supplementary sections on Ancient Greek Geometry and Medieval Philosophy).

These three conceptions should not be seen as competing. In actual practices of analysis, which are invariably richer than the accounts that are offered of them, all three conceptions are typically reflected, though to differing degrees and in differing forms. To analyze something, we may first have to interpret it in some way, translating an initial statement, say, into the privileged language of logic, mathematics or science, before articulating the relevant elements and structures, and all in the service of identifying fundamental principles by means of which to explain it. The complexities that this schematic description suggests can only be appreciated by considering particular types of analysis.

Understanding conceptions of analysis is not simply a matter of attending to the use of the word ‘analysis’. Socratic definition is arguably a form of conceptual analysis, yet the term ‘analysis’ does not occur anywhere in Plato's dialogues (see the supplementary section on Plato). In Latin, ‘resolutio’ was used to render the Greek word ‘analusis’, and although ‘resolution’ has a different range of meanings, it is often used synonymously with ‘analysis’ (see the supplementary section on Renaissance Philosophy). At least from the time of Descartes, if not from Aristotle, forms of analysis have also involved ‘reduction’; and in early analytic philosophy it was ‘reduction’ that was seen as the goal of philosophical analysis (see the supplementary section on The Cambridge School of Analysis).

Today, across all fields, there are many different types of analysis, such as cost-benefit analysis, discourse analysis, functional analysis and systems analysis, to name but four, and analysis has special connotations in psychology (where it is associated with the work of Freud, Jung and their successors) and in mathematics (where it involves the use of the differential and integral calculus). The focus here is on conceptions of analysis in philosophy, but this is not to deny that there are complex interrelations with conceptions in other fields of thought and intricate patterns of influence.

Further details of characterizations of analysis that have been offered in the history of philosophy can be found in the supplementary document

Definitions and Descriptions of Analysis

A list of key reference works, monographs and collections can be found in the

Annotated Bibliography, §1.

1.2 Guide to this Entry

This entry comprises three sets of documents:

  1. The present document
  2. Six supplementary documents (one of which is not yet available)
  3. An annotated bibliography on analysis, divided into six documents

The present document provides an overview, with introductions to the various conceptions of analysis in the history of philosophy. It also contains links to the supplementary documents, the documents in the bibliography, and other internet resources. The supplementary documents expand on certain topics under each of the six main sections. The annotated bibliography contains a list of key readings on each topic, and is also divided according to the sections of this entry.

2. Ancient Conceptions of Analysis and the Emergence of the Regressive Conception

The word ‘analysis’ derives from the ancient Greek term ‘analusis’. The prefix ‘ana’ means ‘up’, and ‘lusis’ means ‘loosing’, ‘release’ or ‘separation’, so that ‘analusis’ means ‘loosening up’ or ‘dissolution’. The term was readily extended to the solving or dissolving of a problem, and it was in this sense that it was employed in ancient Greek geometry and philosophy. The method of analysis that was developed in ancient Greek geometry had an influence on both Plato and Aristotle. Also important, however, was the influence of Socrates's concern with definition, in which the roots of modern conceptual analysis can be found. What we have in ancient Greek thought, then, is a complex web of methodologies, of which the most important are Socratic definition, which Plato elaborated into his method of division, his related method of hypothesis, which drew on geometrical analysis, and the method(s) that Aristotle developed in his Analytics. Far from a consensus having established itself over the last two millennia, the relationships between these methodologies are the subject of increasing debate today. At the heart of all of them too lie the philosophical problems raised by Meno's paradox, which anticipates what we now know as the paradox of analysis, and Plato's attempt to solve it through the theory of recollection, which has spawned a vast literature on its own.

