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Biological Altruism

In evolutionary biology, an organism is said to behave altruistically when its behaviour benefits other organisms, at a cost to itself. The costs and benefits are measured in terms of reproductive fitness, or expected number of offspring. So by behaving altruistically, an organism reduces the number of offspring it is likely to produce itself, but boosts the number that other organisms are likely to produce. This biological notion of altruism is not identical to the everyday concept. In everyday parlance, an action would only be called ‘altruistic’ if it was done with the conscious intention of helping another. But in the biological sense there is no such requirement. Indeed, some of the most interesting examples of biological altruism are found among creatures that are (presumably) not capable of conscious thought at all, e.g. insects. For the biologist, it is the consequences of an action for reproductive fitness that determine whether the action counts as altruistic, not the intentions, if any, with which the action is performed.

Altruistic behaviour is common throughout the animal kingdom, particularly in species with complex social structures. For example, vampire bats regularly regurgitate blood and donate it to other members of their group who have failed to feed that night, ensuring they do not starve. In numerous bird species, a breeding pair receives help in raising its young from other ‘helper’ birds, who protect the nest from predators and help to feed the fledglings. Vervet monkeys give alarm calls to warn fellow monkeys of the presence of predators, even though in doing so they attract attention to themselves, increasing their personal chance of being attacked. In social insect colonies (ants, wasps, bees and termites), sterile workers devote their whole lives to caring for the queen, constructing and protecting the nest, foraging for food, and tending the larvae. Such behaviour is maximally altruistic: sterile workers obviously do not leave any offspring of their own -- so have personal fitness of zero -- but their actions greatly assist the reproductive efforts of the queen.

From a Darwinian viewpoint, the existence of altruism in nature is at first sight puzzling, as Darwin himself realized. Natural selection leads us to expect animals to behave in ways that increase their own chances of survival and reproduction, not those of others. But by behaving altruistically an animal reduces its own fitness, so should be at a selective disadvantage vis-à-vis one which behaves selfishly. To see this, imagine that some members of a group of Vervet monkeys give alarm calls when they see predators, but others do not. Other things being equal, the latter will have an advantage. By selfishly refusing to give an alarm call, a monkey can reduce the chance that it will itself be attacked, while at the same time benefiting from the alarm calls of others. So we should expect natural selection to favour those monkeys that do not give alarm calls over those that do. But this raises an immediate puzzle. How did the alarm-calling behaviour evolve in the first place, and why has it not been eliminated by natural selection? How can the existence of altruism be reconciled with basic Darwinian principles?

1. Altruism and the Levels of Selection

The problem of altruism is intimately connected with questions about the level at which natural selection acts. If selection acts exclusively at the individual level, favouring some individual organisms over others, then altruism cannot evolve, for behaving altruistically is disadvantageous for the individual organism itself, by definition. However, it is possible that altruism may be advantageous at the group level. A group containing lots of altruists, each ready to subordinate their own selfish interests for the greater good of the group, may well have a survival advantage over a group composed mainly or exclusively of selfish organisms. A process of between-group selection may thus allow the altruistic behaviour to evolve. Within each group, altruists will be at a selective disadvantage relative to their selfish colleagues, but the fitness of the group as a whole will be enhanced by the presence of altruists. Groups composed only or mainly of selfish organisms go extinct, leaving behind groups containing altruists. In the example of the Vervet monkeys, a group containing a high proportion of alarm-calling monkeys will have a survival advantage over a group containing a lower proportion. So conceivably, the alarm-calling behaviour may evolve by between-group selection, even though within each group, individual selection favours monkeys that do not give alarm calls.

