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Xenophanes of Colophon was a philosophically-minded poet who lived in various parts of the ancient Greek world during the late 6th and early 5th centuries B.C. He is best remembered for a novel critique of anthropomorphism in religion, a partial advance toward monotheism, and some pioneering reflections on the conditions of knowledge. Many later writers, perhaps influenced by two brief characterizations of Xenophanes by Plato (Sophist 242c-d) and Aristotle (Metaphysics 986b18-27), identified him as the founder of Eleatic philosophy (the view that, despite appearances, what there is is a changeless, motionless, and eternal One). In fact, the Xenophanes who emerges from the surviving fragments defies simple classification. He was a travelling rhapsode who criticised the stories about the gods told by the poets, and he defended a novel conception of the divine nature. But he was also a reflective observer of the human condition, a practitioner of the special form of inquiry (historiê) introduced by the Milesian philosopher-scientists, and a civic counselor who encouraged his fellow citizens to respect the gods and work to safeguard the well-being of their city.
In his Lives of the Philosophers (Diels-Kranz, testimonium A1) Diogenes Laertius reports that Xenophanes son of Dexius (or according to some, Orthomenes) was born in the small Ionian town of Colophon and flourished during the sixtieth Olympiad (540-537 B.C.). Laertius adds that Xenophanes was driven out of his homeland when Harpagus the Mede invaded Ionia in 546/5 B.C., spent time in Zancle and Catana (two Greek communities in Sicily), criticised Homer and Hesiod, recited his own works, and composed poems on the founding of Colophon and Elea. Later writers add that he buried his sons with his own hands, was sold into slavery, and later released from it. By Xenophanes' own account (B8) he tossed about the Greek land for sixty-seven years, starting at the age of twenty-five.
Diels-Kranz (DK) provides 45 fragments of his poetry (although B4, 13, 19, 20, 21 and 41 would be more accurately classified as testimonia), ranging from the 24 lines of B1 to the single-word fragments of B21a, 39, and 40. A number of the sympotic poems (poems for drinking parties) (B1-3, 5, 6, 22, and the imitation in C2) were preserved by Athenaeus, while the remarks on the nature of the divine were quoted by Clement (B14-16 and 23), Sextus Empiricus (B11, 12, and 24), and Simplicius (B25 and 26). Other snippets survive in the accounts by Diogenes Laertius and Aëtius, or as marginal notes in our manuscripts of various authors, or as entries in later rhetorical summaries and dictionaries. Seventy-four selections, of which the most extensive is the pseudo-Aristotelian treatise On Melissus, Xenophanes, Gorgias (MXG), make up the collection of testimonia in DK. Laertius' statement (A1) that Xenophanes wrote in epic meter, also elegiacs, and iambics is confirmed by extant poems in hexameters and elegiac meter, with one couplet (B14) a combination of hexameter and iambic trimeter. Ancient writers referred to a number of his compositions as silloi -- squints or satires, and a critical tone pervades many of the surviving fragments. Three late sources credit Xenophanes with a didactic poem under the title Peri Phuseôs (On Nature) but not every allusion to an earlier author's views "on nature" represented a reference to a single work on that subject.
Fragments B11 and B12 describe, and implicitly criticize, the stories about the gods told by Homer and Hesiod.
Homer and Hesiod have attributed to the gods all sorts of things that are matters of reproach and censure among men: theft, adultery, and mutual deception. (B11) ...as they sang of numerous illicit divine deeds: theft, adultery, and mutual deceit. (B12)
The basis for Xenophanes' unhappiness with the poets' accounts is not explained, but we may infer from the concluding call to pay due honor to the gods in Xenophanes' B1 that an attribution of scandalous conduct would be incompatible with the goodness or perfection any divine being must be assumed to possess (cf. Aristotle Meta. 1072b; Plato, Rep. 379b.)