‘Analysis’ was first used in a methodological sense in ancient Greek geometry, and the model that Euclidean geometry provided has been an inspiration ever since. Although Euclid's Elements dates from around 300 BC, and hence after both Plato and Aristotle, it is clear that it draws on the work of many previous geometers, most notably, Theaetetus and Eudoxus, who worked closely with Plato and Aristotle. Plato is even credited by Diogenes Laertius (LEP, I, 299) with inventing the method of analysis, but whatever the truth of this may be, the influence of geometry starts to show in his middle dialogues, and he certainly encouraged work on geometry in his Academy.

The classic source for our understanding of ancient Greek geometrical analysis is a passage in Pappus's Mathematical Collection, which was composed around 300 AD, and hence drew on a further six centuries of work in geometry from the time of Euclid's Elements:

Now analysis is the way from what is sought -- as if it were admitted -- through its concomitants (akolouthôn) in order to something admitted in synthesis. For in analysis we suppose that which is sought to be already done, and we inquire from what it results, and again what is the antecedent of the latter, until we on our backward way light upon something already known and being first in order. And we call such a method analysis, as being a solution backwards (anapalin lysin).

In synthesis, on the other hand, we suppose that which was reached last in analysis to be already done, and arranging in their natural order as consequents (epomena) the former antecedents and linking them one with another, we in the end arrive at the construction of the thing sought. And this we call synthesis. (Translated in Hintikka and Remes 1974, 8-9.)

Analysis is clearly being understood here in the regressive sense -- as involving the working back from ‘what is sought’, taken as assumed, to something more fundamental by means of which it can then be established, through its converse, synthesis. This provides the core of the conception of analysis that one can find reflected, in its different ways, in the work of Plato and Aristotle (see the supplementary sections on Plato and Aristotle). Although detailed examination of actual practices of analysis reveals more than just regression to first causes and principles, but resolution and transformation as well (see especially the supplementary section on Ancient Greek Geometry), the regressive conception dominated views of analysis until well into the early modern period.

Ancient Greek geometry was not the only source of later conceptions of analysis, however. Plato may not have used the term ‘analysis’ himself, but concern with definition was central to his dialogues, and definitions have often been seen as what ‘conceptual analysis’ should yield. Plato's concern may have been with real rather than nominal definitions, with ‘essences’ rather than mental or linguistic contents (see the supplementary section on Plato), but conceptual analysis too has frequently been given a ‘realist’ construal. Certainly, the roots of conceptual analysis can be traced back to Plato's search for definitions, as we shall see in Section 4 below.

Further discussion can be found in the supplementary document

Ancient Conceptions of Analysis

Further reading can be found in the

Annotated Bibliography, §2

3. Medieval and Renaissance Conceptions of Analysis

Conceptions of analysis in the medieval and renaissance periods were largely influenced by ancient Greek conceptions. But knowledge of these conceptions was often second-hand, filtered through a variety of commentaries and not always reliable texts. Medieval and renaissance methodologies tended to be uneasy mixtures of Platonic, Aristotelian, Stoic, Galenic and neo-Platonic elements, many of them claiming to have some root in the geometrical conception of analysis and synthesis. However, in the late medieval period, clearer and more original forms of analysis started to take shape. In the literature on so-called ‘syncategoremata’ and ‘exponibilia’, for example, we can trace the development of a conception of interpretive analysis. In fact, in Buridan's masterpiece of the mid-fourteenth century, the Summulae de Dialectica, all three of the conceptions outlined in Section 1.1 above can be found illustrated. Here, in particular, we have anticipations of modern analytic philosophy as much as reworkings of ancient philosophy. Unfortunately, however, these clearer forms of analysis became overshadowed during the Renaissance, despite -- or perhaps because of -- the growing interest in the original Greek sources. As far as understanding analytic methodologies was concerned, the humanist repudiation of scholastic logic muddied the waters.

