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During his years in Cambridge, from 1911 to 1913, Wittgenstein conducted several conversations on the foundations of logic with Russell, with whom he had an emotional and intense relationship, as well as with Moore, Keynes, and Ramsey. He retreated to isolation in Norway, for months at a time, in order to ponder these philosophical problems and to work out their solutions. In 1913 he returned to Austria and in 1914, at the start of World War I (1914-1918), joined the Austrian army. He was taken captive in 1917 and spent the remaining months of the war at a prison camp. It was during the war that he wrote the notes and drafts of his first important work, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. After the war the book was published in German and translated into English.
In 1920 Wittgenstein, now divorced from philosophy (having, to his mind, solved all philosophical problems in the Tractatus), gave away his part of his family's fortune and pursued several "professions" (gardener, teacher, architect, etc.) in and around Vienna. It was only in 1929 that he returned to Cambridge to resume his philosophical vocation, after having been exposed to discussions on the philosophy of mathematics and science with members of the Vienna Circle. During these first years in Cambridge his conception of philosophy and its problems underwent dramatic changes that are recorded in several volumes of conversations, lecture notes, and letters (e.g., Ludwig Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle, The Blue and Brown Books, Philosophical Grammar). Sometimes termed the middle Wittgenstein', this period heralds a rejection of dogmatic philosophy, including both traditional works and the Tractatus itself.
In the 1930s and 1940s Wittgenstein conducted seminars -- notorious for problems in communication between teacher and students -- at Cambridge, developing most of the ideas that he intended to publish in his second book, Philosophical Investigations. These included the turn from formal logic to ordinary language, novel reflections on psychology and mathematics, and a general skepticism concerning philosophy's pretensions. In 1945 he prepared the final manuscript of the Philosophical Investigations, but, at the last minute, withdrew it from publication (and only authorized its posthumous publication). For a few more years he continued his philosophical work, but this is marked by a rich development of, rather than a turn away from, his second phase. He traveled during this period to the United States and Ireland, and returned to Cambridge, where he was diagnosed with cancer. Legend has it that, at his death in 1951, his last words were "Tell them I've had a wonderful life" (Monk: 579).
The Tractatus's structure purports to be representative of its internal essence. It is constructed around seven basic propositions, numbered by the natural numbers 1-7, with all other paragraphs in the text numbered by decimal expansions so that, e.g., paragraph 1.1 is (supposed to be) a further elaboration on proposition 1, 1.22 is an elaboration of 1.2, and so on.
The seven basic propositions are:*
1. The world is everything that is the case. The world is all that is the case. 2. What is the case, the fact, is the existence of atomic facts. What is the case -- a fact -- is the existence of states of affairs. 3. The logical picture of the facts is the thought. A logical picture of facts is a thought. 4. The thought is the significant proposition. A thought is a proposition with sense. 5. Propositions are truth-functions of elementary propositions.
(An elementary proposition is a truth function of itself.)
A proposition is a truth-function of elementary propositions.
(An elementary proposition is a truth function of itself.)
6. The general form of truth-function is [, , N()].
This is the general form of proposition.
The general form of a truth-function is [, , N()].
This is the general form of a proposition.
7. Whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent. What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence.
[* Note: The first formulation is the Ogden translation. The second, in italics, is the Pears/McGuinness translation.]
Clearly, the book addresses the central problems of philosophy which deal with the world, thought and language, and presents a "solution" (as Wittgenstein terms it) of these problems which is grounded in logic and in the nature of representation. The world is represented by thought, which is a proposition with sense, since they all -- world, thought, and proposition -- share the same logical form. Hence, the thought and the proposition can be pictures of the facts.
