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Whewell is most known today for his massive works on the History and Philosophy of Science. His philosophy of science was attacked by John Stuart Mill in his System of Logic, causing an interesting and fruitful debate between them over the nature of inductive reasoning in science. It is in the context of this debate that Whewell's philosophy was rediscovered in the 20th century by critics of logical positivism. In this entry I will focus on the most important aspects of Whewell's works: his philosophy of science, including his views of induction, confirmation, and necessary truth; his view of the relation between scientific practice, history of science, and philosophy of science; and his moral philosophy. I will spend the most time on his view of induction, as this is the most interesting part of his philosophy as well as the most misinterpreted.
He thus came up to Trinity in 1812 as a "sub-sizar" (scholarship student). In 1814 he won the Chancellor's prize for his epic poem "Boadicea," thus following in the footsteps of his mother, who had published poems in the local papers. Yet he did not neglect the mathematical side of his training; in 1816 he proved his mathematical prowess by placing as both second Wrangler and second Smith's Prize man. The following year he won a college fellowship. He was elected to the Royal Society in 1820, and ordained a priest (as required for Trinity Fellows) in 1825. He took up the Chair in Mineralogy in 1828, and resigned it in 1832. In 1838 Whewell became Professor of Moral Philosophy. Almost immediately after his marriage to Cordelia Marshall on 12 October 1841, he was named Master of Trinity College upon the recommendation of the Prime Minister Robert Peel. He was Vice-Chancellor of the University in 1842 and again in 1855. In 1848 he played a large role in establishing the Natural and Moral Sciences Triposes at the University. His first wife died in 1855, and he remarried Lady Affleck, the sister of his friend Robert Ellis; Lady Affleck died in 1865. Whewell left no descendents when he died, after being thrown from his horse, on 6 March 1866.
Thus far, this discussion of the fundamental ideas may suggest that they are similar to Kant's forms of intuition, and indeed there are some similarities. Because of this, some commentators argue that Whewell's epistemology is a type of Kantianism (see, e.g., Butts, 1973, and Buchdahl, 1991). However, this interpretation ignores several crucial differences between the two views. The ideas of Space and Time do function in Whewell's epistemology as "conditions of experience" (1858a, I, p. 268), similar to Kant's forms of intuition. However, Whewell does not follow Kant in drawing a distinction between the forms of intuition, such as Space and Time, and the categories, or forms of thought, in which Kant includes Cause and Substance. Moreover, Whewell includes as fundamental ideas many which function not as conditions of experience but as conditions for having knowledge within their respective sciences: although it is certainly possible to have knowledge about the world without having a clear idea of Chemical Affinity, we could not have any knowledge of certain chemical processes within it. Unlike Kant, Whewell does not give an exhaustive list of fundamental ideas; indeed, he believes that others will emerge in the course of the development of new sciences. Further, the type of necessity which Whewell claims is derived from the ideas is very different from Kant's notion of the synthetic a priori. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, Whewell rejects Kant's subjectivism regarding the concepts of the understanding. The fundamental ideas, on Whewell's view, reflect objective features of the world, independent of the processes of the mind (I will return to these last two points in the section on Necessary Truth below).
I turn now to a discussion of the theory of induction Whewell develops with his antithetical epistemology. Whewell's first explicit, lengthy discussion of induction is found in his Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences, founded upon their History, which was originally published in 1840 (a second, enlarged edition appeared in 1847, and the third edition appeared as three separate works published between 1858 and 1860). Whewell considers himself to be a follower of Francis Bacon, claiming to be "renovating" Bacon's inductive method; thus one volume of the third edition of the Philosophy is entitled Novum Organon Renovatum. He calls his induction "Discoverers' Induction" and claims that it is used to discover both phenomenal and causal laws. Whewell follows Bacon in rejecting the standard, overly-narrow notion of induction that holds induction to be merely simple enumeration of instances. Rather, Whewell explains that, in induction, "there is a New Element added to the combination [of instances] by the very act of thought by which they were combined" (1847, II, p. 48). This "act of thought" is a process Whewell calls "colligation." Colligation, Whewell explains, is the mental operation of bringing together a number of empirical facts by "superinducing" upon them a conception which unites the facts and renders them capable of being expressed by a general law. The conception thus provides the "true bond of Unity by which the phenomena are held together" (1847, II, p. 46), by providing a property shared by the known members of a class (in the case of causal laws, the colligating property is that of sharing the same cause).