Further discussion can be found in the supplementary document

Medieval and Renaissance Conceptions of Analysis

Further reading can be found in the

Annotated Bibliography, §3

4. Early Modern Conceptions of Analysis and the Development of the Decompositional Conception

The scientific revolution in the 17th century brought with it new forms of analysis. The newest of these emerged through the development of more sophisticated mathematical techniques, but even these still had their roots in earlier conceptions of analysis. By the end of the early modern period, decompositional analysis had become dominant (as outlined in what follows), but this too took different forms, and the relationships between the various conceptions of analysis were often far from clear.

In common with the Renaissance, the early modern period was marked by a great concern with methodology. This might seem unsurprising in such a revolutionary period, when new techniques for understanding the world were being developed and that understanding itself was being transformed. But what characterizes many of the treatises and remarks on methodology that appeared in the 17th century is their appeal, frequently self-conscious, to ancient methods (despite, or perhaps -- for diplomatic reasons -- because of, the critique of the content of traditional thought), although new wine was generally poured into the old bottles. The model of geometrical analysis was a particular inspiration here, albeit filtered through the Aristotelian tradition, which had assimilated the regressive process of going from theorems to axioms with that of moving from effects to causes (see the supplementary section on Aristotle). Analysis came to be seen as a method of discovery, working back from what is ordinarily known to the underlying reasons (demonstrating ‘the fact’), and synthesis as a method of proof, working forwards again from what is discovered to what needed explanation (demonstrating ‘the reason why’). Analysis and synthesis were thus taken as complementary, although there remained disagreement over their respective merits.

There is a manuscript by Galileo, dating from around 1589, an appropriated commentary on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, which shows his concern with methodology, and regressive analysis, in particular (see Wallace 1992a and 1992b). Hobbes wrote a chapter on method in the first part of De Corpore, published in 1655, which offers his own interpretation of the method of analysis and synthesis, where decompositional forms of analysis are articulated alongside regressive forms. But perhaps the most influential account of methodology, from the middle of the 17th century until well into the 19th century, was the fourth part of the Port-Royal Logic, the first edition of which appeared in 1662 and the final revised edition in 1683. Chapter 2 (which was the first chapter in the first edition) opens as follows:

The art of arranging a series of thoughts properly, either for discovering the truth when we do not know it, or for proving to others what we already know, can generally be called method.

Hence there are two kinds of method, one for discovering the truth, which is known as analysis, or the method of resolution, and which can also be called the method of discovery. The other is for making the truth understood by others once it is found. This is known as synthesis, or the method of composition, and can also be called the method of instruction. (Arnauld and Nicole, LAT, 233.)

That a number of different methods might be assimilated here is not noted, although the text does go on to distinguish four main types of ‘issues concerning things’: seeking causes by their effects, seeking effects by their causes, finding the whole from the parts, and looking for another part from the whole and a given part (LAT, 234). Whilst the first two involve regressive analysis and synthesis, the third and fourth involve decompositional analysis and synthesis.

As the authors of the Logic make clear, this particular part of their text derives from Descartes's Rules for the Direction of the Mind, written around 1627, but only published posthumously in 1684. The specification of the four types was most likely offered in elaborating Descartes's Rule Thirteen, which states: “If we perfectly understand a problem we must abstract it from every superfluous conception, reduce it to its simplest terms and, by means of an enumeration, divide it up into the smallest possible parts.” (PW, I, 51. Cf. the editorial comments in PW, I, 54, 77.) The decompositional conception of analysis is explicit here, and if we follow this up into the later Discourse on Method, published in 1637, the focus has clearly shifted from the regressive to the decompositional conception of analysis. All the rules offered in the earlier work have now been reduced to just four. This is how Descartes reports the rules he says he adopted in his scientific and philosophical work:

The first was never to accept anything as true if I did not have evident knowledge of its truth: that is, carefully to avoid precipitate conclusions and preconceptions, and to include nothing more in my judgements than what presented itself to my mind so clearly and so distinctly that I had no occasion to doubt it.

The second, to divide each of the difficulties I examined into as many parts as possible and as may be required in order to resolve them better.