Starting with a seeming metaphysics, Wittgenstein sees the world as consisting of facts (1), rather than the traditional, atomistic conception of a world made up of objects. Facts are existent states of affairs (2) and states of affairs, in turn, are combinations of objects. Objects can fit together in various determinate ways. They may have various properties and may hold diverse relations to one another. Objects combine with one another according to their logical, internal properties. That is to say, an object's internal properties determine the possibilities of its combination with other objects; this is its logical form. Thus, states of affairs, being comprised of objects in combination, are inherently complex. The states of affairs which do exist could have been otherwise. This means that states of affairs are either actual (existent) or possible. It is the totality of states of affairs -- actual and possible -- that makes up the whole of reality. The world is precisely those states of affairs which do exist.
The move to thought, and thereafter to language, is perpetrated with the use of Wittgenstein's famous idea that thoughts, and propositions, are pictures -- "the picture is a model of reality" (TLP 2.12). Pictures are made up of elements that together constitute the picture. Each element represents an object, and the combination of objects in the picture represents the combination of objects in a state of affairs. The logical structure of the picture, whether in thought or in language, is isomorphic with the logical structure of the state of affairs which it pictures. More subtle is Wittgenstein's insight that the possibility of this structure being shared by the picture (the thought, the proposition) and the state of affairs is the pictorial form. "That is how a picture is attached to reality; it reaches right out to it" (TLP 2.1511). This leads to an understanding of what the picture can picture; but also what it cannot -- its own pictorial form.
While "the logical picture of the facts is the thought" (3), in the move to language Wittgenstein continues to investigate the possibilities of significance for propositions (4). Logical analysis, in the spirit of Frege and Russell, guides the work, with Wittgenstein using the logical calculus to carry out the construction of his system. Explaining that "Only the proposition has sense; only in the context of a proposition has a name meaning" (TLP 3.3), he provides the reader with the two conditions for sensical language. First, the structure of the proposition must conform with the constraints of logical form, and second, the elements of the proposition must have reference (bedeutung). These conditions have far-reaching implications. The analysis must culminate with a name being a primitive symbol, and this is manifested by the very abstract character of both names and (simple) objects. Moreover, logic itself gives us the structure and limits of what can be said at all.
Logic is based on the idea that every proposition is either true or false. This bi-polarity of propositions enables the composition of more complex propositions from atomic ones by using truth-functional operators (5). Wittgenstein supplies, in the Tractatus, the first presentation of Frege's logic in the form of what has become known as truth-tables'. This provides the means to go back and analyze all propositions into their atomic parts, since "every statement about complexes can be analyzed into a statement about their constituent parts, and into those propositions which completely describe the complexes" (TLP 2.0201). He delves even deeper by then providing the general form of a proposition (6). This form, [, , N()], makes use of one formal operation (N()) and one propositional variable () to represent Wittgenstein's claim that any proposition "is the result of successive applications" of logical operations to elementary propositions.
Having developed this analysis of world-thought-language, and relying on the one general form of the proposition, Wittgenstein can now assert that all meaningful propositions are of equal value. Subsequently, he ends the journey with the admonition concerning what can (or cannot), and what should (or should not) be said (7), leaving outside the realm of the sayable propositions of ethics, aesthetics, and metaphysics.
There are, first, the propositions of logic. These do not represent states of affairs, and the logical constants do not stand for objects. "My fundamental thought is that the logical constants do not represent. That the logic of the facts cannot be represented" (TLP 4.0312). This is not a happenstance thought; it is fundamental precisely because the limits of sense rest on logic. Tautologies and contradictions, the propositions of logic, are the limits of language and thought, and thereby the limits of the world. Obviously, then, they do not picture anything and do not, therefore, have sense. They are, in Wittgenstein's terms, senseless (sinnlos). Propositions which do have sense are bipolar; they range within the truth-conditions drawn by the propositions of logic. But the propositions of logic themselves are neither true nor false "for the one allows every possible state of affairs, the other none" (TLP 4.462).
The characteristic of being senseless applies not only to the propositions of logic but also to other things that cannot be represented, such as mathematics or the pictorial form itself of the pictures that do represent. These are, like tautologies and contradictions, literally sense-less, they have no sense.