Thus the known points of the Martian orbit were colligated by Kepler using the conception of an elliptical curve. Often new discoveries are made, Whewell points out, not when new facts are discovered but when the appropriate conception is applied to the facts. In the case of Kepler's discovery, the observed points of the orbit were known to Tycho Brahe, but only when Kepler applied the ellipse conception was the true path of the orbit discovered. Kepler was the first one to apply this conception to an orbital path in part because he had, in his mind, a very clear notion of the conception of an ellipse. This is important because the fundamental ideas and conceptions are provided by our minds, but they cannot be used in their innate form. Whewell explains that "the Ideas, the germs of them at least, were in the human mind before [experience]; but by the progress of scientific thought they are unfolded into clearness and distinctness" (1860a, p. 373). Whewell refers to this "unfolding" of ideas and conceptions as the "explication of conceptions." Explication is a necessary precondition to discovery, and it consists in a partly empirical, partly rational process. Scientists first try to clarify and make explicit a conception in their minds, then attempt to apply it to the facts they have precisely examined, to determine whether the conception can colligate the facts into a law. If not, the scientist uses this experience to attempt a further refinement of the conception. Whewell claims that a large part of the history of science is the "history of scientific ideas," that is, the history of their explication and subsequent use as colligating concepts. Thus in the case of Kepler's use of the ellipse conception, Whewell notes that "to supply this conception, required a special preparation, and a special activity in the mind of the discoverer. ... To discover such a connection, the mind must be conversant with certain relations of space, and with certain kinds of figures" (1849, pp. 28-9).
Once conceptions have been explicated, it is possible to choose the appropriate conception with which to colligate phenomena. But how is the appropriate conception chosen? According to Whewell , it is not a matter of guesswork. Nor, importantly, is it merely a matter of observation. Whewell explains that "there is a special process in the mind, in addition to the mere observation of facts, which is necessary" (1849, p. 40). This "special process in the mind" is a process of inference. "We infer more than we see," Whewell claims (1858a, I, p. 46). Typically, finding the appropriate conception with which to colligate a class of phenomena requires a series of inferences, thus Whewell claims that discoverers's induction is a process involving a "train of researches" (1857/1873, I, p. 297). He allows any type of inference in the colligation, including enumerative, eliminative and analogical. Thus Kepler in his Astronomia Nova (1609) can be seen as using various forms of inference to reach the ellipse conception (see Snyder, 1997a). When Augustus DeMorgan complains, in his 1847 logic text, about certain writers using the term "induction" as including "the use of the whole box of [logical] tools," he is undoubtedly referring to his teacher and friend Whewell.
After the known members of a class are colligated with the use of a conception, the second step of Whewell's discoverers' induction occurs: namely, the generalization of the shared property over the complete class, including its unknown members. Often, as Whewell admits, this is a trivially simple procedure. Once Kepler supplied the conception of an ellipse to the observed members of the class of Mars' positions, he generalized it to all members of the class, including those which were unknown (unobserved), to reach the conclusion that "all the points of Mars' orbit lie on an ellipse with the sun at one focus." He then performed a further generalization to reach his first law of planetary motion: "the orbits of all the planets lie on ellipses with the sun at one focus."
I mentioned earlier that Whewell thought of himself as renovating Bacon's inductive philosophy. His inductivism does share numerous features with Bacon's method of interpreting nature: for instance the claims that induction must involve more than merely simple enumeration of instances, that science must be proceed by successive steps of generalization, that inductive science can reach unobservables (for Bacon, the "forms," for Whewell, unobservable entities such as light waves or properties such as elliptical orbits or gravitational forces). (For more on the relation between Whewell and Bacon see Snyder 1999). Yet, surprisingly, the received view of Whewell's methodology in the 20th century has tended to describe Whewell as an anti-inductivist in the Popperian mold (see, for example, Butts 1987, Buchdahl 1991, Laudan, 1980, Niiniluoto 1977, and Ruse 1975). That is, it is claimed that Whewell endorses a "conjectures and refutations" view of scientific discovery. However, it is clear from the above discussion that his view of discoverers' induction does not resemble the view asserting that hypotheses can be and are typically arrived at by mere guesswork. Moreover, Whewell explicitly rejects the hypothetico-deductive claim that hypotheses discovered by non-rational guesswork can be confirmed by consequentialist testing. For example, in his review of his friend Herschel's Preliminary Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy, Whewell argues, against Herschel, that verification is not possible when a hypothesis has been formed non-inductively (1831, pp. 400-1). Nearly thirty years later, in the last edition of the Philosophy, Whewell refers to the belief that "the discovery of laws and causes of phenomena is a loose hap-hazard sort of guessing," and claims that this type of view "appears to me to be a misapprehension of the whole nature of science" (1860a, p. 274). In other mature works he notes that discoveries are made "not by any capricious conjecture of arbitrary selection" (1858a, I, p. 29) and explains that new hypotheses are properly "collected from the facts" (1849, p. 17).