The third, to direct my thoughts in an orderly manner, by beginning with the simplest and most easily known objects in the order to ascend little by little, step by step, to knowledge of the most complex, and by supposing some order even among objects that have no natural order of precedence.

And the last, throughout to make enumerations so complete, and reviews so comprehensive, that I could be sure of leaving nothing out. (PW, I, 120.)

The first two are rules of analysis and the second two rules of synthesis. But although the analysis/synthesis structure remains, what is involved here is decomposition/composition rather than regression/progression. Nevertheless, Descartes insisted that it was geometry that influenced him here: “Those long chains composed of very simple and easy reasonings, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way.” (Ibid.) The significance of Descartes's own work on geometry is outlined in the supplementary section on Descartes and Analytic Geometry.

The shift to decompositional conceptions of analysis was not without precedents, however. Not only was decompositional analysis already involved in ancient Greek geometry, but it was also implicit in Plato's method of collection and division. We might explain the shift from regressive to decompositional (conceptual) analysis, as well as the connection between the two, in the following way. Consider a simple example, as represented in the diagram below, ‘collecting’ all animals and ‘dividing’ them into rational and non-rational, in order to define human beings as rational animals.


On this model, in seeking to define anything, we work back up the appropriate classificatory hierarchy to find the higher (i.e., more basic or more general) ‘Forms’, by means of which we can lay down the definition. Although Plato did not himself use the term ‘analysis’ -- the word for ‘division’ was ‘dihairesis’ -- the finding of the appropriate ‘Forms’ is essentially analysis, and the subsequent laying down of the definition synthesis. As an elaboration of the Socratic search for definitions, we clearly have in this the origins of conceptual analysis. There is little disagreement that ‘Human beings are rational animals’ is the kind of definition we are seeking, defining one concept, the concept human being, in terms of other concepts, the concepts rational and animal. But the construals that have been offered of this have been more problematic. Understanding a classificatory hierarchy extensionally, that is, in terms of the classes of things denoted, the classes higher up are clearly the larger, ‘containing’ the classes lower down as subclasses (e.g., the class of animals includes the class of human beings as one of its subclasses). Intensionally, however, the relationship of ‘containment’ has been seen as holding in the opposite direction. If someone understands the concept human being, at least in the strong sense of knowing its definition, then they must understand the concepts animal and rational; and it has often then seemed natural to talk of the concept human being as ‘containing’ the concepts rational and animal. Working back up the hierarchy in ‘analysis’ (in the regressive sense) could then come to be identified with ‘unpacking’ or ‘resolving’ a concept into its ‘constituent’ concepts (‘analysis’ in the decompositional sense). Of course, talking of ‘resolving’ a concept into its ‘constituents’ is, strictly speaking, only a metaphor (as Quine was famously to remark in §1 of ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’), but in the early modern period, this began to be taken more literally.

For further discussion, see the supplementary document

Early Modern Conceptions of Analysis,

which contains sections on Descartes and Analytic Geometry, British Empiricism, Leibniz, and Kant.

For further reading, see the

Annotated Bibliography, §4

5. Conceptions of Analysis in the 19th Century

Many of the views on analysis in the 19th century can be seen as responses to Kant's decompositional conception. These responses can be broadly divided into two. On the one hand, an essentially decompositional conception of analysis was accepted, but a negative attitude was adopted towards it. If analysis simply involved breaking something down, then it appeared destructive and life-diminishing, and the critique of analysis that this view engendered was a common theme in both German and British idealism. On the other hand, analysis was seen more positively, but the Kantian conception underwent a certain degree of modification and development. This approach was taken by the neo-Kantians, who emphasised the role of structure and had a greater appreciation of forms of analysis in mathematics and science, and Bolzano, whose most important innovation was the method of variation, which formed the basis for his reconstruction of the analytic/synthetic distinction.

The supplementary document

Conceptions of Analysis in the 19th Century

is not yet available.