The idea that group selection might explain the evolution of altruism was first broached by Darwin himself. In The Descent of Man (1871), Darwin discussed the origin of altruistic and self-sacrificial behaviour among humans. Such behaviour is obviously disadvantageous at the individual level, as Darwin realized: “he who was ready to sacrifice his life, as many a savage has been, rather than betray his comrades, would often leave no offspring to inherit his noble nature” (p.163). Darwin then argued that self-sarcrificial behaviour, though disadvantageous for the individual ‘savage’, might be beneficial at the group level: “a tribe including many members who...were always ready to give aid to each other and sacrifice themselves for the common good, would be victorious over most other tribes; and this would be natural selection” (p.166). Darwin's suggestion is that the altruistic behaviour in question may have evolved by a process of between-group selection.

The concept of group selection has a chequered and controversial history in evolutionary biology. The founders of modern neo-Darwinism -- R.A. Fisher, J.B.S. Haldane and S. Wright -- were all aware that group selection could in principle permit altruistic behaviours to evolve, but they doubted the importance of this evolutionary mechanism. Nonetheless, many mid-twentieth century ecologists and some ethologists, notably Konrad Lorenz, routinely assumed that natural selection would produce outcomes beneficial for the whole group or species, often without even realizing that individual-level selection guarantees no such thing. This uncritical ‘good of the species’ tradition came to an abrupt halt in the 1960s, due largely to the work of G.C. Williams (1966) and J. Maynard Smith (1964). These authors argued that group selection was an inherently weak evolutionary force, hence unlikely to promote interesting altruistic behaviours. This conclusion was supported by a number of mathematical models, which apparently showed that group selection would only have significant effects for a limited range of parameter values. As a result, the notion of group selection fell into widespread disrepute in orthodox evolutionary circles. In recent years the position has changed somewhat; a number of biologists have argued that group selection was wrongly rejected in the 1960s, and that it is an important explanatory principle after all, though this is still probably a minority view. See Sober and Wilson (1998) for further details of this fascinating controversy.

The major weakness of group selection as an explanation of altruism, according to the consensus that emerged in the 1960s, was a problem that Dawkins (1976) called ‘subversion from within’; see also Maynard Smith (1964). Even if altruism is advantageous at the group level, within any group altruists are liable to be exploited by selfish ‘free-riders’ who refrain from behaving altruistically. These free-riders will have an obvious fitness advantage: they benefit from the altruism of others, but do not incur any of the costs. So even if a group is composed exclusively of altruists, all behaving nicely towards each other, it only takes a single selfish mutant to bring an end to this happy idyll. By virtue of its relative fitness advantage within the group, the selfish mutant will out-reproduce the altruists, hence selfishness will eventually swamp altruism. Since the generation time of individual organisms is likely to be much shorter than that of groups, the probability that a selfish mutant will arise and spread is very high, according to this line of argument. ‘Subversion from within’ is generally regarded as the major stumbling block for group-selectionist theories of the evolution of altruism.

If group selection is not the correct explanation for how the altruistic behaviours found in nature evolved, then what is? In the 1960s and 1970s two alternative theories emerged: kin selection or ‘inclusive fitness’ theory, due to Hamilton (1964), and the theory of reciprocal altruism, due primarily to Trivers (1971) and Maynard Smith (1974). These theories, which are discussed in detail below, apparently showed how altruistic behaviour could evolve without the need for group selection; they quickly gained prominence among biologists interested in the evolution of social behaviour. However, the precise relation between these theories and the older idea of group selection is a source of ongoing controversy. Some authors argue that kin selection and evolutionary game theory are in fact special cases of group selection, rather than alternatives to it, and that the widespread dismissal of group selection in the 1960s was therefore mistaken (Sober and Wilson (1998); see Maynard Smith (1998) for an alternative view.) Whatever the correct resolution of this issue, the fact remains that kin selection and reciprocal altruism were widely seen as alternatives to group selection, rightly or not, and their success contributed to the fall from grace of the latter.