Why has Whewell been misinterpreted by so many commentators? One reason has to do with the error of reading certain terms used by Whewell in the 19th century as if they held the same meaning they have in the 20th and 21st. Thus, since Whewell does at times speak of "conjectures" and "guesses," we are told that he shares Popper's methodology. He speaks, for instance, of the "happy guesses" made by scientists (1858b, p. 64) and claims that "advances in knowledge" often follow "the previous exercise of some boldness and license in guessing" (1847, II, p. 55). But Whewell often uses these terms in a way which connotes a conclusion which is simply not conclusively confirmed. The Oxford English Dictionary tells us that prior to the 20th century the term "conjecture" was used to connote not a hypothesis reached by non-rational means, but rather one which is "unverified," or which is "a conclusion as to what is likely or probable" (as opposed to the results of demonstration). The term is used this way by Bacon, Kepler, Newton, and Dugald Stewart, writers whose work was well-known to Whewell. In other places where Whewell uses the term "conjecture" he suggests that what appears to be the result of guesswork is actually what we might call an "educated guess," i.e., a conclusion drawn by (weak) inference. Whewell describes Kepler's discovery, which seems so "capricious and fanciful" as actually being "regulated" by his "clear scientific ideas" (1857/1873, I, pp. 291-2). Finally Whewell's use of the terminology of guessing sometimes occurs in the context of a distinction he draws between the generation of a number of possible conceptions, and the selection of one to superinduce upon the facts. Before the appropriate conception is found, the scientist must be able to call up in his mind a number of possible ones (see 1858b, p. 79). Whewell notes that this calling up of many possibilities "is, in some measure, a process of conjecture." However, selecting the appropriate conception with which to colligate the data is not conjectural (1858b, p. 78). Thus Whewell claims that the selection of the conception is often "preluded by guesses" (1858b, p. xix); he does not, that is, claim that the selection consists in guesswork. When inference is not used to select the appropriate conception, the resulting theory is not an "induction," but rather a "hasty and imperfect hypothesis." He draws such a distinction between Copernicus' heliocentric theory, which he calls an induction, and the heliocentric system proposed by Aristarchus in the third century b.c., to which he refers as a hasty and imperfect hypothesis (1857/1873, I, p. 258).
Thus Whewell's philosophy of science cannot be described as the hypothetico-deductive view. It is an inductive method; yet it clearly differs from the more narrow inductivism of Mill. Whewell's view of induction has the advantage over Mill's of allowing the inference to unobservable properties and entities (for more on this topic see Snyder 1997a and 1997b).
I start by discussing the criterion of prediction. Our hypotheses ought to foretell phenomena, "at least all phenomena of the same kind," Whewell explains, because "our assent to the hypothesis implies that it is held to be true of all particular instances. That these cases belong to past or to future times, that they have or have not already occurred, makes no difference in the applicability of the rule to them. Because the rule prevails, it includes all cases" (1858b, p. 86). Whewell's point here is simply that since our hypotheses are in universal form, a true hypothesis will cover all particular instances of the rule, including past, present, and future cases. But he also makes the stronger claim that successful predictions of unknown facts provide greater confirmatory value than explanations of already-known facts. Thus he holds the historical claim that "new evidence" is more valuable than "old evidence." He argues that "to predict unknown facts found afterwards to be true is ... a confirmation of a theory which in impressiveness and value goes beyond any explanation of known facts" (1857/1873, II, p. 557). Whewell claims that the agreement of the prediction with what occurs (i.e., the fact that the prediction turns out to be correct), is "nothing strange, if the theory be true, but quite unaccountable, if it be not" (1860a, pp. 273-4). For example, if Newtonian theory were not true, he argues, the fact that from the theory we could correctly predict the existence, location and mass of a new planet, Neptune (as did happen in 1846), would be bewildering, and indeed miraculous.