Beyond, or aside from, senseless propositions Wittgenstein identifies another group of statements which cannot carry sense: the nonsensical (unsinnig) propositions. Nonsense, as opposed to senselessness, is encountered when a proposition is even more radically devoid of meaning, when it transcends the bounds of sense. Under the label of unsinnig can be found various propositions: "Socrates is identical", but also "1 is a number". While some nonsensical propositions are blatantly so, others seem to be meaningful -- and only analysis carried out in accordance with the picture theory can expose their nonsensicality. Since only what is "in" the world can be described, anything that is "higher" is excluded, including the notion of limit and the limit points themselves. Traditional metaphysics, and the propositions of ethics and aesthetics, which try to capture the world as a whole, are also excluded, as is the truth in solipsism, the very notion of a subject, for it is also not "in" the world but at its limit.
Wittgenstein does not, however, relegate all that is not inside the bounds of sense to oblivion. He makes a distinction between saying and showing which is made to do additional work. There are, beyond the senses that can be formulated in sayable (sensical) propositions, things that can only be shown. These -- the logical form of the world, the pictorial form, etc. -- show themselves in the form of (contingent) propositions, in the symbolism and logical propositions, and even in the unsayable (metaphysical, ethical, aesthetic) propositions of philosophy. "What can be shown cannot be said." But it is there, in language, even though it cannot be said.
"All propositions are of equal value" (TLP 6.4) -- that could also be the fundamental thought of the book. For it employs a measure of the value of propositions that is done by logic and the notion of limits. It is here, however, with the constraints on the value of propositions, that the tension in the Tractatus is most strongly felt. It becomes clear that the notions used by the Tractatus -- the logical-philosophical notions -- do not belong to the world and hence cannot be used to express anything meaningful. Since language, thought and the world, are all isomorphic, any attempt to say in logic (i.e., in language) "this and this there is in the world, that there is not" is doomed to be a failure, since it would mean that logic has got outside the limits of the world, i.e. of itself. That is to say, the Tractatus has gone over its own limits, and stands in danger of being nonsensical.
The "solution" to this tension is found in Wittgenstein's final remarks, where he uses the metaphor of the ladder to express the function of the Tractatus. It is to be used in order to climb on it, in order to "see the world rightly"; but thereafter it must be recognized as nonsense and be thrown away. Hence: "whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent" (7).
There are interpretations that see the Tractatus as espousing realism, i.e., as positing the independent existence of objects, states of affairs, and facts. That this realism is achieved via a linguistic turn is recognized by all (or most) interpreters, but this linguistic perspective does no damage to the basic realism that is seen to start off the Tractatus ("The world is all that is the case") and to run throughout the text ("Objects form the substance of the world" (TLP 2.021)). Such realism is also taken to be manifested in the essential bi-polarity of propositions; likewise, a straightforward reading of the picturing relation posits objects there to be represented by signs. As against these readings, more linguistically oriented interpretations give conceptual priority to the symbolism. When "reality is compared with propositions" (TLP 4.05), it is the form of propositions which determines the shape of reality (and not the other way round). In any case, the issue of realism (vs. anti-realism) in the Tractatus must address the question of the limits of language and the more particular question of what there is (or is not) beyond language. Subsequently, interpreters of the Tractatus have moved on to questioning the very presence of metaphysics within the book and the status of the propositions of the book themselves.
Nonsense has become the hinge of Wittgensteinian interpretative discussion during the last decade of the 20th century. Beyond the bounds of language lies nonsense -- propositions which cannot picture anything -- and Wittgenstein bans traditional metaphysics to that area. The quandary arises concerning the question of what it is that inhabits that realm of nonsense, since Wittgenstein does seem to be saying that there is something there to be shown (rather than said) and does, indeed, characterize it as the mystical. The traditional readings of the Tractatus accepted, with varying degrees of discomfort, the existence of that which is unsayable, that which cannot be put into words, the nonsensical. More recent readings tend to take nonsense more seriously as exactly that -- nonsense. This also entails taking seriously Wittgenstein's words in 6.54 -- his famous ladder metaphor -- and throwing out the Tractatus itself. The Tractatus, on this stance, beyond telling the reader about the ineffable (metaphysics, ethics, aesthetics, logical form, pictorial form, etc.), is a part of the ineffable as well, and should be recognized as such. An accompanying discussion must then also deal with how this can be recognized, what this can possibly mean, and how it should be used, if at all.