2. Kin Selection and Inclusive Fitness

The basic idea of kin selection is simple. Imagine a gene which causes its bearer to behave altruistically towards other organisms, e.g. by sharing food with them. Organisms without the gene are selfish -- they keep all their food for themselves, and sometimes get handouts from the altruists. Clearly the altruists will be a fitness disadvantage, so we should expect the altruistic gene to be eliminated from the population. However, suppose that altruists are discriminating in who they share food with. They do not share with just anybody, but only with their relatives. This immediately changes things. For relatives are genetically similar -- they share genes with one another. So when an organism carrying the altruistic gene shares his food, there is a certain probability that the recipients of the food will also carry copies of that gene. (How probable depends on how closely related they are.) This means that the altruistic gene can in principle spread by natural selection. The gene causes an organism to behave in a way which reduces its own fitness but boosts the fitness of its relatives -- who have a greater than average chance of carrying the gene themselves. So the overall effect of the behaviour may be to increase the number of copies of the altruistic gene found in the next generation, and thus the incidence of the altruistic behaviour itself.

Though this argument was hinted at by Haldane in the 1930s, it was first made explicit by William Hamilton (1964) in a pair of seminal papers. Hamilton demonstrated rigorously that an altruistic gene will be favoured by natural selection when a certain condition, known as Hamilton's rule, is satisfied. In its simplest version, the rule states that b > c/r, where c is the cost incurred by the altruist (the donor), b is the benefit received by the recipients of the altruism, and r is the co-efficient of relationship between donor and recipient. The costs and benefits are measured in terms of reproductive fitness. The co-efficient of relationship depends on the genealogical relation between donor and recipient -- it is defined as the probability that donor and recipient share genes at a given locus that are ‘identical by descent’. (Two genes are identical by descent if they are copies of a single gene in a shared ancestor.) In a sexually reproducing diploid species, the value of r for full siblings is ½, for parents and offspring ½, for grandparents and grandoffspring ¼, for full cousins 1/8,  and so-on. The higher the value of r, the greater the probability that the recipient of the altruistic behaviour will also possess the gene for altruism. So what Hamilton's rule tells us is that a gene for altruism can spread by natural selection, so long as the cost incurred by the altruist is offset by a sufficient amount of benefit to sufficiently closed related relatives. The proof of Hamilton's rule relies on certain non-trivial assumptions; see Frank (1998), Grafen (1985) or Michod (1982) for details.

Though Hamilton himself did not use the term, his idea quickly became known as ‘kin selection’, for obvious reasons. Kin selection theory predicts that animals are more likely to behave altruistically towards their relatives than towards unrelated members of their species. Moreover, it predicts that the degree of altruism will be greater, the closer the relationship. In the years since Hamilton's theory was devised, these predictions have been amply confirmed by empirical work. For example, in various bird species, it has been found that ‘helper’ birds are much more likely to help relatives raise their young, than they are to help unrelated breeding pairs. Similarly, studies of Japanese macaques have shown that altruistic actions, such as defending others from attack, tend to be preferentially directed towards close kin. In most social insect species, a peculiarity of the genetic system known as ‘haplodiploidy’ means that females on average share more genes with their sisters than with their own offspring. So a female may well be able to get more genes into the next generation by helping the queen reproduce, hence increasing the number of sisters she will have, rather than by having offspring of her own. Kin selection theory therefore provides a neat explanation of how sterility in the social insects may have evolved by Darwinian means. (Note, however, that the precise significance of haplodiploidy for the evolution of worker sterility is a controversial question; see Maynard Smith and Szathmary (1995) ch.16.)