In the well-known fragments B14-16, Xenophanes comments on the general tendency of human beings to conceive of divine beings in human form:
But mortals suppose that gods are born, wear their own clothers and have a voice and body. (B14) Ethiopians say that their gods are snub-nosed and black; Thracians that theirs are are blue-eyed and red-haired. (B16)
B15 adds, probably in a satirical vein, that if horses and oxen had hands and could draw pictures, their gods would look remarkably like horses and oxen. B17, and bacchants of pine stand round the well-built house may represent a criticism of the common ancient belief that a god could assume possession of a physical object so as to offer protection to its possessor. The ridiculing of Pythagoras' claim to have recognized the soul of a departed friend in the voice of a barking dog (B7), together with the attacks on divination credited to Xenophanes in A52, reflect the broader denial of knowledge of divine attributes and operations set out in B34. Xenophanes is prepared to offer a positive account of the nature of the deity (see the following section) but his position appears to be that while no mortal being will ever know about the gods with any degree of certainty, we can at least avoid adopting beliefs and practices clearly at odds with the special nature any divine being must be assumed to possess.
So far as is known, Xenophanes was the first Greek thinker to offer a complex and at least partially systematic account of the divine nature. We have already noted how an implicit assumption of divine perfection may underlie his criticisms of Homer, Hesiod, and the tendency to imagine the gods in human form. Of the positive characterizations of the divine made in B23-26, perhaps the most fundamental is B23:
One god greatest among gods and men, not at all like mortals in body or in thought.
Although the remark has often been read as a pioneering expression of monotheism, this reading is made problematic by the nearby reference to gods in the plural in the first line and the possibility that Xenophanes sought to highlight not the one god but rather the one greatest god (cf. Homer, Iliad 12, 243 for the use of one (Greek heis) reinforcing a superlative). The relevant measures of divine greatness are not specified, but the two most obvious choices would be greatness in honor and power, with honor perhaps the more basic of the two (cf. Iliad 2, 350; 2, 412; 4, 515; Od. 3, 378; 5,4; Hesiod, Theogony 49, 534, 538, etc.). Greatness in power would in turn explain the characterizations of the divine as perceptive and conscious in all its parts (B24), able to shake all things by the exercise of his thought (B25), and able to accomplish everything while remaining forever in the same place or condition (B26). It is unclear, however, how far Xenophanes himself realized the interconnections among the different divine attributes or sought to exploit those connections for didactic purposes. At least as they have come down to us, none of the remarks on the divine nature (B23-26) contains any of the inferential particles (gar, epei, oun, hoti, etc.) one would normally expect to find in a piece of reasoned discourse.
Some later writers (A28.6, 31.2, 34-36) report that Xenophanes identified his one greatest god with the entire physical universe -- often termed the whole or all things, and some modern accounts portray Xenophanes as a pantheist. But this understanding of Xenophanes' doctrines seems inconsistent with his assertion that god shakes all things (B25) that all things are from the earth and to the earth all things come in the end (B27), and that all things which come into being and grow, are earth and water (B29). On the whole, Xenophanes' remarks on the divine nature are perhaps best read as an expression of a traditional Greek piety: there exists a being of extraordinary power and excellence, and it is incumbent on each of us to hold it in high regard.
Five fragments touch on traditional subjects of Greek sympotic verse -- on proper conduct at symposia (drinking parties), the measures of personal excellence, and the existence of various human foibles or failures. Xenophanes appears to have been particularly interested in identifying and discouraging conduct that failed to pay due honor to the gods or posed a risk to the stability and well-being of the city (or perhaps both). Although these passages may be insufficiently abstract and demonstrative in character to count as philosophical teachings, they do represent an important bridge between Greek poetry of the archaic period and the kind of moral theorizing practiced by many 5th and 4th-century thinkers. Xenophanes' disparagement of the honors accorded to athletes (B2), his call to censor the stories the poets tell about the gods (B1), and counsel to live a life of moderation (B3 and 5, and perhaps B21) all anticipate views expressed in Plato's Republic (cf. 607a, 378b, 372b.) His criticism of the pursuit of useless luxuries (B3) also anticipates Socrates' rebuke of his fellow citizens for caring more about wealth and power than about virtue (cf. Apology 30b.) His cautionary remarks about knowledge (B34) and reminder of the subjectivity of human taste (B38: If god had not made yellow honey, they would think that figs were far sweeter) also reflect a traditional view of human judgment as limited and conditioned by personal experience. In each of these areas, Xenophanes' social commentary represents a continuation of the Greek poetic tradition as well as a step toward explicit philosophical theorizing.