An even more valuable confirmation criterion, according to Whewell, is that of "consilience." Whewell explains that "the evidence in favour of our induction is of a much higher and more forcible character when it enables us to explain and determine [i.e., predict] cases of a kind different from those which were contemplated in the formation of our hypothesis. The instances in which this have occurred, indeed, impress us with a conviction that the truth of our hypothesis is certain" (1858b, pp. 87-8). Whewell calls this type of evidence a "jumping together" or "consilience" of inductions. An induction, which results from the colligation of one class of facts, is found also to colligate successfully facts belonging to another class. This is especially powerful as confirmation when the second class of phenomena had appeared to be unrelated to the first. For instance, consilience occurred when "the force of Universal Gravitation, which had been inferred from the Perturbations of the moon and planets by the sun and by each other, also accounted for the fact, apparently altogether dissimilar and remote, of the Precession of the equinoxes" (1847, II, p. 66).
Whewell discusses a further, related test of a theory's truth: namely, "coherence." In the case of true theories, Whewell claims, "the system becomes more coherent as it is further extended. The elements which we require for explaining a new class of facts are already contained in our system....In false theories, the contrary is the case" (1858b, p. 91). Coherence occurs when we are able to extend our hypothesis to colligate a new class of phenomena without ad hoc modification of the hypothesis. When Newton extended his theory regarding an inverse-square attractive force, which colligated facts of planetary motion and lunar motion, to the class of "tidal activity," he did not need to add any new suppositions to the theory in order to colligate correctly the facts about particular tides. On the other hand, Whewell claims, when phlogiston theory, which colligated facts about the class of phenomena "chemical combination," was extended to colligate the class of phenomena "weight of bodies," it was unable to do so without an ad hoc and implausible modification (namely, the assumption that phlogiston has "negative weight") (see 1858b, pp. 92-3). Thus coherence can be seen as a type of consilience that happens over time; indeed, Whewell remarks that these two criteria--consilience and coherence--"are, in fact, hardly different" (1858b, p. 95).
Once the Ideas and conceptions are explicated, so that we understand their meanings, the necessary truths which follow from them are seen as being necessarily true. Thus, once the Idea of Space is explicated, it is seen to be necessarily true that "two straight lines cannot enclose a space." Whewell suggests that the first law of motion is also a necessary truth, which was knowable a priori once the idea of Cause and the associated conception of force were explicated. This is why empirical science is needed to see necessary truths—because, as we saw above, empirical science is needed in order to explicate the ideas. Thus Whewell also claims that, in the course of science, truths which at first required experiment to be known are seen to be capable of being known independently of experiment. That is, once the idea is clarified, the necessary connection between the idea and an empirical truth becomes apparent. Whewell claims that "though the discovery of the First Law of Motion was made, historically speaking, by means of experiment, we have now attained a point of view in which we see that it might have been certainly known to be true independently of experience" (1847, I, p. 221). Science, then, consists in the "idealization of facts," the transferring of truths from the empirical to the ideal side of the fundamental antithesis. He describes this by noting that there is a "progressive intuition of necessary truths."
Although they follow analytically from the meanings of ideas our minds supply, necessary truths are nevertheless informative statements about the physical world outside us; they have empirical content. Whewell's justification for this claim is a theological one. Whewell notes that God created the universe in accordance with certain "Divine Ideas." That is, all objects and events in the world were created by God to conform to certain of his ideas. For example, God made the world such that it corresponds to the idea of Cause partially expressed by the axiom "every event has a cause." Hence in the universe every event conforms to this idea, not only by having a cause but by being such that it could not occur without a cause. On Whewell's view, we are able to have knowledge of the world because the fundamental ideas which are used to organize our sciences resemble the ideas used by God in his creation of the physical world. The fact that this is so is no coincidence: God has created our minds such that they contain these same ideas. That is, God has given us our ideas so that "they can and must agree with the world" (1860a, p. 359). God intends that we can have knowledge of the physical world, and this is possible only through the use of ideas which resemble those that were used in creating the world. Hence with our ideas we can colligate correctly the facts of the world and form true theories. And when these ideas are distinct, we can know a priori the axioms which express their meaning.
