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The square of opposition is a group of theses embodied in a diagram. The diagram is not essential to the theses; it is just a useful way to keep them straight. The theses concern logical relations among four logical forms:
|A||Every S is P||Universal Affirmative|
|E||No S is P||Universal Negative|
|I||Some S is P||Particular Affirmative|
|O||Some S is not P||Particular Negative|
The theses embodied in this diagram I call SQUARE. They are:
|[SQUARE] =df SQUARE + "the E and I forms convert simply"|
|A proposition converts simply iff it is necessarily equivalent in truth value to the proposition you get by interchanging its terms.|
So [SQUARE] includes the relations illustrated in the diagram plus the view that No S is P is equivalent to No P is S, and the view that Some S is P is equivalent to Some P is S.
The Modern Revision of the Square
Most contemporary logic texts symbolize the traditional forms as follows:
|Every S is P||(x)(Sx Px)|
|No S is P||(x)(Sx -Px)|
|Some S is P||(x)(Sx & Px)|
|Some S is not P||(x)(Sx & -Px)|
If this symbolization is adopted along with standard views about the logic of connectives and quantifiers, the relations embodied in the traditional square mostly disappear. The modern diagram looks like this:
THE MODERN REVISED SQUARE:
This has too little structure to be particularly useful, and so it is not commonly used. According to Alonzo Church, this modern view probably originated sometime in the late nineteenth century. This representation of the four forms is now generally accepted, except for qualms about the loss of subalternation in the left-hand column. Most English speakers tend to understand Every S is P as requiring for its truth that there be some S's, and if that requirement is imposed, then subalternation holds for affirmative propositions. Every modern logic text must address the apparent implausibility of letting Every S is P be true when there are no S's. The common defense of this is usually that this is a logical notation devised for purposes of logic, and it does not claim to capture every nuance of the natural language forms that the symbols resemble. So perhaps (x)(Sx Px) does fail to do complete justice to ordinary usage of Every S is P, but this is not a problem with the logic. If you think that Every S is P requires for its truth that there be S's, then you can have that result simply and easily: just represent the recalcitrant uses of Every S is P in symbolic notation by adding an extra conjunct to the symbolization, like this: (x)(Sx Px) & (x) Sx.
This defense leaves logic intact and also meets the objection, which is not a logical objection, but merely a reservation about the representation of natural language.
Authors typically go on to explain that we often wish to make generalizations in science when we are unsure of whether or not they have instances, and sometimes even when we know they do not, and they sometimes use this as a defense of symbolizing the A form so as to allow it to be vacuously true. This is, however, an argument from convenience of notation, and does not bear on logical coherence.
The Argument Against the Traditional Square
Why does the traditional square need revising at all? The argument is a simple one:
Suppose that S is an empty term; it is true of nothing. Then the I form: Some S is P is false. But then its contradictory E form: No S is P must be true. But then the subaltern O form: Some S is not P must be true. But that is wrong, since there aren't any S's.The puzzle about this argument is why the doctrine of the traditional square was maintained for well over 20 centuries in the face of this consideration. Were 20 centuries of logicians so obtuse as not to have noticed this apparently fatal flaw? Or is there some other explanation?
One possibility is that logicians previous to the 20th century must have thought that no terms are empty. You see this view referred to frequently as one that others held. But with a few very special exceptions (discussed below) I have been unable to find anyone who held such a view before the nineteenth century. Many authors do not discuss empty terms, but those who do typically take their presence for granted. Explicitly rejecting empty terms was never a mainstream option, even in the nineteenth century.
In fact, the traditional doctrine of [SQUARE] is completely coherent in the presence of empty terms. This is because on the traditional interpretation, the O form lacks existential import. The O form is (vacuously) true if its subject term is empty, not false, and thus the logical interrelations of [SQUARE] are unobjectionable. In what follows, I trace the development of this view.
"I call an affirmation and a negation contradictory opposites when what one signifies universally the other signifies not universally, e.g. every man is white -- not every man is white, no man is white -- some man is white. But I call the universal affirmation and the universal negation contrary opposites, e.g. every man is just -- no man is just. So these cannot be true together, but their opposites may both be true with respect to the same thing, e.g. not every man is white -- some man is white."This gives us the following fragment of the square:
But the rest is there by implication. For example, there is enough to show that I and O are subcontraries: they cannot both be false. For suppose that I is false. Then its contradictory, E, is true. So E's contrary, A, is false. So A's contradictory, O, is true. This refutes the possibility that I and O are both false, and thus fills in the bottom relation of subcontraries. Subalternation also follows. Suppose that the A form is true. Then its contrary E form must be false. But then the E form's contradictory, I, must be true. Thus if the A form is true, so must be the I form. A parallel argument establishes subalternation from I to O as well. The result is SQUARE.
In Prior Analytics I.2, 25a.1-25 we get the additional claims that the E and I propositions convert simply. Putting this together with the doctrine of De Interpretatione we have the full [SQUARE].