We may reasonably conclude from several surviving fragments and a large number of testimonia that Xenophanes was well aware of the teachings of the Milesian philosopher-scientists (Thales, Anaximander, and Anaximenes), and sought to improve on them. While many of the details of his own scientific views remain obscure, the range and interconnectedness of his interests make him an important figure in the development of Ionian scientific theory. Theodoretus, Stobaeus, and Olympiodorus (all in A 36) credit him with a view of earth as the archê or first principle of all things. Yet Galen (also in A36) rejects this attribution, and B29 equates all things which come into being and grow with earth and water. A two-substance archê would, moreover, be compatible with the many references to physical mixtures. A33 credits Xenophanes with a view of the sea as containing many mixtures, while B37 notes the presence of water in rocky caves, and A50 reports a view of the soul as earth and water. Insofar as some natural bodies are described as consisting entirely of water (or of a part of water, as in A46 where the sweet portion of the water is drawn up from the sea and separated off), it would be best to understand Xenophanes' two-substance theory in a distributed sense: all things are either earth, or water, or earth combined with water.
Xenophanes appears to have explored many of the same phenomena studied at an earlier date by the Milesians. B28 presents a view of the nature and extent of the earth's depths; B30 identifies the sea as the source of clouds, wind, and rain; B32 comments on the nature of Iris (rainbow); B37 notes the presence of water in caves; B39 and 40 mention cherry trees and frogs; A38-45 discuss various astronomical phenomena, and A48 indicates an interest in periodic volcanic eruptions in Sicily. Hippolytus (A33) credits Xenophanes with a theory of alternating periods of world-wide flood and drought that was inspired, at least in part, by the discovery of fossilized remains of sea creatures at inland locations. Whether or not Xenophanes himself traveled to Syracuse, Paros, and Malta where these remains were found, his use of this information as the basis for a broad explanation of phenomena is an implicit testimonial to the heuristic value of information gained through travel and observation.
Many testimonia credit Xenophanes with an interest in meteorological and astronomical phenomena. Not only are these comments of interest in their own right, they also present us what was arguably his single most important scientific contribution--his contention that clouds or cloud-like substances play a basic role in a great many natural phenomena. The term nephos (cloud) appears only twice in the fragments of his work (in B30 and 32) but many testimonia either bear directly on the nature of clouds or make use of clouds in order to explain the nature of other phenomena. To cite an example of the first type, according to Diogenes Laertius he says the clouds are formed by the sun's vapor [i.e. vapor caused by the heat from the sun's rays] raising and lifting them to the surrounding air (A1.24-5). Aëtius (A46) provides a similar account:
Xenophanes (says that) things in the heavens occur through the heat of the sun as the initial cause; for when the moisture is drawn up from the sea, the sweet portion, separating because of its fineness and turning into mists, combines into clouds, trickled down in drops of rain due to compression, and vaporizes the winds.
B30 gives us essentially the same view in Xenophanes' own words:
The sea is the source of water and of wind, For without the great sea, there would be no wind Nor streams of rivers, nor rainwater from on high But the great sea is the begetter of clouds, winds, and rivers.
Having accounted for the formation of clouds in mechanistic terms through processes of vaporization and compression Xenophanes proceeds to make use of clouds to explain a large number of meteorlogical and astronomical phenomena. The general claim appears in the pseudo-Plutarch Miscellanies: he says that the sun and the stars come into being from the clouds (A32), and Aëtius gives us many specific applications:
The stars come into being from burning clouds (A38).
The sort of fires that appear on ships--whom some call the Dioscuri [St. Elmo's fire]--are tiny clouds glimmering in virtue of the sort of motion they have (A39).
The sun consists of burning clouds a mass of little fires, themselves constructed from the massing together of the moist exhalation (A40).
The moon is compressed cloud (A43).
All things of this sort [comets, shooting stars, meteors] are either groups or movements of clouds (A44).
Flashes of lightning come about through the shining of the clouds because of the movement (A45).
As it happens, clouds are natural candidates for the explanans in a scientific account. Since they are midway in form between a solid and gaseous state they are easily linked with solids, liquids, and gases of various kinds. And since they occupy a region midway between the surface of the earth and the upper regions of the heavens, they are well positioned to link the two basic substances of earth and water with many astronomical phenomena.
