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Problems with the Actualist Accounts

Problems for Individual Essences

Plantinga's account is not without its problems. We will raise three that have appeared in the literature. Plantinga has reasonable responses to the first two. The third seems to be the most problematic.

An Extravagant Ontology

The first, a perhaps least pressing, problem of Plantinga's account is its commitment to a rich universe of fine-grained properties, relations, states of affairs, etc. However, the epistemological problems of platonism in general notwithstanding, abstract entities are largely recognized as, if perhaps not indispensible, extremely useful theoretical constructs, and are ubiquitous in contemporary philosophy of language, logic, mathematics, and linguistics, and in artificial intelligence. Hence, Plantinga's project is in no deeper water in this regard than many other well-regarded projects. For all but the most stringent nominalists, then, the only objection can be that the ontology is too rich, too fine-grained. However, once abstract entities are admitted at all, such a charge will stick only if the entities in question are not doing any reasonable philosophical work, and that is not the case in Plantinga's account; for all its richness, the elements of its ontology and their nature seem quite carefully chosen to play their respective roles. Hence, the objection here seems to boil down simply to a difference of philosophical taste. And that is not a serious objection.

Uninterpretability of the Semantics

Plantinga and Jager purport to be providing a genuine semantics for quantified modal languages, an account of the meaning of modal assertions. There are two related, and more serious, objections to their project, however. (These objections are based in part upon Linsky and Zalta [1994].)

First, Plantinga's modal semantics does not square with our basic semantic intuitions. In particular, on Plantinga's semantics, names denote, and quantifiers range over, individual essences. Intuitively, however (and also according to the current dominant theories of reference), names do no such thing; names denote individuals: ‘Quine’ denotes Quine, not his individual essence. Indeed, in order to denote haecceities, we resort to grammatically more complex constructions like gerunds that contain names referring to individuals, e.g., ‘being Quine’. The term ‘Quine’ here must be taken to refer to Quine, not an individual essence, lest the term denote, not an individual essence of Quine, but an individual essence of an individual essence of Quine.

This last point illustrates the second and more difficult objection, namely, that Plantinga's semantics provides no way of interpreting the basic definitions and principles of the semantics itself. According to the semantics, quantifiers range over individual essences and atomic formulas express coexemplification. Yet the metalinguistic quantifiers in the definitions of ‘individual essence’ and ‘coexemplification’ must, on pain of circularity, be taken to range over individuals. Again, the crucial principle P4 of Plantinga's semantics says that, necessarily, every object has an individual essence. But clearly, the universal quantifier here cannot itself be interpreted as a quantifier over individual essences, lest P4 express only the trivial proposition that, in every world w, every individual essence that is exemplified in w is coexemplified with the property having an individual essence. So, while P4 is intended to guarantee that there are enough individual essences, intepreted according to Plantinga's own semantics P4 turns out to be true even if there are no individual essences at all.

There are moves that one can imagine Plantinga and Jager making in response to these difficulties. For instance, perhaps they could add a domain of actual individuals to the semantics to serve as the referents for names. Again, perhaps Plantinga intends the semantics not to capture the denotation relation but rather only the relation of expressing that he has argued holds between names and individual essences (cf. Plantinga [1974]). The point, however, is that, if the account of Plantinga and Jager is to be understood as a genuine semantic theory as they seem to purport, numerous difficulties must be addressed before the account can be considered viable. If their semantics is to be understood in some other way, its nature and purpose need significant clarification and, where appropriate, modification.

Conceptual Difficulties with Individual Essences

More pernicious difficulties surround the notion of an individual essence itself, and in particular the notion of a haecceity. To get at the chief problem, first, define a property or relation to be logically simple (simple, for short) if it is not itself a negation, conjunction, disjunction, quantification, modalization, etc. of any other properties or relations. (The idea here, of course, is that logically simple properties correspond to basic predicates in a language, and logically complex properties are analogous to complex sentences. It is a bit difficult in fact to find any uncontroversial examples of logically simple properties. Perhaps certain fundamental mental states like happiness or physical states like being a quark or having mass qualify. For purposes here, however, we needn't delve deeper.) Next, say that a property P is general if it is possible both that (i) something x exemplify P and that (ii) possibly, something y distinct from x exemplify P. Intuitively, then, a property is general if it can be exemplified by more than one thing, albeit perhaps only at different times or in different possible worlds. The notion of generality can be extended to relations in an obvious way.

Now, haecceities are either simple or they are not. Both options are problematic. Plantinga refers to haecceities by means of two types of gerunds: grammatically simple gerunds like ‘being Quine’, and grammatically more complex gerunds like ‘being identical with Quine’. Those of the former sort suggest that haecceities are logically simple, the latter that they are logically complex. We consider them in turn.