Kin selection theory is often presented as a triumph of the ‘gene's-eye view of evolution’, which sees organic evolution as the result of competition among genes for increased representation in the gene-pool, and individual organisms as mere ‘vehicles’ that genes have constructed to aid their propagation (Dawkins (1976), (1982)). The gene's eye-view is certainly the easiest way of understanding kin selection, and was employed by Hamilton himself in his 1964 papers. Altruism seems anomalous from the individual organism's point of view, but from the gene's point of view it makes good sense. A gene wants to maximize the number of copies of itself that are found in the next generation; one way of doing that is to cause its host organism to behave altruistically towards other bearers of the gene, so long as the costs and benefits satisfy the Hamilton inequality. But interestingly, Hamilton showed that kin selection can also be understood from the organism's point of view. Though an altruistic behaviour which spreads by kin selection reduces the organism's personal fitness (by definition), it increases what Hamilton called the organism's inclusive fitness. An organism's inclusive fitness is defined as its personal fitness, plus the sum of its weighted effects on the fitness of every other organism in the population, the weights determined by the coefficient of relationship r. Given this definition, natural selection will act to increase the inclusive fitness of individuals in the population. Instead of thinking in terms of selfish genes trying to maximize their future representation in the gene-pool, we can think in terms of organisms' trying to maximize their inclusive fitness. Most people find the ‘gene's eye’ approach to kin selection heuristically simpler than the inclusive fitness approach, but mathematically they are in fact equivalent (Michod (1982), Frank (1998), Hamilton (1996)).

Contrary to what is sometimes thought, kin selection does not require that animals must have the ability to discriminate relatives from non-relatives, less still to calculate coefficients of relationship. Many animals can in fact recognize their kin, often by smell, but kin selection can operate in the absence of such an ability. Hamilton's inequality can be satisfied so long as an animal behaves altruistically towards others animals that are in fact its relatives. The animal might achieve this by having the ability to tell relatives from non-relatives, but this is not the only possibility. An alternative is to use some proximal indicator of kinship. For example, if an animal behaves altruistically towards those in its immediate vicinity, then the recipients of the altruism are likely to be relatives, given that relatives tend to live near each other. No ability to recognize kin is presupposed. Cuckoos exploit precisely this fact, free-riding on the innate tendency of birds to care for the young in their nests.

Another popular misconception is that kin selection theory is committed to ‘genetic determinism’, the idea that genes rigidly determine or control behaviour. Though some sociobiologists have made incautious remarks to this effect, evolutionary theories of behaviour, including kin selection, are not committed to it. So long as the behaviours in question have a genetical component, i.e. are influenced to some extent by one or more genetic factor, then the theories can apply. When Hamilton (1964) talks about a gene which ‘causes’ altruism, this is really shorthand for a gene which increases the probability that its bearer will behave altruistically, to some degree. This is much weaker than saying that the behaviour is genetically ‘determined’, and is quite compatible with the existence of strong environmental influences on the behaviour's expression. Kin selection theory does not deny the truism that all traits are affected by both genes and environment. Nor does it deny that many interesting animal behaviours are transmitted through non-genetical means, such as imitation and social learning (Avital and Jablonka (2000)).

The importance of kinship for the evolution of altruism is very widely accepted today, on both theoretical and empirical grounds. However, kinship is really only a way of ensuring that altruists and recipients both carry copies of the altruistic gene, which is the fundamental requirement. If altruism is to evolve, it must be the case that the recipients of altruistic actions have a greater than average probability of being altruists themselves. Kin-directed altruism is the most obvious way of satisfying this condition, but there are other possibilities too (Hamilton (1975), Sober and Wilson (1998)). For example, if the gene that causes altruism also causes animals to favour a particular feeding ground (for whatever reason), then the required correlation between donor and recipient may be generated. It is this correlation, however brought about, that is necessary for altruism to evolve. This point was noted by Hamilton himself in the 1970s: he stressed that the coefficient of relationship of his 1964 papers should really be replaced with a more general correlation coefficient, which reflects the probability that altruist and recipient share genes, whether because of kinship or not (Hamilton (1970), (1972), (1975)). This point is theoretically important, and has not always been recognized; but in practice, kinship remains the most important source of statistical associations between altruists and recipients.