Another important feature of Xenophanes' cloud-based approach to understanding natural phenomena is the application of this theory to a set of phenomena closely linked with traditional religious belief. We have already seen this in the thoroughly naturalistic accounts given of the great sea, sun, moon, and stars, but nowhere is the contrast of the old and new ways of thinking more evident than in his comments on Iris--rainbow:
And she whom they call Iris, this too is by nature a cloud. Purple, red, and greenish-yellow to behold. (B32)
For the members of Xenophanes' audience Iris referred to the messenger goddess of Homer's Iliad (2, 686) and Hesiod's Theogony (780) and a set of atmospheric phenomena (halos, coronae, and cloud iridescence) commonly considered portents or signs of the intentions of divine beings. As the daughter of Thaumas (marvel) Iris was the natural marvel par excellence. Yet for Xenophanes, she is really an it and a this (the Greek neuter demonstrative touto), by nature a purple, red, and greenish-yellow cloud. It is, moreover, something that is there for us to behold or to look at (idesthai). Perhaps nowhere in presocratic philosophy can we find a clearer expression of the character of the Ionian intellectual revolution -- a decision to put aside an older way of thinking about events grounded in a belief in divine beings in favor of an approach to understanding the world that employs wide-ranging inquiry and direct observation and resorts to strictly physical causes and forces. Having deprived the gods of human form and clothing and removed the divine to some permanent and distant location, Xenophanes proceeds to strip a wide range of natural phenomena of all vestiges of religious or spiritual significance. His de-mythologized account of natural phenomena is, in short, the logical complement to his thoroughly de-naturalized account of the divine nature.
Despite its several virtues, Xenophanes' physical theory appears to have had little impact on later thinkers. Anaxagoras followed his lead on the nature of the rainbow (cf. DK 59 B19) and Empedocles knew (but repudiated) his claim of the earth's indefinitely extended depths (DK 31 B39). But both Plato and Aristotle appear to have ignored Xenophanes' scientific views or assigned them little importance. One factor that may have contributed to this chilly reception was the absence of any expression by Xenophanes of the kind of commitment to teleology that both Plato and Aristotle regarded as essential to a proper understanding of the cosmos. Xenophanes' universe is controlled by a set of forces, but it is never described as heading toward the best nor is it directed toward some best result by a controlling intelligence. (Xenophanes' divine does shake all things by the thought of his mind (alone), but he is never described as in any way directing or controlling particular events.) It is also obvious that Xenophanes' heavenly bodies would have fallen far short of the level of perfection that, with Aristotle, became a hallmark of classical astronomical theory. Not only are Xenophanes' heavenly bodies not divine beings, they undergo creation and destruction at regular intervals. Only from the perspective of a much later period can the merits of Xenophanes' scientific views be fairly appreciated. Many centuries would have to pass before an emphasis on direct observation and the use of entirely natural causes and forces would become the scientific orthodoxy.
Five surviving fragments and roughly a dozen testimonia address what might be termed epistemological questions -- How much can any mortal being hope to know?, Does truth come to us through our own efforts or by divine revelation?, and What role do our sense faculties play in the acquisition of knowledge? Unfortunately, the picture that emerges from many of the testimonia largely contradicts what appear to be the views Xenophanes himself expressed. According to the summary in the pseudo-Plutarch Miscellanies, Xenophanes declares that the senses are deceptive and generally rejects reason along with them (A32.) Similarly, in his Concerning Philosophy Aristocles reports that since they think that sense perceptions and appearances must be rejected and trust only reason. For at one earlier time Xenophanes, Parmenides, Zeno, and Melissus said something of this sort (A49). Similarly, Aëtius declares that Pythagoras, Empedocles, and Xenophanes (say that) sense perceptions are deceptive (A49). Yet, as we have noted, B28 refers without qualification to the upper limit of the earth that is seen (horatai) here at our feet and B32 appears to encourage those in Xenophanes' audience to look at or observe (idesthai) the multi-colored cloud that is the rainbow. The realistic description of the sumptuous banquet in B1 and the wide range of Xenophanes' reported geographical and geological interests all sit poorly with an Eleatic rationalism that would dismiss all information gained through our faculties of sense and construct on the basis of reason alone a view of what is as a motionless, changeless and eternal unity.
