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According to some early versions of the coherence theory, the coherence relation is simply consistency. On this view, to say that a proposition coheres with a specified set of propositions is to say that the proposition is consistent with the set. This account of coherence is unsatisfactory for the following reason. Consider two propositions which do not belong to a specified set. These propositions could both be consistent with a specified set and yet be inconsistent with each other. If coherence is consistency, the coherence theorist would have to claim that both propositions are true, but this is impossible.
A more plausible version of the coherence theory states that the coherence relation is some form of entailment. Entailment can be understood here as strict logical entailment, or entailment in some looser sense. According to this version, a proposition coheres with a set of propositions if and only if it is entailed by members of the set.
The second point on which coherence theorists (coherentists, for short) differ is the constitution of the specified set of propositions. Coherentists generally agree that the specified set consists of propositions believed or held to be true. They differ on the questions of who believes the propositions and when. At one extreme, coherence theorists can hold that the specified set of propositions is the largest consistent set of propositions currently believed by actual people. For such a version of the theory, see Young (1995). According to a moderate position, the specified set consists of those propositions which will be believed when people like us (with finite cognitive capacities) have reached some limit of inquiry. For such a coherence theory, see Putnam (1981). At the other extreme, coherence theorists can maintain that the specified set contains the propositions which would be believed by an omniscient being. Some idealists seem to accept this account of the specified set.
If the specified set is a set actually believed, or even a set which would be believed by people like us at some limit of inquiry, coherentism involves the rejection of realism about truth. Realism about truth involves acceptance of the principle of bivalence (according to which every proposition is either true or false) and the principle of transcendence (which says that a proposition may be true even though it cannot be known to be true). Coherentists who do not believe that the specified set is the set of propositions believed by an omniscient being are committed to rejection of the principle of bivalence since it is not the case that for every proposition either it or a contrary proposition coheres with the specified set. They reject the principle of transcendence since, if a proposition coheres with a set of beliefs, it can be known to cohere with the set.
The Metaphysical Route to Coherentism
Early versions of the coherence theory were associated with idealism. Walker (1989) attributes coherentism to Spinoza, Kant, Fichte and Hegel. Certainly a coherence theory was adopted by a number of British Idealists in the last years of the nineteenth century and the first decades of the twentieth. See, for example, H.H. Joachim (1906).
Idealists are led to a coherence theory of truth by their metaphysical position. Advocates of the correspondence theory believe that a belief is (at least most of the time) ontologically distinct from the objective conditions which make the belief true. Idealists do not believe that there is an ontological distinction between beliefs and what makes beliefs true. From the idealists' perspective, reality is something like a collection of beliefs. Consequently, a belief cannot be true because it corresponds to something which is not a belief. Instead, the truth of a belief can only consist in its coherence with other beliefs. A coherence theory of truth which results from idealism usually leads to the view that truth comes in degrees. A belief is true to the degree that it coheres with other beliefs.
In recent years metaphysical arguments for coherentism have found few advocates. This is due to the fact that idealism is not widely held.
Epistemological Routes to Coherentism
Blanshard (1939, ch. XXVI) argues that a coherence theory of justification leads to a coherence theory of truth. His argument runs as follows. Someone might hold that coherence with a set of beliefs is the test of truth but that truth consists in correspondence to objective facts. If, however, truth consists in correspondence to objective facts, coherence with a set of beliefs will not be a test of truth. This is the case since there is no guarantee that a perfectly coherent set of beliefs matches objective reality. Since coherence with a set of beliefs is a test of truth, truth cannot consist in correspondence.
Blanshard's argument has been criticised by, for example, Rescher (1973). Blanshard's argument depends on the claim that coherence with a set of beliefs is the test of truth. Understood in one sense, this claim is plausible enough. Blanshard, however, has to understand this claim in a very strong sense: coherence with a set of beliefs is an infallible test of truth. If coherence with a set of beliefs is simply a good but fallible test of truth, as Rescher suggests, the argument fails. The "falling apart" of truth and justification to which Blanshard refers is to be expected if truth is only a fallible test of truth.
Another epistemological argument for coherentism is based on the view that we cannot "get outside" our set of beliefs and compare propositions to objective facts. A version of this argument was advanced by some logical positivists including Hempel (1935) and Neurath (1983). This argument, like Blanshard's, depends on a coherence theory of justification. The argument infers from such a theory that we can only know that a proposition coheres with a set of beliefs. We can never know that a proposition corresponds to reality.
This argument is subject to at least two criticisms. For a start, it depends on a coherence theory of justification, and is vulnerable to any objections to this theory. More importantly, a coherence theory of truth does not follow from the premisses. We cannot infer from the fact that a proposition cannot be known to correspond to reality that it does not correspond to reality. Even if correspondence theorists admit that we can only know which propositions cohere with our beliefs, they can still hold that truth consists in correspondence. If correspondence theorists adopt this position, they accept that there may be truths which cannot be known. Alternatively, they can argue, as does Davidson (1986), that the coherence of a proposition with a set of beliefs is a good indication that the proposition corresponds to objective facts and that we can know that propositions correspond.
Coherence theorists need to argue that propositions cannot correspond to objective facts, not merely that they cannot be known to correspond. In order to do this, the foregoing argument for coherentism must be supplemented. One way to supplement the argument would be to argue as follows. As noted above, the correspondence and coherence theories have differing views about the nature of truth conditions. One way to decide which account of truth conditions is correct is to pay attention to the process by which propositions are assigned truth conditions. Coherence theorists can argue that the truth conditions of a proposition are the conditions under which speakers make a practice of asserting it. Coherentists can then maintain that speakers can only make a practice of asserting a proposition under conditions the speakers are able to recognise as justifying the proposition. Now the (supposed) inability of speakers to "get outside" of their beliefs is significant. Coherentists can argue that the only conditions speakers can recognise as justifying a proposition are the conditions under which it coheres with their beliefs. When the speakers make a practice of asserting the proposition under these conditions, they become the proposition's truth conditions. For an argument of this sort see Young (1995).