For further reading, see the

Annotated Bibliography, §5

6. Conceptions of Analysis in Analytic Philosophy and the Emergence of the Logical Conception

If anything characterizes ‘analytic’ philosophy, then it is presumably the emphasis placed on analysis. But as the foregoing sections have shown, there is a wide range of conceptions of analysis, so such a characterization says nothing that would distinguish analytic philosophy from much of what preceded it. Given that the decompositional conception is usually offered as the main conception today, it might be thought that it is this that characterizes analytic philosophy. But this conception was prevalent in the early modern period, shared both by the British Empiricists and Leibniz, for example. Given that Kant was dismissive of decompositional analysis, however, it might be suggested that what characterizes analytic philosophy is the value it places on such analysis. This might be true of Moore's early work, and of one strand within analytic philosophy; but it is not generally true. What characterizes analytic philosophy as it was founded by Frege and Russell is the role played by logical analysis, which depended on the development of modern logic. Although other and subsequent forms of analysis, such as linguistic analysis, were less wedded to systems of formal logic, the central insight motivating logical analysis remained.

Pappus's account of method in ancient Greek geometry suggests that the regressive conception of analysis was dominant at the time -- however much other conceptions may also have been implicitly involved (see the supplementary section on Ancient Greek Geometry). In the early modern period, the decompositional conception became widespread (see Section 4). What characterizes analytic philosophy -- or at least that central strand that originates in the work of Frege and Russell -- is the recognition of what was called earlier the transformative or interpretive dimension of analysis (see Section 1.1). Any analysis presupposes a particular framework of interpretation, and work is done in interpreting what we are seeking to analyze as part of the process of regression and decomposition. This may involve transforming it in some way, in order for the resources of a given theory or conceptual framework to be brought to bear. Euclidean geometry provides a good illustration of this. But it is even more obvious in the case of analytic geometry, where the geometrical problem is first ‘translated’ into the language of algebra and arithmetic in order to solve it more easily (see the supplementary section on Descartes and Analytic Geometry). What Descartes and Fermat did for analytic geometry, Frege and Russell did for analytic philosophy. Analytic philosophy is ‘analytic’ much more in the sense that analytic geometry is ‘analytic’ than in the crude decompositional sense that Kant understood it. The interpretive dimension of modern philosophical analysis can also be seen as anticipated in medieval scholasticism (see the supplementary section on Medieval Philosophy), and it is remarkable just how much of modern concerns with propositions, meaning, reference, etc., can be found in the medieval literature. But what was crucial in the emergence of twentieth-century analytic philosophy was the development of quantificational theory. In the case of Frege and Russell, the system into which statements were ‘translated’ was predicate logic; and the divergence that was thereby opened up between grammatical and logical form meant that the process of translation itself became an issue of philosophical concern.

Both Frege and Russell (after the latter's initial flirtation with idealism) were concerned to show, against Kant, that arithmetic is a system of analytic and not synthetic truths. In the Grundlagen, Frege had offered a revised conception of analyticity, which arguably endorses and generalizes Kant's logical as opposed to phenomenological criterion, i.e., (ANL) rather than (ANO) (see the supplementary section on Kant):

(AN) A truth is analytic if its proof depends only on general logical laws and definitions.

The question as to whether arithmetical truths are analytic then comes down to the question as to whether they can be derived purely logically. (Here we already have ‘transformation’, at the theoretical level -- involving a reinterpretation of the concept of analyticity.) To demonstrate this, Frege realized that he needed to develop logical theory in order to formalize mathematical statements, which typically involve multiple generality (e.g., ‘Every natural number has a successor’). This development, by extending the use of function-argument analysis in mathematics to logic and providing a notation for quantification, was essentially the achievement of his first book, the Begriffsschrift (1879), where he not only created the first system of predicate logic but also, using it, succeeded in giving a logical analysis of mathematical induction (see Frege, FR, 47-78).