3. Reciprocal Altruism and the Prisoner's Dilemma

Though much altruism in nature is kin-directed, not all is: there are also many examples of animals behaving altruistically towards non-relatives, and indeed towards members of other species. Kin selection theory cannot help us understand these behaviours. The theory of reciprocal altruism, developed by Trivers (1971), is one attempt to explain the evolution of altruism among non-kin. The basic idea is straightforward: it may benefit an animal to behave altruistically towards another, if there is an expectation of the favour being returned in the future. (‘If you scratch my back, I'll scratch yours’.) The cost to the animal of behaving altruistically is offset by the likelihood of this return benefit, permitting the behaviour to evolve by natural selection. For obvious reasons, this evolutionary mechanism is termed ‘reciprocal altruism’.

For reciprocal altruism to work, there is no need for the two individuals to be relatives, nor even to be members of the same species. However, it is necessary that individuals should interact with each more than once, and have the ability to recognize other individuals with whom they have interacted in the past.[1] If individuals interact only once in their lifetimes and never meet again, there is obviously no possibility of return benefit, so there is nothing to be gained by behaving altruistically. However, if individuals encounter each other frequently, and are capable of identifying and punishing ‘cheaters’ who have refused to behave altruistically in the past, then reciprocal altruism can evolve. A non-altruistic cheater will have a lower fitness than an altruist because, although he does not incur the cost of behaving altruistically himself, he forfeits the return benefits too -- others will not behave altruistically towards him in the future. This evolutionary mechanism is most likely to work where animals live in relatively small groups, increasing the likelihood of multiple encounters and making cheating harder to get away with.

The concept of reciprocal altruism is closely related to the Tit-for-Tat strategy in the well-known ‘Prisoner's Dilemma’ game from game theory. In this game, players interact in pairs and may adopt one of two possible strategies: cooperate (C) or defect (D). The payoffs to each player, which in this context can be thought of as increments of reproductive fitness, depend not only their own strategy but also on their opponent's. Payoff values are shown in the matrix below. (The actual numbers used in the payoff matrix are not important; it is only the inequalities that matter.)

Player 1
Cooperate Defect
Player 2 Cooperate 11 0
Defect 20 5
Payoffs for Player 1 in units of reproductive fitness

If players are pitted against each other only once, then the optimal strategy is obviously to defect -- whatever one's opponent does, defecting pays better than cooperating (20 versus 11 if one's opponent cooperates, 5 versus 0 if he defects). So if players meet only once, there is no way that cooperative behaviour can evolve -- natural selection will favour the defectors and any co-operators will eventually be eliminated from the population. However, if players are pitted against each many times over, and can adjust their strategy depending on their opponent's past behaviour, things are more complicated. In this so-called ‘iterated Prisoner's Dilemma’, always defecting is not necessarily the best option. Indeed, Axelrod and Hamilton (1981) have shown that the Tit-for-Tat strategy in fact yields the highest payoff, so long as the probability of future encounters is sufficiently high. In Tit-For-Tat, a player follows two basic rules: (i) on the first encounter, cooperate; (ii) on subsequent encounters, do what your opponent did on the previous encounter. If all the individuals in a population play Tit-for-Tat, then no alternative strategy, such as ‘always defect’, will be able to invade; Tit-for-Tat is therefore an ‘evolutionarily stable strategy’ (Maynard Smith (1982)).

The relevance of this result for the evolution of reciprocal altruism is readily apparent. Co-operating in the Prisoner's Dilemma game corresponds to behaving altruistically, while defecting corresponds to behaving selfishly. The Axelrod and Hamilton result provides a rigorous foundation for the intuitive idea that behaving altruistically may be selectively advantageous for an organism where there is an expectation of return benefit in the future. So long as organisms interact with each other on multiple occasions, and are capable of adjusting their behaviour depending on what other organisms have done in the past, reciprocal altruism can in principle evolve.