The diagram accompanying and illustrating the doctrine shows up already in the second century A.D. Boethius incorporated it into his writing, and it passed down through the dark ages to the high medieval period, and from thence to today. Diagrams of this sort were popular among late classical and medieval authors, who used them for a variety of purposes. (Similar diagrams for modal propositions were especially popular.)
Aristotle's Formulation of the O Form
Ackrill's translation contains something a bit remarkable: Aristotle's articulation of the O form is not the familiar Some S is not P or one of its variants; it is rather Not every S is P. With this wording, Aristotle's doctrine automatically escapes the modern criticism. (This holds for his views throughout De Interpretatione.) For assume again that S is an empty term, and suppose that this makes the I form Some S is P false. Its contradictory, the E form: No S is P, is thus true, and this entails the O form in Aristotle's formulation: Not every S is P, which must therefore be true. When the O form was worded Some S is not P this bothered us, but with it worded Not every S is P it seems plainly right. Recall that we are granting that Every S is P has existential import, and so if S is empty the A form must be false. But then Not every S is P should be true, as Aristotle's square requires.
On this view affirmatives have existential import, and negatives do not -- a point that became elevated to a general principle in late medieval times. The ancients thus did not see the incoherence of the square as formulated by Aristotle because there was no incoherence to see.
The Rewording of the O Form
Aristotle's work was made available to the Latin west principally via Boethius's translations and commentaries, written a bit after 500 AD. In his translation of De interpretatione, Boethius preserves Aristotle's wording of the O form as "Not every man is white." But when Boethius comments on this text he illustrates Aristotle's doctrine with the now-famous diagram, and he uses the wording Some man is not just. So this must have seemed to him to be a natural equivalent in Latin. It looks odd to us in English, but he wasn't bothered by it.
Early in the twelfth century Abelard objected to Boethius's rewording of the O form, but Abelard's writing was not widely influential, and except for him and some of his followers people regularly used Some S is not P for the O form in the diagram that represents the square. Did they allow the O form to be vacuously true? Perhaps we can get some clues to how medieval writers interpreted these forms by looking at other doctrines they endorsed. These are the theory of the syllogism and the doctrines of contraposition and obversion.
|Every B is C|
|Every A is B|
|So, some A is C|
Every man is a beingto the falsehood:
Every non-being is a non-man(which is false because the universal affirmative has existential import, and there are no non-beings). And in the particular case it leads from the truth (remember that the O form has no existential import):
A chimera is not a man.to the falsehood:
A non-man is not a non-chimera.These are Buridan's examples, used in the fourteenth century to show the invalidity of contraposition. Unfortunately, by Buridan's time the principle of contraposition had been advocated by a number of authors. The doctrine is already present in several twelfth century tracts, and it is endorsed in the thirteenth century by Peter of Spain, whose work was republished for centuries. William of Sherwood gives a counterexample to it, but then states confusingly that it holds in "every other case." By the fourteenth century, problems associated with contraposition seem to be well-known, and authors generally cite the principle and note that it is not valid, but that it becomes valid with an additional assumption of existence of things falling under the subject term. For example, Paul of Venice in his eclectic and widely published Logica Parva from the end of the fourteenth century gives the traditional square with simple conversion but rejects conversion by contraposition, essentially for Buridan's reason.
A similar thing happened with the principle of obversion. This is the principle that states that you can change a proposition from affirmative to negative, or vice versa, if you change the predicate term from finite to infinite (or infinite to finite). Some examples are:
|Every S is P||=||No S is non-P|
|No S is P||=||Every S is non-P|
|Some S is P||=||Some S is not non-P|
|Some S is not P||=||Some S is non-P|
Aristotle discussed some instances of obversion in De Interpretatione. It is apparent, given the truth conditions for the forms, that these inferences are valid when moving from affirmative to negative, but not in the reverse direction when the terms may be empty, as Buridan makes clear. Some medieval writers before Buridan accepted the fallacious versions, and some did not.
Some man who is a donkey is not a donkey.So by the end of the 14th century the problem of empty terms was clearly recognized. They were permitted in the theory, the O form definitely did not have existential import, and the logical theory, stripped of the incorrect special cases of contraposition and obversion, was coherent and immune to 20th century criticism.
What is different from being is not.
Some thing willed against by a chimera is not willed against by a chimera.
A chimera does not exist.
Some man whom a donkey has begotten is not his son.
Work on logic continued for the next couple of centuries, though most of it was lost and had little influence. But the topic of empty terms was squarely faced, and all solutions that were given within the Medieval tradition were consistent with [SQUARE]. I rely here on Ashworth 1974, 201-02, who reports the most common themes in the context of post-medieval discussions of contraposition. One theme is that contraposition is invalid when applied to universal or empty terms, for the sorts of reasons given by Buridan. The O form is explicitly held to lack existential import. A second theme, which Ashworth says was the most usual thing to say, is also found in Buridan: additional inferences, such as contraposition, become valid when supplemented by an additional premise asserting that the terms in question are non-empty.