If haecceities are logically complex, the central question is: In what does this logical complexity consist? An appealing and quite popular answer dating back to Russell is that logical complexity, at least in part, involves a certain type of metaphysical complexity: a logically complex property, proposition, or relation is literally constituted by less complex metaphysical parts. (See Frege [1980], p. 169.) So, for example, the property being human and over 6 feet tall is constituted by the properties being human and being over 6 feet tall. And, most relevantly, singular properties and relations like being a student of Quine that involve expressions for a relation and an individual are constituted by those very entities, in this case, in this case, the relation being a student of and Quine himself.

If this account is correct, then Quine is a literal metaphysical component of the haecceity being identical with Quine. If so, however, then it seems that haecceities are ontologically dependent on their instances; no haecceity exists uninstantiated. For Quine is the very component that distinguishes being identical with Quine from every other haecceity, and hence he appears to be essential to its identity. But if that is correct, then haecceities cannot play the role of possibilia, for possibilia are, in a certain sense, necessary beings. Though perhaps not actual in every world, nontheless, for the possibilist, necessarily, for every possibile x and every world w, there is such a thing as x at w. But if haecceities are ontologically dependent upon their instances, then there are no uninstantiated haecceities. In particular, then, there are no haecceities that could be instantiated by Aliens, since, by hypothesis, no actual individual is possibly an Alien. Hence, Plantinga's semantics for (1) do not work, as they depend upon the existence of an uninstantiated haecceity. Plantinga, of course, could (and, in fact, does) just resist the idea that Quine is a constituent of being identical with Quine. However, he identifies no other problems with this conception of logical complexity, and provides no alternative account. Hence, this response seems ad hoc.

A somewhat stronger move for Plantinga is to deny that haecceities are logically complex and take them instead to be logically simple, as suggested by grammatically simple gerunds like ‘being Quine’ that do not involve reference to identity or any other property or relation. Now, the fact that one still has to refer to Quine in order to refer to his haecceity might suggest that being Quine is no less ontologically dependent upon Quine than is being identical with Quine. The important difference in this case, however, is that there is no apparent logical complexity that needs explaining: being Quine -- or perhaps better, quineity -- as it happens, simply holds essentially and uniquely of Quine. True enough, we can only refer to Quine's haecceity by referring, at least obliquely, to Quine. However, all that follows from that is that if Quine hadn't existed, it would not have been possible to refer to his haecceity, at least, not by means of a gerund involving a proper name of Quine. The haecceity itself is, arguably, no more ontologically dependent upon Quine than is the number 2. Hence, there is no reason to deny that logically simple haecceities, like other logically simple properties, are necessary beings, and hence no reason to think that they cannot play all of the metaphysical roles demanded of them in Plantinga's account.

The chief objection to this move now, however, is whether Plantinga has distinguished his own view sufficiently from possibilism. On his account, haecceities are logically simple but non-general properties. But this seems a very odd combination. Intuitively, at first blush anyway, properties and relations are common, general, repeatable characteristics of, or connections between, things -- redness, wisdom, humanity, marriage, adjacency, etc. Recognition of shareability among many particulars, awareness of a one over many, is what gave rise to the concept of a property in the first place. In fact, of course, not all properties are general. But, intuitively again, non-generality comes about by virtue of logical complexity, by virtue of the manner in which the components of a complex property are "woven together" logically, e.g., being smaller than every other prime number, possibly being the father of Xantippe, or being identical with Quine. Hence, it follows from these intuitions that, necessarily, all logically simple properties are general. However, Plantinga flouts these intuitions in order to introduce an entirely new class of simple property whose sole function is to serve as an actualist counterpart to possibilia. But given their oddity, it is far from clear that there is any greater philosophical virtue in postulating logically simple but essentially non-general properties than in postulating that there are objects that are not actual. So whatever victory Plantinga can claim for actualism here seems Pyrrhic at best. (Some readers may be interested in the supplementary document Qualitative Essences and a Final Defense for Plantinga.)

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Problems for World Stories

Though promising and intuitive, Adams' account, like Plantinga's, suffers from some serious objections.

Loss of Compositionality

One of the traditional strengths of possible worlds semantics is that it provides a compositional semantics for modal notions. A virtue of the Plantinga/Jager approach is that it preserves compositionality. Haecceities, however, are the key to their approach. Adams' account by contrast, with its rejection of haecceities, sacrifices compositionality. Notably, the semantics of (1) must stop at (14): Because there are in fact no Aliens, the proposition There are Aliens has no witnesses, no objects that, by virtue of their actual or possible properties, make it true. Hence, unlike compositional accounts, one cannot further analyze the right side of the biconditional in (14).