Theoretical considerations therefore show that reciprocation of benefits is a possible mechanism for the spread of altruism, but what about the empirical evidence? A well-known study of blood-sharing among vampire bats by G. Wilkinson suggests that reciprocation does indeed play a role in the evolution of this behaviour (in addition to kinship) (Wilkinson (1984), (1990)). It is quite common for a vampire bat to fail to feed on a given night. This is potentially fatal, for bats die if they go without food for more than a couple of days. On any given night, bats donate blood (by regurgitation) to other members of their group who have failed to feed, thus saving them from starvation. Since vampire bats live in small groups and associate with each other over long periods of time, the preconditions for reciprocal altruism -- multiple encounters and individual recognition -- are likely to be met. Wilkinson's study showed that bats tended to share food with their close associates, and were more likely to share with others that had recently shared with them. These findings provide a striking confirmation of reciprocal altruism theory.

Trivers (1985) describes a remarkable case of reciprocal altruism between organisms of different species, a phenomenon known as ‘mutualism’ or ‘synergism’. On tropical coral reefs, various species of small fish act as ‘cleaners’ for large fish, removing parasites from their mouths and gills. This is not pure altruism on the part of the cleaners, for they feed on the parasites which they remove. So the interaction is mutually beneficial -- the large fish gets cleaned and the cleaner gets fed. However, Trivers notes that the large fish sometimes behave altruistically towards the cleaners. If a large fish is attacked by a predator while it has a cleaner in its mouth, then it waits for the cleaner to leave before fleeing the predator. This is clearly altruistic -- surely the large fish would be better off just swallowing the cleaner and fleeing straight away? Trivers explains the larger fish's behaviour in terms of reciprocal altruism. Since the large fish often returns to the same cleaner many times over, it pays to look after the cleaner's welfare, i.e. not to swallow it, even if this increases the chance of being wounded by a predator. In short, the larger fish behaves altruistically towards the cleaner, by allowing him to escape before fleeing, because there is an expectation of return benefit -- getting cleaned again in the future. As in the case of the vampire bats, it is because the large fish and the cleaner interact more than once that reciprocal altruism can evolve.

4. But is it ‘Real’ Altruism?

The theories of kin selection and reciprocal altruism together go a long way towards reconciling the existence of altruism in nature with Darwinian principles. Indeed kin selection theory, in particular, is generally regarded as one of the triumphs of 20th century evolutionary biology. However, some people have felt these theories in a way devalue altruism, and that the behaviours they explain are not ‘really’ altruistic. The grounds for this view are easy to see. Ordinarily we think of altruistic actions as disinterested, done with the interests of the recipient, rather than our own interests, in mind. But kin selection theory explains altruistic behaviour as a clever strategy devised by selfish genes as a way of increasing their representation in the gene-pool, at the expense of other genes. Surely this means that the behaviours in question are only ‘apparently’ altruistic, for they are ultimately the result of genic self-interest? Reciprocal altruism theory also seems to ‘take the altruism out of altruism’. Behaving nicely to someone in order to procure return benefits from them in the future seems in a way the antithesis of ‘real’ altruism -- it is just delayed self-interest.

This is a tempting line of argument. Indeed Trivers (1971) and, arguably, Dawkins (1976) were themselves tempted by it. But it should not convince. The key point to remember is that biological altruism cannot be equated with altruism in the everyday vernacular sense. Biological altruism is defined in terms of fitness consequences, not motivating intentions. If by ‘real’ altruism we mean altruism done with the conscious intention to help, then the vast majority of living creatures are not capable of ‘real’ altruism nor therefore of ‘real’ selfishness either. Ants and termites, for example, presumably do not have conscious intentions, hence their behaviour cannot be done with the intention of promoting their own self-interest, nor the interests of others. Thus the assertion that the evolutionary theories reviewed above show that the altruism in nature is only apparent makes little sense. The contrast between ‘real’ altruism and merely apparent altruism simply does not apply to most animal species.