In his second book, Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, Frege went on to provide a logical analysis of number statements. His central idea was that a number statement contains an assertion about a concept. A statement such as ‘Jupiter has four moons’ is to be understood not as predicating of Jupiter the property of having four moons, but as predicating of the concept moon of Jupiter the second-level property has four instances, which can be logically defined. The significance of this construal can be brought out by considering existential statements (which are number statements involving the number 0). Take the following negative existential statement:

(0a) Unicorns do not exist. [There are no unicorns.]

If we attempt to analyze this decompositionally, taking its grammatical form to mirror its logical form, then we find ourselves asking what these unicorns are that have the mysterious property of non-existence. We may then be forced to posit the subsistence -- as opposed to existence -- of unicorns, just as Meinong and the early Russell did, in order for there to be something that is the subject of our statement. On the Fregean account, however, to deny that something exists is to say that the relevant concept has no instances: there is no need to posit any mysterious object. The Fregean analysis of (0a) consists in rephrasing it into (0b), which can then be readily formalized in the new logic as (0c):

(0b) The concept unicorn is not instantiated. [The class of unicorns is empty.]

(0c) ~(existsx) Fx. [(forallx) ~Fx.]

Similarly, to say that God exists is to say that the concept God is (uniquely) instantiated, i.e., to deny that the concept has 0 instances (or 2 or more instances). On this view, existence is no longer seen as a (first-level) predicate, but instead, existential statements are analyzed in terms of the (second-level) predicate is instantiated, represented by the existential quantifier. As Frege notes, this offers a neat diagnosis of what is wrong with the ontological argument, at least in its traditional form (GL, §53). All the problems that arise if we try to apply decompositional analysis (at least straight off) simply drop away, although an account is still needed, of course, of concepts and quantifiers.

The possibilities that this strategy of ‘translating’ into a logical language opens up are enormous: we are no longer forced to treat the surface grammatical form of a statement as a guide to its ‘real’ form, and are provided with a means of representing that form. This is the value of logical analysis: it allows us to ‘analyze away’ problematic linguistic expressions and explain what it is ‘really’ going on. This strategy was employed, most famously, in Russell's theory of descriptions, which was a major motivation behind the ideas of Wittgenstein's Tractatus (see the supplementary sections on Russell and Wittgenstein). Although subsequent philosophers were to question the assumption that there could ever be a definitive logical analysis of a given statement, the idea that ordinary language may be systematically misleading has remained.

To illustrate this, consider the following examples from Ryle's classic 1932 paper, ‘Systematically Misleading Expressions’:

(Ua) Unpunctuality is reprehensible.

(Ta) Jones hates the thought of going to hospital.

In each case, we might be tempted to make unnecessary reifications, taking ‘unpunctuality’ and ‘the thought of going to hospital’ as referring to objects. It is because of this that Ryle describes such expressions as ‘systematically misleading’. (Ua) and (Ta) must therefore be rephrased:

(Ub) Whoever is unpunctual deserves that other people should reprove him for being unpunctual.

(Tb) Jones feels distressed when he thinks of what he will undergo if he goes to hospital.

In these formulations, there is no overt talk at all of ‘unpunctuality’ or ‘thoughts’, and hence nothing to tempt us to posit the existence of any corresponding entities. The problems that otherwise arise have thus been ‘analyzed away’.

At the time that Ryle wrote ‘Systematically Misleading Expressions’, he too assumed that every statement had an underlying logical form that was to be exhibited in its ‘correct’ formulation. But when he gave up this assumption (for reasons indicated in the supplementary section on The Cambridge School of Analysis), he did not give up the motivating idea of logical analysis -- to show what is wrong with misleading expressions. In The Concept of Mind (1949), for example, he sought to explain what he called the ‘category-mistake’ involved in talk of the mind as a kind of ‘Ghost in the Machine’. His aim, he wrote, was to ‘rectify the logical geography of the knowledge which we already possess’ (1949, 9), an idea that was to lead to the articulation of connective rather than reductive conceptions of analysis (see the supplementary section on Oxford Linguistic Philosophy).

