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Although there are significant continuities throughout his thought, Whitehead's intellectual life is often divided into three periods. The first corresponds roughly with his time at Cambridge, from 1884 to 1910, during which he worked primarily on logic and mathematics. The second corresponds roughly with his time at London, from 1910 to 1924, during which he concentrated mainly on issues in the philosophy of science. The third corresponds roughly with his time at Harvard, from 1924 onward, during which he worked on more general issues in philosophy, including the development of a comprehensive metaphysical system which has come to be known as process philosophy.
Whitehead began his academic career at Trinity College, Cambridge, where, starting in 1885, he taught for twenty-five years. In 1890 Bertrand Russell arrived as a student at Trinity and during the 1890s the two men came into regular contact with one another. According to Russell, "Whitehead was extraordinarily perfect as a teacher"1 and Whitehead soon became something of a mentor to the younger man.
By the early 1900s, both men had completed books on the foundations of mathematics. Whitehead's 1898 A Treatise on Universal Algebra had resulted in his election to the Royal Society. Russell's 1903 The Principles of Mathematics had marked a decisive break from his earlier neo-Kantian work, such as his 1897 An Essay on the Foundations of Geometry. Since the research for a proposed second volume of Russell's Principles overlapped considerably with Whitehead's own research for the proposed second volume of his Universal Algebra, the two men began collaboration on what was eventually to become Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). According to Whitehead, they initially expected the research to take about a year to complete. In the end, they worked together on the project for a full decade.
Logicism, the theory that mathematics is in some important sense reducible to logic, consists of two main theses. The first is that all mathematical truths can be translated into logical truths or, in other words, that the vocabulary of mathematics constitutes a proper subset of that of logic. The second is that all mathematical proofs can be recast as logical proofs or, in other words, that the theorems of mathematics constitute a proper subset of those of logic.
Like Gottlob Frege, Whitehead and Russell took the view that numbers could be identified with sets of sets, and that number-theoretic operations could be explained in terms of set theoretic operations such as intersection, union, and difference. Although Whitehead and Russell were able to provide many detailed derivations of major theorems in set theory, finite and transfinite arithmetic, and elementary measure theory, the issue of whether set theory itself can be said to have been successfully reduced to logic remained controversial.
Following the completion of Principia, Whitehead and Russell began to go their separate ways. Perhaps inevitably, Russell's anti-war activities during World War I (in which Whitehead lost his youngest son) also led to something of a split between the two men. Nevertheless, they remained on relatively good terms for the rest of their lives.
At the University of London, Whitehead turned his attention to issues in the philosophy of science. Of particular note was his rejection of the idea that each object has a simple spatial or temporal location. Instead, Whitehead advocated the view that all objects should be understood as fields having both temporal and spatial extensions. For example, just as we cannot perceive a Euclidean point that has position but no magnitude, or a line that has length but no breadth, it is impossible, says Whitehead, to conceive of a simple spatial or temporal location. To think that we can do so involves what he called "The Fallacy of Misplaced Concreteness," the error of mistaking the abstract for the concrete.2
As Whitehead explains, "I shall argue that among the primary elements of nature as apprehended in our immediate experience, there is no element whatever which possesses this character of simple location. ... [Instead,] I hold that by a process of constructive abstraction we can arrive at abstractions which are the simply-located bits of material, and at other abstractions which are the minds included in the scientific scheme."3
Whitehead's basic idea was that we obtain the abstract idea of a spatial point by considering a real-life series of volumes extending over each other, for example, a nested series of Russian dolls or a nested series of pots and pans. However, it would be a mistake to think of a spatial point as being anything more than an abstraction; instead, real positions involve the entire series of extended volumes. As Whitehead himself puts it, "In a certain sense, everything is everywhere at all times. For every location involves an aspect of itself in every other location. Thus every spatio-temporal standpoint mirrors the world."4
Further, according to Whitehead, every real-life object may be understood as a similarly constructed series of events and processes. It is this latter idea that Whitehead later systematically elaborates in his imposing Process and Reality (1929), going so far as to suggest that process, rather than substance, should be taken as the fundamental metaphysical constituent of the world. Underlying this work was also the basic idea that, if philosophy is to be successful, it must explain the connection between objective, scientific and logical descriptions of the world and the more everyday world of subjective experience.