To some extent, the idea that kin-directed and reciprocal altruism are not ‘real’ altruism has been fostered by the use of the ‘selfish gene’ terminology of Dawkins (1976). As we have seen, the gene's-eye perspective is heuristically useful for understanding the evolution of altruistic behaviours, especially those that evolve by kin selection. But talking about ‘selfish’ genes trying to increase their representation in the gene-pool is of course just a metaphor (as Dawkins fully admits); there is no literal sense in which genes ‘try’ to do anything. Any evolutionary explanation of how a phenotypic trait evolves must ultimately show that the trait leads to an increase in frequency of the genes that code for it (presuming the trait is transmitted genetically.) Therefore, a ‘selfish gene’ story can by definition be told about any trait, including a behavioural trait, that evolves by Darwinian natural selection. To say that kin selection interprets altruistic behaviour as a strategy designed by ‘selfish’ genes to aid their propagation is not wrong; but it is just another way of saying that a Darwinian explanation for the evolution of altruism has been found. As Sober and Wilson (1998) note, if one insists on saying that behaviours which evolve by mechanism such as kin selection and reciprocal altruism are ‘really selfish’, one ends up reserving the word ‘altruistic’ for behaviours which cannot evolve at all.

Do the theories of kin selection and reciprocal altruism apply to human behaviour? This is part of the broader question of whether ideas about the evolution of animal behaviour can be extrapolated to humans, a question that fuelled the sociobiology controversy of the 1980s. All biologists accept that Homo sapiens is an evolved species, and thus that general evolutionary principles apply to it. However, human behaviour is obviously influenced by culture to a far greater extent than that of other animals, and is often the product of conscious beliefs and desires (though this does not necessarily mean that genetics has no influence.) Nonetheless, at least some human behaviour does seem to fit the predictions of the evolutionary theories reviewed above. In general, humans behave more altruistically (in the biological sense) towards their close kin that towards non-relatives, e.g. by helping relatives raise their children, just as kin selection theory would predict. It is also true that we tend to help those who have helped us out in the past, just as reciprocal altruism theory would predict. On the other hand, numerous human behaviours seem anomalous from the evolutionary point of view. Think for example of adoption. Parents who adopt children instead of having their own reduce their biological fitness, obviously, so adoption is an altruistic behaviour. But it is does not benefit kin -- for parents are generally unrelated to the infants they adopt -- and nor do the parents stand to gain much in the form of reciprocal benefits. So although kin selection and reciprocal altruism may help us understand some human behaviours, they certainly cannot be applied across the board.

Where human behaviour is concerned, the distinction between biological altruism, defined in terms of fitness consequences, and ‘real’ altruism, defined in terms of the agent's conscious intentions to help others, does make sense. (Sometimes the label ‘psychological altruism’ is used instead of ‘real’ altruism.) What is the relationship between these two concepts? They appear to be independent in both directions, as Elliott Sober (1994) has argued. An action performed with the conscious intention of helping another human being may not affect their biological fitness at all, so would not count as altruistic in the biological sense. Conversely, an action undertaken for purely self-interested reasons, i.e. without the conscious intention of helping another, may boost their biological fitness tremendously.

Sober argues that, even if we accept an evolutionary approach to human behaviour, there is no particular reason to think that evolution would have made humans into egoists rather than psychological altruists. On the contrary, it is quite possible that natural selection would have favoured humans who genuinely do care about helping others, i.e. who are capable of ‘real’ or psychological altruism. Suppose there is an evolutionary advantage associated with taking good care of one's children -- a quite plausible idea. Then, parents who really do care about their childrens' welfare, i.e. who are ‘real’ altruists, will have a higher inclusive fitness, hence spread more of their genes, than parents who only pretend to care, or who do not care. Therefore, evolution may well lead ‘real’ or psychological altruism to evolve. Contrary to what is often thought, an evolutionary approach to human behaviour does not imply that humans are likely to be motivated by self-interest alone. One strategy by which ‘selfish genes’ may increase their future representation is by causing humans to be non-selfish, in the psychological sense.


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Copyright © 2003
Samir Okasha
University of Bristol

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