The Specification Objection
According to the specification objection, coherence theorists have no way to identify the specified set of propositions without contradicting their position. This objection originates in Russell (1907). Opponents of the coherence theory can argue as follows. The proposition (1) Jane Austen was hanged for murder coheres with some set of propositions. (2) Jane Austen died in her bed coheres with another set of propositions. No one supposes that the first of these propositions is true, in spite of the fact that it coheres with a set of propositions. The specification objection charges that coherence theorists have no grounds for saying that (1) is false and (2) true.
Some responses to the specification problem are unsuccessful. One could say that we have grounds for saying that (1) is false and (2) is true because the latter coheres with propositions which correspond to the facts. Coherentists cannot, however, adopt this response without contradicting their position. Sometimes coherence theorists maintain that the specified system is the most comprehensive system, but this is not the basis of a successful response to the specification problem. Coherentists can only, unless they are to compromise their position, define comprehensiveness in terms of the size of a system. Coherentists cannot, for example, talk about the most comprehensive system composed of propositions which correspond to reality. There is no reason, however, why there cannot be two or more equally large systems. Other criteria of the specified system, to which coherentists frequently appeal, are similarly unable to solve the specification problem. These criteria include simplicity, empirical adequacy and others. Again, there seems to be no reason why two or more systems cannot equally meet these criteria.
Although some responses to the Russell's version of the specification objection are unsuccessful, it is unable to refute the coherence theory. Coherentists do not believe that the truth of a proposition consists in coherence with any arbitrarily chosen set of propositions. Rather, they hold that truth consists in coherence with a set of beliefs, or with a set of propositions held to be true. No one actually believes the set of propositions with which (1) coheres. Coherence theorists conclude that they can hold that (1) is false without contradicting themselves.
A more sophisticated version of the specification objection has recently been advanced by Walker (1989); for a discussion, see Wright (1995). Walker argues as follows. In responding to Russell's version of the specification objection, coherentists claim that some set of propositions, call it S, is believed. They are committed to the truth of (3) S is believed. The question of what it is for (3) to be true then arises. Coherence theorists might answer this question by saying that "S is believed is believed" is true. If they give this answer, they are apparently off on an infinite regress, and they will never say what it is for a proposition to be true. Their plight is worsened by the fact that arbitrarily chosen sets of propositions can include propositions about what is believed. So, for example, there will be a set which contains Jane Austen was hanged for murder, "Jane Austen was hanged for murder is believed," and so on. The only way to stop the regress seems to be to say that the truth conditions of (3) consist in the fact S is believed. If, however, coherence theorists adopt this position, they seem to contradict their own position by accepting that the truth conditions of some proposition consist in facts, not in propositions in a set of beliefs.
There is some doubt about whether Walker's version of the specification objection succeeds. Coherence theorists can reply to Walker by saying that nothing in their position is inconsistent with the view that there is a fact about which set of propositions is believed. Even though this fact obtains, however, the truth conditions of propositions, including propositions about which sets of propositions are believed, are the conditions under which they cohere with a set of propositions. For a defence of the coherence theory again Walker's version of the specification objection, see Young (2001).
A coherence theory of truth gives rise to a regress, but it is not a vicious regress and the correspondence theory faces a similar regress. If we say that p is true if and only if it coheres with a specified set of propositions, we may be asked about the truth conditions of p coheres with a specified set. Plainly, this is the start of a regress, but not one to worry about. It is just what one would expect, given that the coherence theory states that it gives an account of the truth conditions of all propositions. The correspondence theory faces a similar benign regress. The correspondence theory states that a proposition is true if and only if it corresponds to certain objective conditions. The proposition p corresponds to certain objective conditions is also true if and only if it corresponds to certain objective conditions, and so on.
The Transcendence Objection
The transcendence objection charges that a coherence theory of truth is unable to account for the fact that some propositions are true which cohere with no set of beliefs. According to this objection, truth transcends any set of beliefs. Someone might argue, for example, that the proposition Jane Austen wrote ten sentences on November 17th, 1807 is either true or false. If it is false, some other proposition about how many sentences Austen wrote that day is true. No proposition, however, about precisely how many sentences Austen wrote coheres with any set of beliefs and we may safely assume that none will ever cohere with a set of beliefs. Opponents of the coherence theory will conclude that there is at least one true proposition which does not cohere with any set of beliefs.
Some versions of the coherence theory are immune to the transcendence objection. A version which holds that truth is coherence with the beliefs of an omniscient being is proof against the objection. Every truth coheres with the set of beliefs of an omniscient being. All other versions of the theory, however, have to cope with the objection, including the view that truth is coherence with a set of propositions believed at the limit of inquiry. Even at the limit of inquiry, finite creatures will not be able to decide every question, and truth may transcend what coheres with their beliefs.
Coherence theorists can defend their position against the transcendence objection by maintaining that the objection begs the question. Those who present the objection assume, generally without argument, that it is possible that some proposition be true even though it does not cohere with any set of beliefs. This is precisely what coherence theorists deny. Coherence theorists have arguments for believing that truth cannot transcend what coheres with some set of beliefs. Their opponents need to take issue with these arguments rather than simply assert that truth can transcend what coheres with a specified system.
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First published: September 3, 1996
Content last modified: May 31, 2001