This discussion is closely related to what has come to be called the ethical reading of the Tractatus. Such a reading is based, first, on the supposed discrepancy between Wittgenstein's construction of a world-language system, which takes up the bulk of the Tractatus, and several comments that are made about this construction in the Preface to the book, in its closing remarks, and in a letter he sent to his publisher, Ludwig von Ficker, before publication. In these places, all of which can be viewed as external to the content of the Tractatus, Wittgenstein preaches silence as regards anything that is of importance, including the "internal" parts of the book which contain, in his own words, "the final solution of the problems [of philosophy]." It is the importance given to the ineffable that can be viewed as an ethical position. "My work consists of two parts, the one presented here plus all that I have not written. And it is precisely this second part that is the important point. For the ethical gets its limit drawn from the inside, as it were, by my book; ... I've managed in my book to put everything firmly into place by being silent about it .... For now I would recommend you to read the preface and the conclusion, because they contain the most direct expression of the point" (ProtoTractatus, p.16). Obviously, such seemingly contradictory tensions within and about a text -- written by its author -- give rise to interpretative conundrums.
There is another issue often debated by interpreters of Wittgenstein, which arises out of the questions above. This has to do with the continuity between the thought of the early and later Wittgenstein. Again, the "standard" interpretations were originally united in perceiving a clear break between the two distinct stages of Wittgenstein's thought, even when ascertaining some developmental continuity between them. And again, the more recent interpretations challenge this standard, emphasizing that the fundamental therapeutic motivation clearly found in the later Wittgenstein should also be attributed to the early.
In the Preface to PI, Wittgenstein states that his new thoughts would be better understood by contrast with and against the background of his old thoughts, those in the Tractatus; and indeed, most of Part I of PI is essentially critical. Its new insights can be understood as primarily exposing fallacies in the traditional way of thinking about language, truth, thought, intentionality, and, perhaps mainly, philosophy. In this sense, it is conceived of as a therapeutical work, conceiving of philosophy itself as it should be -- as therapy. Part II, focusing on philosophical psychology, perception etc., is not as critical. Rather, it points to new perspectives (which, undoubtedly, are not disconnected from the earlier critique) in addressing specific philosophical issues. It is, therefore, more easily read alongside Wittgenstein's other writings of the later period.
PI begins with a quote from Augustine's Confessions which "give us a particular picture of the essence of human language," based on the idea that "individual words in language name objects," and that "sentences are combinations of such names" (PI 1). This picture of language cannot be relied on as a basis for metaphysical, epistemic or linguistic speculation. Despite its plausibility, this reduction of language to representation cannot do justice to the whole of human language; and even if it is to be considered a picture of only the representative function of human language, it is, as such, a poor picture. Furthermore, this picture of language is at the base of the whole of traditional philosophy, but, for Wittgenstein, it is to be shunned in favor of a new way of looking at both language and philosophy. The Philosophical Investigations proceeds to offer the new way of looking at language, which will yield the view of philosophy as therapy.
Throughout the Philosophical Investigations, Wittgenstein returns, again and again, to the concept of language-games to make clear his lines of thought concerning language. Primitive language-games are scrutinized for the insights they afford on this or that characteristic of language. Thus, the builders' language-game (PI 2), in which a builder and his assistant use exactly four terms (block, pillar, slab, beam), is utilized to illustrate that part of the Augustinian picture of language which might be correct but which is, nevertheless, strictly limited. "Regular" language-games, such as the astonishing list provided in PI 23 (which includes, e.g., reporting an event, speculating about an event, forming and testing a hypothesis, making up a story, reading it, play- acting, singing catches, guessing riddles, making a joke, translating, asking, thanking, and so on), bring out the openness of our possibilities in using language and in describing it.