What these various forms of logical analysis suggest, then, is that what characterizes analysis in analytic philosophy is something far richer than the mere ‘decomposition’ of a concept into its ‘constituents’. But this is not to say that the decompositional conception of analysis plays no role at all. It can be found in the early work of Moore, for example (see the supplementary section on Moore). It might also be seen as reflected in the approach to the analysis of concepts that seeks to specify the necessary and sufficient conditions for their correct employment. Conceptual analysis in this sense goes back to the Socrates of Plato's early dialogues (see the supplementary section on Plato). But it arguably reached its heyday in the 1950s and 1960s. The definition of ‘knowledge’ as ‘justified true belief’ is perhaps the most famous example, and was criticised in Gettier's classic paper of 1963. (For details of this, see the entry in this Encyclopedia on The Analysis of Knowledge.) The specification of necessary and sufficient conditions may no longer be seen as the primary aim of conceptual analysis, especially in the case of philosophical concepts such as ‘knowledge’, which are fiercely contested; but consideration of such conditions remains a useful tool in the analytic philosopher's toolbag.

For further discussion, and a more detailed account of the development of conceptions of analysis, see the supplementary document

Conceptions of Analysis in Analytic Philosophy

For further reading, see the

Annotated Bibliography, §6

7. Conclusion

The history of philosophy reveals a rich source of conceptions of analysis. Their origin may lie in ancient Greek geometry, and to this extent the history of analytic methodologies might be seen as a series of footnotes to Euclid. But analysis developed in different though related ways in the two traditions stemming from Plato and Aristotle, the former based on the search for definition and the latter on the idea of regression to first causes. The two poles represented in these traditions defined methodological space until well into the early modern period, and in some sense is still reflected today. The creation of analytic geometry in the 17th century introduced a more reductive form of analysis, and an analogous and equally powerful form was introduced around the turn of the 20th century in the logical work of Frege and Russell. Although conceptual analysis, understood decompositionally from the time of Leibniz and Kant, and partly mediated by the work of Moore, is often seen as characteristic of analytic philosophy, logical analysis, understood as involving translation into a logical system, is what inaugurated the analytic tradition. Analysis has also been frequently seen as reductive, but connective forms of analysis are no less important. Connective analysis would seem to be particularly appropriate, for example, in the case of analysis itself.


What follows here is a selection of twenty classic and recent works of secondary literature that together cover the range of different conceptions of analysis in the history of philosophy. A fuller bibliography, which includes all references cited, is provided as a set of supplementary documents, divided to correspond to the sections of this entry:

Annotated Bibliography on Analysis

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

abstract objects | analytic/synthetic distinction | Aristotle | Bolzano, Bernard | Buridan, John [Jean] | Descartes, René | Frege, Gottlob | Kant, Immanuel | knowledge: analysis of | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | logical constructions | logical form | Moore, George Edward | necessary and sufficient conditions | Ockham [Occam], William | Plato | Russell, Bertrand | Wittgenstein, Ludwig


In composing this entry, I have drawn on a number of my published writings (especially Beaney 1996, 2000, 2002; see Annotated Bibliography, §6.2). I am grateful to the respective publishers for permission to use this material. Initial research on conceptions of analysis in the history of philosophy was undertaken whilst a Research Fellow at the Institut für Philosophie of the University of Erlangen-Nürnberg during 1999-2000, funded by the Alexander von Humboldt-Stiftung. I thank both institutions for their generous support. I am also grateful to the editors of this Encyclopedia, and to Gideon Rosen and Edward N. Zalta, in particular, for comments and suggestions on the content and organisation of this entry.

Copyright © 2003
Michael Beaney

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