Xenophanes' most extended comment on knowledge is B34:
and of course the clear and certain truth no man has seen nor will there be anyone who knows about the gods and what I say about all things. For even if, in the best case, one happened to speak just of what has been brought to pass, still he himself would not know. But opinion is allotted to all.
Portions of these remarks were quoted, and thereby preserved for posterity, by the ancient skeptics who hailed Xenophanes as the founder of their particular variety of philosophical skepticism. Recent interpretations of B34 reject the skeptical interpretation in favor of other less extreme readings. On some accounts, B34 is concerned to deny only a direct perceptual awareness. Others find in his comments a distinction between natural science, where only probabilities can be achieved, and theology, where certainty is possible. Still others read Xenophanes' remarks as a blanket endorsement of fallibilism -- the view that while each individual is free to express his or her opinion, the possibility of error can never be completely excluded.
Since B34 opens with the phrase and indeed it is likely that we do not have the whole of the remark, or all the premises from which its main conclusion was intended to follow. However, the use of the term saphes (clear, in the first line of the fragment) by Xenophanes' Ionian contemporary, the historian Herodotus, provides a helpful clue to the logic of the argument. At several points in his History Herodotus speaks of what is saphes, or what can be known in a sapheôs manner, as what can be confirmed to be the case on the basis of first-hand observation:
And wishing to gain sure knowledge of these things (thelôn de toutôn peri saphes ti eidenai) from a point where this was possible, I took ship to Tyre in Phoenicia, where I heard there was a very holy temple of Heracles. There I saw it (eidon) richly equipped Then I went to Thasos where I also found a temple of Heracles Therefore what I have discovered by inquiry clearly shows (ta men nun historêmena dêloi sapheôs) that Heracles is an ancient god. (History II, 44)
Since the gods were believed to inhabit a realm far removed that of mortal beings, it would be natural for Xeophanes to hold that no account of their nature and activities could possibly be confirmed on the basis of first-hand observation, hence known for certain to be correct. And since the pioneering cosmological accounts put forward by his Milesian predecessors held that a single material substance underlay phenomena in all places and times it would be equally impossible for any individual to confirm such a universal claim on the basis of first-hand observation, hence know for certain that it was true -- even if in fact it was true. The sentiments expressed in lines three and four can be read as reinforcing this cautionary sentiment. Their point would be that no one (moreover) should be credited with knowledge (of the certain truth concerning the gods or the nature of all things) simply on the basis of having correctly described, perhaps even predicted, individual events as they take place (perhaps a reference to self-styled paragons of wisdom and predictors of events such as Epimenides and Pythagoras). The overall message of B34, from its opening reference to no man to its concluding phrase fashioned for all would have been that there never has been nor ever will be anyone who has the capacity to achieve certainty with respect to these important matters.
Xenophanes' reference to a second-best level of comprehension or awareness -- opinion or conjecture (dokos) should not be read as inherently negative or dismissive. By Platonic standards, opinion -- even when correct -- would be an inferior possession, unstable and subject to removal through persuasion. But we have no reason to assume that Xenophanes shared Plato's view on this topic. And in fact B35, quoted by Plutarch in connection with encouraging a bashful speaker to express his views, appears to present what one opines or believes in a fairly positive light:
Let these things be believed (dedoxasthô) as like the realities
The similarity between the verbal dedoxasthô of B35 and the nominative dokos of B34 permits us to combine the two fragmentary remarks into a single coherent view: of course there can be no knowledge of the certain truth concerning the gods and the basic principles governing the cosmos, but dokos -- opinion or conjecture -- is available and should be accepted when it corresponds with how things really are.
The full sense of B36, however, may never be determined. Neither its context (a grammatical treatise of Herodian) nor its wording ( however many they have made evident for mortals to look upon) provides definitive guidance. Perhaps Xenophanes was seeking to set an upper limit to the range of things that can be known by human beings (i.e. to caution others that they could know only as many as things as the gods had made available to them to experience). But it is equally possible that the remark was intended (as B32 above) to encourage the members of his audience to explore and inquire on their own (i.e. to encourage them to investigate however many things the gods have made available to them to experience).