Some properties of language-games can be noticed in Wittgenstein's several examples and comments. They are, first, a part of a broader context termed by Wittgenstein a form of life (see below). Secondly, the concept of language-games points at the rule-governed character of language. This does not entail strict and definite systems of rules for each and every language-game, but points to the conventional nature of this sort of human activity. Finally, Wittgenstein's choice of game is based on the over-all analogy between language and game, assuming that we have a clearer perception of what games are. Still, just as we cannot give a final, essential definition of game, so we cannot find "what is common to all these activities and what makes them into language or parts of language" (PI 65).
It is here that Wittgenstein's rejection of general explanations, and definitions based on sufficient and necessary conditions, is best pronounced. Instead of these symptoms of the philosopher's "craving for generality", he points to family resemblance as the more suitable analogy for the means of connecting particular uses of the same word. There is no reason to look, as we have done traditionally -- and dogmatically -- for one, essential core in which the meaning of a word is located and which is, therefore, common to all uses of that word. We should, instead, travel with the word's uses through "a complicated network of similarities, overlapping and criss-crossing" (PI 66). Family resemblance also serves to exhibit the lack of boundaries and the distance from exactness that characterize different uses of the same concept. Such boundaries and exactness are the definitive traits of form -- be it Platonic form, Aristotelian form, or the general form of a proposition adumbrated in the Tractatus. It is from such forms that applications of concepts can be deduced, but this is precisely what Wittgenstein now eschews in favor of appeal to similarity of a kind with family resemblance.
Wittgenstein begins his exposition by introducing an example: " ... we get [a] pupil to continue a series (say + 2) beyond 1000 -- and he writes 1000, 1004, 1008, 1012 (PI 185)". What do we do, and what does it mean, when the student, upon being corrected, answers "But I went on in the same way"? Wittgenstein proceeds (mainly in PI 185-243, but also elsewhere) to dismantle the cluster of attendant questions: How do we learn rules? How do we follow them? Wherefrom the standards which decide if a rule is followed correctly? Are they in the mind, along with a mental representation of the rule? Do we appeal to intuition in their application? Are they socially and publicly taught and enforced? In typical Wittgensteinian fashion, the answers are not pursued positively; rather, the very formulation of the questions as legitimate questions with coherent content is put to the test. For indeed, it is both the Platonistic and mentalistic pictures which underlie asking questions of this type, and Wittgenstein is intent on freeing us from their bewitchment. Such liberation involves elimination of the need to posit any sort of external or internal authority beyond the actual applications of the rule.
These considerations lead to PI 201, often considered the climax of the issue: "This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule. The answer was: if everything can be made out to accord with the rule, then it can also be made out to conflict with it. And so there would be neither accord nor conflict." Wittgenstein's formulation of the problem, now at the point of being a "paradox", has given rise to a wealth of interpretation and debate since it is clear to all that this is the crux of the general issue of meaning, and of understanding and using a language. One of the influential readings of the problem of following a rule has been the skeptical interpretation, according to which Wittgenstein is here voicing a skeptical paradox and offering a skeptical solution. This avenue of reading Wittgenstein commits one to a solution which, often enough, is a skeptical solution put in terms of "there is no fact of the matter" determining the right application of the rule. Whether this answer is indeed a skeptical one is also a point at issue. If it identifies the rule and its application, that is, if we proceed to explicate the way we, or the student, do follow the rule -- for instance, by appealing to conventional social behavior -- then such explication is not necessarily skeptical.