While at London, Whitehead also became involved in many practical aspects of tertiary education, serving as Dean of the Faculty of Science and holding several other senior administrative posts. Many of the essays in his The Aims of Education and Other Essays (1929) date from this time. It was also during his time in London that Whitehead also published several less well known books, including An Inquiry Concerning the Principles of Natural Knowledge (1919), The Concept of Nature (1920), and The Principle of Relativity (1922).
Upon being offered an appointment at Harvard, Whitehead moved to the United States in 1924. Given his prior training in mathematics and in the physical sciences, it was sometimes joked that the first philosophy lectures he ever attended were those that he delivered at Harvard in his new role as Professor of Philosophy. A year later he also delivered Harvard's prestigious Lowell Lectures which formed the basis for his first primarily metaphysical book, Science and the Modern World (1925). In it he again introduced several themes which later found fuller expression in Process and Reality. The same was true of the 1927/28 Gifford Lectures at the University of Edinburgh on which Process and Reality came to be based.
In Process and Reality, rather than assuming substance as the basic metaphysical category, Whitehead introduces the notion of an actual occasion. On Whitehead's view, an actual occasion is not an enduring substance, but a process of becoming. As Donald Sherburne points out, "It is customary to compare an actual occasion with a Leibnizian monad, with the caveat that whereas a monad is windowless, an actual occasion is all window. It is as though one were to take Aristotle's system of categories and ask what would result if the category of substance were displaced from its preeminence by the category of relation ... ."5 As Whitehead himself explains, his "philosophy of organism is the inversion of Kant's philosophy ... For Kant, the world emerges from the subject; for the philosophy of organism, the subject emerges from the world."6
Significantly, this view runs counter to the more traditional view of material substance: "There persists," says Whitehead, "[a] fixed scientific cosmology which presupposes the ultimate fact of an irreducible brute matter, or material, spread through space in a flux of configurations. In itself such a material is senseless, valueless, purposeless. It just does what it does do, following a fixed routine imposed by external relations which do not spring from the nature of its being. It is this assumption that I call scientific materialism. Also it is an assumption which I shall challenge as being entirely unsuited to the scientific situation at which we have now arrived."7
The assumption of scientific materialism is effective in many contexts, says Whitehead, only because it directs our attention to a certain class of problems that lend themselves to analysis within this framework. However, scientific materialism is less successful when addressing issues of teleology and when trying to develop a comprehensive, intergrated picture of the universe as a whole. According to Whitehead, recognition that the world is organic rather than materialistic is therefore essential, and this change in viewpoint can result as easily from attempts to understand modern physics as from attempts to understand human psychology and teleology. Says Whitehead, "Mathematical physics presumes in the first place an electromagnetic field of activity pervading space and time. The laws which condition this field are nothing else than the conditions observed by the general activity of the flux of the world, as it individualises itself in the events."8
The end result is that Whitehead concludes that "nature is a structure of evolving processes. The reality is the process."9
Whitehead's ultimate attempt to develop a metaphysical unification of space, time, matter, events and teleology has proved to be controversial. In part this may be because of the connections that Whitehead saw between his metaphysics and traditional theism. According to Whitehead, religion is concerned with permanence amid change, and can be found in the ordering we find within nature, something he sometimes called the "primordial nature of God". Thus although not especially influential among contemporary Anglo-American secular philosophers, his metaphysical ideas have had greater influence among many theologians and philosophers of religion.
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First published: May 21, 1996
Content last modified: July 21, 2000