The Iterated Modalities Objection

However, perhaps the sacrifice of compositionality is not too high a price for the strong actualist to pay. After all, we understand quantification well enough from standard, nonmodal Tarskian semantics. And given strong actualism, it is no surprise that (14) should be unanalyzable, for there are no possible Aliens to serve as witnesses to (14). The real goal of a semantics of modality is to provide an analysis of our ordinary use of modal operators, not extensional ones like quantification. From that perspective, the unanalyzability of (14) is unproblematic, as the important work has been done in analyzing the modal operator in (1).

However, at this point Adams falls victim to the iterated modalities objection. Recall the following proposition:

(7) The pope could have had a son who could have become a priest
that is, formally,
(9) x(Sxp & Px).
On Adams' semantics, (9) is true if and only if
(15) x(Sxp & Px)’ (i.e., the proposition Wojtyla has a son who could have become a priest) is true at some world w.
The problem now is that, if we stop the analysis of (9) with (15), the semantic prize noted above -- the analysis of our ordinary modal locutions in terms of possible worlds -- is lost, as (15) contains an embedded modal operator that cannot be analyzed in terms of world stories. For to do so, unlike the case of (14), one must produce a witness for ‘x(Sxp & Px)’ about whom it is true at some world that he is a priest. That is, in order to analyze the embedded modal operator, (15) seems to require analysis along the following lines:
(16) For some some individual x, ‘Sxp & Px’ (i.e., the proposition x is a son of Wojtyla and x could have become a priest) is true at some world w,
which then enables us to analyze the embedded modal operator:
(17) For some some individual x, ‘Sxp’ (i.e., the proposition x is a son of Wojtyla) is true at some possible world w and, for some possible world u, ‘Px’ (i.e., the proposition x is a priest) is true at u.
But by strong actualism, there is no such instance x, as the pope has no children and, assuming that one's actual parents are necessarily one's parents (provided one exists), nothing actual could have been the pope's child. Hence, given strong actualism, there is no information about any such x, no singular proposition that is directly about any such x. Hence, there is no proposition of the requisite form x is a son of Wojtyla specified in (17) to be true at some possible world, that is, to be a member of some world story. Granted, there could be such a proposition, but, given strong actualism, there isn't in fact. Hence, Adams' semantics fails to provide the analysis of our ordinary modal discourse that it purports to provide.

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Problems for World Propositions

Fine's account leaves us with a general question: What role, then, are possible worlds playing in accounts like Plantinga's, Adams', and Fine's in which possible worlds are defined in terms of a primitive modality? If these accounts are not providing a semantical analyses of modality, what is their purpose? Why clutter our ontology with them if they do not lead to any genuine semantical insight?

A natural answer is that, even if worlds don't provide us with a semantical analysis of modality, possible worlds are still tremendously useful in the formal analysis of modality. Notably, the apparatus of possible world semantics enables us to define such critical properties as consistency and completeness for formal systems of modality. It also enables a definition of the critical notion of logical consequence for modal languages. However, the formal, mathematical apparatus of possible world semantics -- the name notwithstanding -- is completely independent of any philosophical conception of possible worlds. There need be no "intended" possible worlds model -- one actually containing possible worlds of some ilk -- in order for us to employ the apparatus to define and use the notions above. Hence, the usefulness of the formal semantics provides us with no reason to allow possible worlds into our ontology.

However, perhaps that is too hasty. For while it is true that possible world semantics is independent of the question of whether there are any possible worlds, by the same token, if there are no possible worlds in any sense, it is difficult to justify the use of possible worlds models as a reasonable formal mechanism for studying the semantical properties of modal languages. For if modal truth is not related in any way to truth in honest-to-goodness possible worlds, then it is hard to see any connection between the informal, intuitive notions modal truth and entailment and the formal notions of truth-in-a-(possible-worlds)-model and logical consequence. Arguably, then, even if they do not provide semantical analyses, possible worlds play an essential role in linking our formal possible world semantics to our ordinary modal concepts of truth and logical consequence. And this could be seen as a motivation for accounts like Adams', Plantinga's, and Fine's. The possible worlds of these accounts give substance to the important intuition that there are other ways that things could have been, that there is indeed an intuitive connection between modal truth and quantification over in possible worlds. Thus, the "worlds" in a formal possible worlds model can be viewed as something more than mere formal artifacts. They can be seen as actual representations of other ways the world could have been, and quantification over them as a reasonable representation of an important way in which we think intuitively about modal truth. This connection between the "worlds" of a formal model and genuine possible worlds thus establishes a connection between truth-in-a-model and honest-to-goodness modal truth. (Although without the actual existence of an intended model, as is the case for Adams and Fine, rather more would need to be said to flesh out the nature of this connection.) Hence, even though they do not provide semantical analyses, the accounts in question can, at least, be thought of as providing a philosophical justification for considering the apparatus of formal possible worlds models to be a reasonable formal mechanism for studying the semantical properties of modal languages. An actualist account that attempts to do without worlds but which retains an understanding of possible world semantics that ties it to our ordinary notion of modal truth is discussed in the section Dispensing With Worlds.