There is one odd view that occurs at least twice, which may have as a consequence that there are no empty terms. In the thirteenth century, Lambert of Auxerre proposed that a term such as chimera which stands for no existing thing must "revert to nonexistent things". So if we suppose that there no roses exist, then the term rose stands for nonexistent things. A related view also occurs much later; Ashworth reports that Menghus Blanchellus Faventinus held that term negations such as nonman are true of non-beings, and he concluded from this that A nonman is a chimera is true (apparently assuming that chimera is also true of nonbeings). However, neither of these views seems to have been clearly developed, and neither was widely adopted (or even widely discussed). Nor is it even clear that either of them is supposed to have the consequence that there are no empty terms.
Modern, Renaissance, and Nineteenth Centuries
According to Ashworth, serious and sophisticated investigation of logic ended at about the third decade of the sixteenth century. The Port Royal Logic of the following (seventeenth) century seems typical in its approach: its authors frequently suggest that logic is trivial and unimportant. Its doctrine includes that of the square of opposition, but the discussion of the O form is so vague that nobody could pin down its exact truth conditions, and there is certainly no awareness indicated of problems of existential import. This seems to typify popular texts for the next while. In the nineteenth century, the apparently most widely used textbook in Britain and America was Whately's Elements of Logic. Whately gives the traditional doctrine of the square, without any discussion of issues of existential import or of empty terms. He includes the problematic principles of contraposition (which he calls "conversion by negation"):
|Every S is P||=||Every not-P is not-S|
|No S is P||=||No not-P is not-S|
He also endorses obversion:
In the twentieth century Lukasiewicz also developed a version of syllogistic that depends explicitly on the absence of empty terms; he attributed the system to Aristotle, thus helping to foster the tradition according to which the ancients were unaware of empty terms.
Today, logic texts divide between those based on contemporary logic and those from the Aristotelian tradition or the nineteenth century tradition, but even many texts that teach syllogistic teach it with the forms interpreted in the modern way, so that e.g. subalternation is lost. So the traditional square, as traditionally interpreted, is now mostly abandoned.
|Contradictories:||The A and O forms entail each other's negations, as do the E and I forms. The negation of the A form entails the (unnegated) O form, and vice versa; likewise for the E and I forms.|
|Contraries: .||The A and E forms entail each other's negations|
|Subcontraries:||The negation of the I form entails the (unnegated) E form, and vice versa.|
|Subalternation:||The A form entails the I form, and the E form entails the O form.|
|Converses:||The E and I forms each entail their own converses.|
|Contraposition:||The A and O forms each entail their own contrapositives.|
|Obverses:||Each form entails its own obverse.|
These doctrines are not, however, the doctrines of [SQUARE]. The doctrines of [SQUARE] are worded entirely in terms of the possibilities of truth values, not in terms of entailment. So "entailment" is irrelevant to [SQUARE]. It turns out that Strawson's revision of truth conditions does preserve the principles of SQUARE (these can easily be checked by cases), but not the additional conversion principles of [SQUARE], and also not the traditional principles of contraposition or obversion. For example, Strawson's reinterpreted version of conversion holds for the I form because any I form proposition entails its own converse: if Some A is B and Some B is A both have truth value, then neither has an empty subject term, and so if neither lack truth value and if either is true the other will be true as well. But the original doctrine of conversion says that an I form and its converse always have the same truth value, and that is false on Strawson's account; if there are A's but no B's, then Some A is B is false and Some B is A has no truth value at all. Similar results follow for contraposition and obversion.
The "traditional logic" that Strawson discusses is much closer to that of nineteenth century logic texts than it is to the version that held sway for two millennia before that. But even though he literally salvages a version of nineteenth century logic, the view he saves is unable to serve the purposes for which logical principles are formulated, as was pointed out by Timothy Smiley in a short note in Mind in 1967. People have always taken the square to embody principles by which one can reason, and by which one can construct extended chains of reasoning. But if you string together Strawson's entailments you can infer falsehoods from truths, something that nobody in any tradition would consider legitimate. For example, begin with this truth (the subject term is non-empty):
No man is a chimera.By conversion, we get:
No chimera is a man.By obversion:
Every chimera is a non-man.By subalternation:
Some chimera is a non-man.By conversion:
Some non-man is a chimera.Since there are non-men, the conclusion is not truth-valueless, and since there are no chimeras it is false. Thus we have passed from a true claim to a false one. (The example does not even involve the problematic O form.) All steps are validated by Strawson's doctrine. So Strawson reaches his goal of preserving certain patterns commonly identified as constituting traditional logic, but at the cost of sacrificing the application of logic to extended reasoning.
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First published: August 8, 1997
Content last modified: March 11, 1999