An interesting consequence of this interpretation of Whewell's view of necessity is that every law of nature is a necessary truth, in virtue of following analytically from some idea used by God in creating the world. Whewell draws no distinction between truths which can be idealized and those which cannot; thus, potentially, any empirical truth can be seen to be a necessary truth, once the ideas and conceptions are explicated sufficiently. For example, Whewell suggests that experiential truths such as "salt is soluble" may be necessary truths, even if we do not recognize this necessity (i.e., even if it is not yet knowable a priori): (1860b, p. 483). Whewell's view thus destroys the line traditionally drawn between laws of nature and the axiomatic propositions of the pure sciences of mathematics; mathematical truth is granted no special status.
Whewell thus suggests a view of scientific understanding which is, not surprisingly, grounded in his conception of natural theology. Since our ideas are "shadows" of the Divine Ideas, to see a law as a necessary consequence of our ideas is to see it as a consequence of the Divine Ideas exemplified in the world. Understanding involves seeing a law as being not an arbitrary "accident on the cosmic scale," but as a necessary consequence of the ideas God used in creating the universe. Hence the more we idealize the facts, the more difficult it will be to deny God's existence. We will come to see more and more truths as the intelligible result of intentional design. This view is related to the claim Whewell makes in his Bridgewater Treatise (1833), that the more we study the laws of nature the more convinced we will be in the existence of a Divine Law-giver
So how is this important for his work on the philosophy of science? Some commentators have claimed that Whewell developed an a priori philosophy of science and then shaped his History to conform to his own view (see Stoll 1929 and Strong 1955). It is true that he starts out, from his undergraduate days, with the project of reforming the inductive philosophy of Bacon; indeed this early inductivism leads him to the view that learning about scientific method must be inductive (i.e., that it requires the study of the history of science). Yet he also refuses to complete his Philosophy before he has written the History; he even sends proof-sheets of the History to his many scientist-friends to ensure the accuracy of his account. Ultimately, he criticizes Mill's view of induction developed in the System of Logic on the grounds that Mill has not found a large number of appropriate examples illustrating the use of his "Methods of Experimental Inquiry." Thus it appears that what is important to Whewell is not whether a philosophy of science is, in fact, inferred from a study of the history of science, but rather, whether a philosophy of science is inferable from it. That is, regardless of how a philosopher came to invent her theory, she must be able to show it to be exemplified in the actual scientific practice used throughout history.
The second central aspect of intuitionism is the claim that moral rules are necessary truths which are self-evident. This is often taken, as it is by Mill, to lead to the conclusion that there can be no progress in morality—what is self-evident must always remain so—and thus to the further conclusion that the intuitionist considers the current rules of society to be necessary truths. Such a view would tend to support the status quo, as Mill rightly complains. (Thus he accuses Whewell of justifying evil practices such as slavery, forced marriages, and cruelty to animals.) But Mill is wrong to attribute such a view to Whewell. Whewell does claim that moral rules are necessary truths, and invests them with the epistemological status of self-evident "axioms" (see 1864, p. 58). However, as noted above, Whewell's view of necessary truth is a progressive one. The realm of morality, like the realm of physical science, is structured by certain Fundamental Ideas: Benevolence, Justice, Truth, Purity, and Order (see 1852, p. xxiii). These moral ideas are conditions of our moral experience; they enable us to perceive actions as being in accordance with the demands of morality. Like the ideas of the physical sciences, the ideas of morality must be explicated before the moral rules can be derived from them (see 1860a, p. 388). There is a progressive intuition of necessary truth in morality as well as in science. Hence it does not follow that because the moral truths are axiomatic and self-evident that we currently know them (see 1846, pp. 38-9). Whewell thus claims that "to test self-evidence by the casual opinion of individual men, is a self-contradiction" (1846, p. 35). Nevertheless, Whewell does claim that we can look to the dictates of positive law of the most morally advanced societies as a starting point in our explication of the moral ideas. But he is not therefore suggesting that these laws are the standard of morality. Just as we examine the phenomena of the physical world in order to explicate our scientific conceptions, we can examine the facts of positive law and the history of moral philosophy in order to explicate our moral conceptions. Mill is therefore wrong to interpret Whewell's moral philosophy as a justification of the status quo or as constituting a "vicious circle." Rather, Whewell's view shares some features of Rawls's later use of the notion of "reflective equilibrium."
During his lifetime Whewell published approximately 150 books, articles, scientific papers, society reports, reviews, and translations. In the list which follows I mention only his most important philosophical works. More complete bibliographies can be found in Yeo (1993) and Fisch and Schaffer (1991).
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First published: December 23, 2000
Content last modified: December 23, 2000