Wittgenstein adopts the term grammar in his quest to describe the workings of this public, socially governed language, using it in a somewhat idiosyncratic manner. Grammar, usually taken to consist of the rules of correct syntactic and semantic usage, becomes, in Wittgenstein's hands, the wider -- and more elusive -- network of rules which determine what linguistic move is allowed as making sense, and what isn't. This notion replaces the stricter and purer logic which played such an essential role in the Tractatus in providing a scaffolding for language and the world. Indeed, "Essence is expressed by grammar ... Grammar tells what kind of object anything is. (Theology as grammar)" (PI 371, 373). The "rules" of grammar are not mere technical instructions from on-high for correct usage; rather, they express the norms for meaningful language. Contrary to empirical statements, rules of grammar describe how we use words in order to both justify and criticize our particular utterances. But as opposed to grammar-book rules, they are not idealized as an external system to be conformed to. Moreover, they are not appealed to explicitly in any formulation, but are used in cases of philosophical perplexity to clarify where language misleads us into false illusions. Thus, "I can know what someone else is thinking, not what I am thinking. It is correct to say I know what you are thinking, and wrong to say I know what I am thinking. (A whole cloud of philosophy condensed into a drop of grammar.)" (PI, p.222).
Grammar is not abstract, it is situated within the regular activity with which language-games are interwoven: " ... the term language-game is meant to bring into prominence the fact that the speaking of language is part of an activity, or of a form of life" (PI 23). What enables language to function and therefore must be accepted as "given" is precisely forms of life. In Wittgenstein's terms, agreement is required "not only in definitions but also (queer as this may sound) in judgments" (PI 242), and this is "not agreement in opinions but in form of life" (PI 241). Used by Wittgenstein sparingly -- five times in the Investigations -- this intriguing concept has given rise to interpretative quandaries and subsequent contradictory readings. Forms of life can be understood as changing and contingent, dependent on culture, context, history, etc; this appeal to forms of life grounds a relativistic reading of Wittgenstein. On the other hand, it is the form of life common to humankind, "the common behavior of mankind" which is "the system of reference by means of which we interpret an unknown language" (PI 206). This is clearly a universalistic turn, recognizing that the use of language is made possible by the human form of life. Lest this universalism be taken to an extreme, Wittgenstein reminds the reader that as philosophers " ... we are not doing natural science, nor yet natural history" (PI p.230).
The style of the Investigations is strikingly different from that of the Tractatus. Instead of strictly numbered sections which are organized hierarchically in programmatic order, the Investigations fragmentarily voices aphorisms about language-games, family resemblance, forms of life, "jumping from one topic to another" (PI Preface). This variation in style is of course essential and is "connected with the very nature of the investigation" (PI Preface). As a matter of fact, Wittgenstein was acutely aware of the contrast between the two stages of his thought, advising publication of both texts together in order to make the contrast obvious and clear.
Still, it is precisely via the subject of the nature of philosophy that the fundamental continuity between these two stages, rather than the discrepancy between them, is to be found. In both cases philosophy serves, first, as critique of language. It is through analyzing language's illusive power that the philosopher can expose the traps of meaningless philosophical formulations. This means that what was formerly thought of as a philosophical problem may now dissolve "and this simply means that the philosophical problems should completely disappear" (PI 133). Two implications of this diagnosis, easily traced back in the Tractatus, are to be recognized. One is the inherent dialogical character of philosophy, which is a responsive activity: difficulties and torments are encountered which are then to be dissipated by philosophical therapy. In the Tractatus, this took the shape of advice: "The correct method in philosophy would really be the following: to say nothing except what can be said, i.e. propositions of natural science ... and then whenever someone else wanted to say something metaphysical, to demonstrate to him that he had failed to give a meaning to certain signs in his propositions" (TLP 6.53) The second, more far- reaching, "discovery" in the Investigations "is the one that makes me capable of stopping doing philosophy when I want to" (PI 133). This has been taken to revert back to the ladder metaphor and the injunction to silence in the Tractatus.
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First published: November 8, 2002
Content last modified: November 8, 2002