B18 has often been hailed as an expression of an optimistic outlook or faith in human progress -- the conviction that humankind has made and will continue to make improvements in the arts and conditions of life generally. Yet none of the other surviving fragments reflects such an optimism and several (e.g. B2 and 3) suggest that Xenophanes was not at all optimistic about his city's prospects for survival. In the light of his reported repudiation of divination (A52), de-mythologizing of various natural phenomena (B30 and 32), and evident enthusiasm for inquiry into a wide range of subjects, B18 is perhaps best read as an expression of faith in the value of inquiry or seeking as the preferred approach to gaining knowledge of all things.
To sum up: Xenophanes' attitude toward knowledge appears to have been the product of two distinct impulses. While he believed that inquiry in the form of travel and direct observation was capable of yielding useful information about the nature of things, he remained sufficiently under the influence of an older piety to want to caution others against seeking to understand matters that lay beyond the limits of all human experience. Here, as in other aspects of his thought, Xenophanes stands with one foot in the world of the archaic poet and the other in the new science of the late 6th and early 5th centuries B.C.
Many later writers identified Xenophanes as the teacher of Parmenides and the founder of the Eleatic school of philosophy -- the view that, despite appearances, what there is is a motionless, changeless, and eternal One. This view of Xenophanes is based largely on Plato's reference to our Eleatic tribe, beginning from Xenophanes as well as even earlier (Sophist 242d) and Aristotle's remark that ...with regard to the whole universe, he says that the one is the god (Meta. A5, 986b18), along with some verbal similarities between Xenophanes' description of the one greatest, unmoving god and Parmenides' account of a motionless, eternal, and unitary being. But the Xenophanes who speaks to us in the surviving fragments is a combination of rhapsode, social critic, religious teacher, and keen student of nature. Euripides' Heracles 1341 ff. echoes his attack on the stories told about the gods by Homer and Hesiod (B11-12) and a passage of Euripides' Autolycus quoted by Athenaeus (C2) repeats portions of the attack on the honors accorded to athletes delivered in B2. In the Republic, Plato shows himself the spiritual heir of Xenophanes when he states that the guardians of his ideal state are more deserving of honors and public support than the victors at Olympia, criticizes the stories told about the gods by the poets, and calls for a life of moderate desire and action. A pronounced ethic of moderation, sometimes bordering on asceticism, runs through much of ancient Greek ethical thought, beginning with Solon and Xenophanes and continuing through Socrates and Plato to the Epicureans and Cynics. Xenophanes' conception of a one greatest god who shakes all things by the thought (or will) of his mind (noou phreni) may have helped to encourage Heraclitus' belief in an intelligence (gnômê) that steers all things (B41), Anaxagoras' account of the nous that orders and arranges all things (B12), and Aristotle's account of a divine nous that inspires a movement toward perfection without actually doing anything toward bringing it about (Metaphysics Lambda.)
Although there may be no direct line of influence, we may also consider Feuerbach's critique of religious belief as a projection of human attributes, and Freud's analysis of religious belief as an instance of wish-fulfillment, as two modern successors to Xenophanes' observation of the general tendency of human beings to conceive of divine beings in terms of their own attributes and capacities.
Xenophanes' most enduring philosophical contribution was arguably his pioneering exploration of the conditions under which human beings can achieve knowledge of the certain truth. The distinction between knowledge and true opinion set out in B34 quickly became an axiom of ancient Greek accounts of knowledge and survives in modern garb as the belief and truth conditions of the standard or tripartite analysis of knowledge. It can be plausibly argued that every later Greek thinker, at least until the time of Aristotle, undertook to respond to the basic challenge posed in Xenophanes' B34 -- how, given the severely limited character of human experience, anyone can plausibly claim to have discovered the truth about matters lying beyond anyone's capacity to observe first-hand. Xenophanes may also be credited with expanding the range of topics considered appropriate for philosophical inquiry and discussion. His Ionian predecessors had initiated the study of phenomena above the heavens and below the earth but, so far as we know, they did not turn their critical fire against the leading poets of ancient Greece nor did they seek through their teachings to correct or improve the conduct of their fellow citizens. Although many aspects of his thought remain the subject of scholarly debate, Xenophanes was clearly a multi-dimensional thinker who left his mark on many aspects of later Greek thought.
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First published: October 21, 2002
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