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Problems for Roles

McMichael's semantics seems reasonably successful in coping with the problems facing the semantics of Plantinga and Adams. The account is actualist, but neither requires haecceities nor falls prey to the compositionality and iterated modalities objections. However, the success of the account comes at a fairly steep intuitive price, as it abandons strong intuitions about de re modality. McMichael would have us understand (21), the statement that Socrates could have been foolish, to be expressing a fact about a complex, abstract property, a role, that bears some sort of accessibility relation to another role that is exemplified by Socrates. actual role of Socrates. Similarly, (9) expresses a fact about a role accessible to the Pope's actual role. But one still wonders: what do such facts about roles and their accessibility to one another have to do with the properties Socrates could have had? What, in particular, is the connection between the accessibility of one role to another and the modal properties of individuals? What we'd like to say is that a role S is accessible to, say, Socrates' actual role Rs just in case it is a role Socrates could have exemplified. But, in McMichael's semantics, to say that Socrates could have exemplified any given property P (a role in particular) is only to say that some role that includes P is accessible to Rs, and we are back where we started with no insight into the connection between accessibility and the modal properties of Socrates. On this score, both possibilism and haecceitism account far more satisfactorily for our modal intuitions.

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Problems for the No-world Account

Perhaps the central problem for the no-world account is that is abandons traditional ideas about truth and modality. The no-worlder counts his eschewal of worlds as a virtue. However, as Linsky and Zalta [1996] note, this is problematic for several reasons. For if we abandon possible worlds, we must also abandon the "seminal insight" that necessary truth is truth in all possible worlds. And this is problematic for several reasons, for it not only undermines the elegant, extensional characterization of the truth conditions of modal claims, but also dismisses the intuition so strongly evident in ordinary thinking about modality that there exist alternative ways the world might have been. For the no-worlder, however, there are no worlds, and hence no intended model whose indices are genuine possible worlds. There are instead only purely formal intended* models that possibly model the structure of modal reality. But, Linsky and Zalta ask,
... surely there is something more to modal truth than this; surely necessity and possibility are about something besides the structure of intended* models, something which grounds modal truth and which is modeled by an intended model. ([1994], 444)
But intended* models are not really models of anything. At best they have the property of being actual objects that possibly model the structure of modal reality. But a model of the pure structure of modal reality, the objection might continue, is not the same as a genuine model of modal reality. On the no-worlds approach,
...we cannot say that modal discourse is in part about the objects over which the quantifiers range, at least not in the same way that we can say that nonmodal language is about these objects. (Linsky and Zalta, [1994], 444)
And if not, it is hard to see in what sense the no-worlds approach accounts for modal truth at all.

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Problems for New Actualism

New actualism is a powerful and elegant solution to the problem of possibilism. It appears to have all the theoretical power of possibilism without possibilism's commitment to mere possibilia; everything there is is actual. However, one might argue that it is no surprise that new actualism retains the theoretical power of possibilism, because new actualism is nothing more than thinly veiled possibilism: the new actualist's "actuality" is just the possibilist's being, and contingent nonconcreteness is nothing but the possibilist's mere possibility; nothing but terminology distinguishes a mere possibile from a possibly (but not actually) concrete individual.

Even if this is all there were to new actualism, it would not be insignificant. For, in that case, new actualism shows that the standard definition of actualism has not gotten to the heart of the matter -- that actualism is not best characterized as the thesis that everything there is, in any sense, is actual. For new actualism demonstrates, at least, that there is a way of systematically reclothing possibilist statements in actualist guise.

This might prompt the "classical" actualist to try to get at the essence of her view in a slightly different way. The real target of the claim that everything is actual is the possibilist's division of being into two modes: actuality and mere possibility (i.e., contingent nonactuality). The new actualist certainly denies that division; there are indeed no mere possibilia for the new actualist, no objects that are, but which fail to be actual. However, the classical actualist would argue that the new actualist still violates the spirit of actualism. The new actualist does indeed maintain a single sense of being; but in place of the possibilist's division of being into two modes -- actuality and contingent nonactuality -- the new actualist substitutes a division of actuality into two modes: concreteness and contingent nonconcreteness. It is difficult not to see this as a mere relabeling of the possibilist's distinction. Most classical actualists will, therefore, regard new actualism as having the form of actualism without having the content necessary to serve as a genuine solution to the possibilist challenge.

For further debate on new actualism see Tomberlin [1996] and the reply by Zalta and Linsky [1996].

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Copyright © 2005
Christopher Menzel

Supplement to Actualism
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy