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The concept of species plays an important role both in and outside of biology. Within biology, species are the fundamental units of biological classification. Species are also units of evolution — groups of organisms that evolve in a unified way. Outside of biology, the concept of species plays a role in debates over environmental law and ecological preservation. Our conception of species even affects our understanding of human nature. From a biological perspective, humans are the species Homo sapiens.
This entry discusses three philosophical issues concerning species. The first issue is their ontological status. Are species natural kinds, individuals, or sets? The second issue concerns species pluralism. Monists argue that biologists should attempt to find the correct definition of "species." Pluralists disagree. They argue that there is no single correct definition of "species" but a plurality of equally correct definitions. The third issue concerns the reality of species. Does the term "species" refer to a real category in nature? Or, as some philosophers and biologists argue, is the term "species" a theoretically empty designation?
Kind essentialism has a number of tenets. One tenet is that all and only the members of a kind have a common essence. A second tenet is that the essence of a kind is responsible for the traits typically associated with the members of that kind. For example, gold's atomic structure is responsible for gold's disposition to melt at certain temperatures. Third, knowing a kind's essence helps us explain and predict those properties typically associated with a kind. The application of any of these tenets to species is problematic. But to see the failure of essentialism we need only consider the first tenet.
Biologists have had a hard time finding biological traits that occur in all and only the members of a species. Even such pre Darwinian essentialists as Linnaeus could not locate the essences of species (Ereshefsky 2001). Evolutionary theory explains why. A number of forces conspire against the universality and uniqueness of a trait in a species (Hull 1965). Suppose a genetically based trait were found in all the members of a species. The forces of mutation, recombination and random drift can cause the disappearance of that trait in a future member of the species. All it takes is the disappearance of a trait in one member of a species to show that it is not essential. The universality of a biological trait in a species is fragile.
Suppose, nevertheless, that a trait occurs in all the members of a species. That trait is the essence of a species only if it is unique to that species. Yet organisms in different species often have common characteristics. Again, biological forces work against the uniqueness of a trait within a single species. Organisms in related species inherit similar genes and developmental programs from their common ancestors. These common stores of developmental resources cause a number of similarities in the organisms of different species. Another source of similar traits in different species is parallel evolution. Species frequently live in similar habitats with comparable selection pressures. Those selection pressures cause the prominence of similar traits in more than one species. The parallel evolution of opposable thumbs in primates and pandas is an example.
The existence of various evolutionary forces does not rule out the possibility of a trait occurring in all and only the members of a species. But consider the conditions such a trait must satisfy. A species" essential trait must occur in all the members of a species for the entire life of that species. Moreover, if that trait is to be unique to that species, it cannot occur in any other species for the entire existence of life on this planet. The temporal parameters that species essentialism must satisfy are quite broad. The occurrence of a biological trait in all and only the members of a species is an empirical possibility. But given current biological theory, that possibility is unlikely.
Other arguments have been mustered against species essentialism. Hull (1965) contends that species have vague boundaries and that such vagueness is incompatible with the existence of species specific essences. According to Hull, essentialist definitions of natural kinds require strict boundaries between those kinds. But the boundaries between species are vague. In all but a few cases, speciation is a long and gradual process such that there is no principled way to draw a precise boundary between one species and the next. As a result, species cannot be given essentialist definitions. (Hull's argument against species essentialism is very similar to one of Locke's (1894, III, vi) arguments against kind essentialism.)
Sober (1980) raises a different objection to species essentialism. He illustrates how essentialist explanations have been replaced by evolutionary ones. Essentialists explain variation within a species as the result of interference in the ontogenetic development of a species" organisms. Organisms have species specific essences, but interference often prevents the manifestations of those essences. Contemporary geneticists offer a different explanation of variation within a species. They cite the gene frequencies of a species as well as the evolutionary forces that affect those frequencies. No species specific essences are posited. Contemporary biology can explain variation within a species without positing a species" essence. So according to Sober, species essentialism has become theoretically superfluous.
In a pre Darwinian age, species essentialism made sense. Such essentialism, however, is out of step with contemporary evolutionary theory. Evolutionary theory provides its own methods for explaining variation within a species. It tells us that the boundaries between species are vague. And it tells us that a number of forces conspire against the existence of a trait in all and only the members of a species. From a biological perspective, species essentialism is no longer a plausible position.
Given the class/individual distinction, Ghiselin and Hull argue that species are individuals, not classes. Their argument assumes that the term "species" is a theoretical term in evolutionary theory. So their argument concerning the ontological status of species focuses on the role of "species" in evolutionary biology. Here is Hull's version of the argument, which can be dubbed the "evolutionary unit argument."
The Evolutionary Unit Argument: Since Darwin, species have been considered units of evolution. When Hull and others assert that species are units of evolution, they do not simply mean that the gene frequencies of a species change from one generation to the next. They have a more significant form of evolution in mind, namely a trait going from being rare to being prominent in a species. A classic example of such evolution is the change in coloration of peppered moths in Nineteenth Century England. Prior to the industrial revolution, peppered moths were light gray with black specks. During the industrial revolution, selection caused peppered moths to become coal black.
A number of processes can cause a trait to become prominent in a species. Hull highlights selection. Selection causes a trait to become prominent in a species only if that trait is passed down from one generation to the next. If a trait is not heritable, the frequency of that trait will not increase cumulatively. Hereditary relations, genetic or otherwise, require the generations of a species to be causally connected. Reproduction requires the generations of a species to be causally and hence spatiotemporally connected. So, if species are to evolve in non trivial ways by natural selection, they must be spatiotemporally continuous entities. Given that species are units of evolution, species are individuals and not classes.
The conclusion that species are individuals has a number of interesting implications. For one, the relationship between an organism and its species is not a member/class relation but a part/whole relation. An organism belongs to a particular species only if it is appropriately causally connected to the other organisms in that species. The organisms of a species must be parts of a single evolving lineage. If belonging to a species turns on an organism's insertion in a lineage, then qualitative similarity can be misleading. Two organisms may be very similar morphologically, genetically, and behaviorally, but unless they belong to the same spatiotemporally continuous lineage they cannot belong to the same species. Think of an analogy. Being part of my immediate family turns on my wife, my children and I having certain biological relations to one another, not our having similar features. It does not matter that my son's best friend looks just like him. That friend is not part of our family. Similarly, organisms belong to a particular species because they are appropriately causally connected, not because they look similar (if they indeed do).
Another implication of the species are individuals thesis concerns our conception of human nature (Hull 1978). As we have seen, species are first and foremost genealogical lineages. An organism belongs to a species because it is part of a lineage not because it has a particular qualitative feature. Humans may be a number of things. One of them is being the species Homo sapiens. From an evolutionary perspective, there is no biological essence to being a human. There is no essential feature that all and only humans must have to be part of Homo sapiens. Humans are not essentially rational beings or social animals or ethical agents. An organism can be born without any of these features and still be a human. From a biological perspective, being part of the lineage Homo sapiens is both necessary and sufficient for being a human. (For further implications of the individuality thesis, see Hull 1978.)
Why does Kitcher believe that some species are individuals and other species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets? Following the biologist Ernst Mayr, Kitcher suggests that there are two fundamental types of explanation in biology: those that cite proximate causes and those that cite ultimate causes. Proximate explanations cite the more immediate cause of a trait, for example, the genes or developmental pathways that cause the occurrence of a trait in an organism. Ultimate explanations cite the evolutionary cause of a trait in a species, for example, the selection forces that caused the evolution of thumbs in pandas and their ancestors.
For each type of explanation, Kitcher believes that there are corresponding definitions of the term "species" (what biologists call 'species concepts"). Proximate explanations cite species concepts based on structural similarities, such as genetic, chromosomal and developmental similarities. These species concepts assume that species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets of organisms. Ultimate explanations cite species concepts that assign species evolutionary roles. These species concepts assume that species lineages and thus individuals.
Kitcher is correct that biologists attempt to explain the traits of organisms in two ways: sometimes they cite the ultimate, or evolutionary, cause of a trait; other times they cite a structural feature of an organism with that trait. A problem with Kitcher's approach is his characterization of biological practice. Biologists since Darwin have taken species to be evolutionary units. A glance at a biology text book will reveal that the evolutionary approach to species is the going concern in biology. The groups that correspond to Kitcher's structural concepts are not considered species by taxonomists. Groups of organisms that have genetic, developmental, behavioral and ecological similarities, are natural kinds in biology, but they are not considered species. Consider such groups of organisms as males, females, tree nesters and diploid organisms. These groups of organisms cut across species. For instance, some but not all humans are males and many organisms in other species are males. Male is a kind in biology, but it is not a species. Kitcher's motivation for asserting that species are sets is to allow spatiotemporally unrestricted groups of organisms to form species. That motivation, however, is not substantiated by biological theory or practice.
A more recent account of species as natural kinds is found in Boyd (1999), Griffiths (1999), and Wilson (1999). Their approach to species relies on Boyd's theory of natural kinds. According to Boyd, natural kinds are homeostatic property cluster kinds. The members of such a kind share a number of co-occurring properties that can be cited in prediction and explanation. The co-occurrence of such properties is due to a kind's causal homeostatic mechanisms. Turning to species, the organisms in Canis familaris share a number of similar properties that are sufficiently stable for use in explanation and prediction. The stability of those properties are the result of such causal homeostatic mechanisms as gene flow, stabilizing pressure and developmental homeostasis.
Boyd's approach to natural kinds is distinct from the traditional essentialist approach to kinds in several ways. First, membership in a kind does not require the occurrence of a universal and unique property in all the members of a kind. Thus Boyd's account allows that species can be natural kinds without requiring that the members of a species share a qualitative essence. Second, Boyd's account allows species to vary at a time and over time. Species can be natural kinds even though they evolve. There is some limit to the variability allowed in a species, however. Species must be sufficiently stable so that better than chance predictions can be made about some of the properties of a species.
A third way that Boyd's account of natural kinds differs from the traditional account is that Boyd allows natural kinds to be spatiotemporally restricted entities. Natural kinds, in other words, can be individuals, so long as the members of a natural kind are sufficiently stable to allow prediction and explanation. Boyd's account brings species back into the fold of natural kinds by allowing that species can be both natural kinds and individuals. Species are natural kinds because species are homeostatic property cluster kinds. Species are individuals because one of their homeostatic mechanisms is genealogy.
Boyd's approach to species brings unity to the debate over the ontological status of species. Such unity is appealing if one does not mind deflating the distinction between kinds and individuals. On Boyd's approach, a particular species, even a particular human (Boyd 1999, 163), is both an individual and a natural kind. Bill Clinton's arms are parts of the individual Bill Clinton. And Bill Clinton's arms are members of the natural kind Bill Clinton. If the idea that Bill Clinton is a natural kind seems unproblematic, then Boyd's assertion that species are both individuals and natural kinds should be just the ontological ticket.
What are we to make of this variety of species concepts? Monists believe that an aim of biological taxonomy is to identify the single correct species concept. Perhaps that concept is among the species concepts currently proposed and we need to determine which concept is the right one. Or perhaps we have not yet found the correct species concept and we need to wait for further progress in biology. Pluralists take a different stand. They do not believe that there is a single correct species concept. Biology, they argue, contains a number of legitimate species concepts. Pluralists believe that the monist's goal of a single correct species concept should be abandoned.
If one thinks that the term "species" is a theoretical term found within evolutionary biology, then one might find Dupré's version of pluralism too promiscuous. If the question is how the term "species" is defined in biology, then how it is defined outside of biology does not count. Think of a parallel situation in physics. When we are interested in the scientific meaning of the term "work" we do not attend to its meaning in the sentence "How was work today?" Similarly, the use of the word "species" by culinary experts does not reveal the theoretical meaning of "species."
Kitcher's pluralism is more circumspect: it limits species concepts to those that are legitimized by theoretical biology. Still, one might worry that Kitcher's form of pluralism is too liberal. Kitcher's pluralism allows that some species are spatiotemporally continuous entities (individuals), while other species may be spatiotemporally unrestricted entities (natural kinds). As we saw in Section 2.1, Hull's evolutionary unit argument states that within the purview of evolutionary biology, species must be individuals. Kitcher's pluralism does not satisfy this requirement: some species can be non individuals. If one assumes that "species" is a theoretical term in evolutionary theory and that species are individuals, then Kitcher's pluralism is too inclusive.
Another version of species pluralism is found in Ereshefsky (2001). This version of pluralism adopts Hull's conclusion that species must be spatiotemporally continuous lineages. Nevertheless, this version of pluralism asserts that there are different types of lineages called "species." The Biological Species Concept and related concepts highlight those lineages bound by the process of interbreeding. The Phylogenetic Species Concepts highlight those lineages of organisms that share a common and unique ancestry. Ecological approaches to species highlight lineages of organisms that are exposed to common sets of stabilizing selection. On this form of species pluralism, the tree of life is segmented by different processes into different types of species lineages.
It is worth noting that the motivation behind Dupré's, Kitcher's and Ereshefsky's versions of pluralism is ontological not epistemological. Some authors (for example, Rosenberg 1994) suggest that we adopt pluralism because of our epistemological limitations. The world is exceedingly complex and we have limited cognitive abilities, so we should accept a plurality of simplified and inaccurate classifications of the world. The species pluralism offered by Dupré, Kitcher, and Ereshefsky is not epistemologically driven. Evolutionary theory, a well substantiated theory, tells us that the organic world is multifaceted. According to Dupré, Kitcher, and Ereshefsky, species pluralism is a result of a fecundity of biological forces rather than a paucity of scientific information.
Adopting only an interbreeding approach to species has its costs: it would exclude all asexual organisms from forming species. Interbreeding requires the genetic contributions of two sexual organisms. Asexual organisms reproduce by themselves, either through cloning, vegetative means or self fertilization. Some reptiles and amphibians reproduce asexually. Many insects reproduce asexually. And asexuality is rampant in plants, fungi and bacteria. In fact, asexual reproduction is the prominent form of reproduction on Earth (Hull 1988). If one adopts an interbreeding approach to species, then most organisms do not form species. This seems a high price to pay for species monism.
Another objection to species pluralism is that pluralism is an overly liberal position (Sober 1984, Ghiselin 1987, Hull 1987). Pluralists allow a number of legitimate species concepts, but how do pluralists determine which concepts should be accepted as legitimate? Should any species concept proposed by a biologist be accepted? What about those concepts proposed by non biologists? Without criteria for determining the legitimacy of a proposed species concept, species pluralism boils down to a position of anything goes.
Species pluralists respect this objection and attempt to respond to it (Dupré 1993, Ereshefsky 2001). They have suggested criteria for judging the legitimacy of a proposed species concept. Such criteria can be used to determine which species concepts should be accepted into the plurality of legitimate species concepts. Candidate criteria are the epistemic virtues that scientists typically use for determining the scientific worthiness of a theory. For example, in judging a species concept, one might ask if the theoretical assumptions of a concept are empirically testable. The Biological Species Concept relies on the assumption that interbreeding causes the existence of stable lineages. It also assumes that organisms that cannot interbreed do not form stable lineages. Whether interbreeding and only interbreeding causes the existence of stable lineages is empirically testable. So the Biological Species Concept has the virtue of empirical sensitivity. Other criteria for judging species concepts include intertheoretic coherence and internal consistency.
The point here is not to bring out an array of proposed species concepts and show how such criteria work in action (Dupré 1993 and Ereshefsky 2001 perform that task). The point is to show that pluralists can provide criteria for discerning which species concepts should be accepted as legitimate. If pluralists can successfully provide such criteria, then the anything goes objection to pluralism is answered.
Perhaps they share a common property that renders them species. If one adopts the thesis that all species are genealogical lineages, then a common feature of species is their being lineages. However, this feature is also shared by other types of taxa in the Linnaean Hierarchy. From an evolutionary perspective, all taxa, whether they be species, genera, or tribes, are genealogical lineages. We need to locate a feature that is not only common in species but also distinguishes species from other types of taxa.
Biological taxonomists often talk in terms of the patterns and processes of evolution. Perhaps there is a process or a pattern that occurs in species but not in other types of taxa. Such a process or pattern would unify the types of lineages we call "species." Let us start with process. The Biological Species Concept highlights those species bound by the process of interbreeding. The Ecological Species Concept identifies those species unified by stabilizing selection. The species highlighted by Phylogenetic Species Concepts are unified by such historical processes as genetic and developmental homeostasis. A survey of these different species concepts reveals that species are bound by different types of processes. So no single type of process is common to all species. Arguably, none of these processes are unique to species either (Mishler and Donoghue 1982).
What about pattern? Do species display a pattern that distinguishes them from other types of taxa? If by pattern we mean ontological structure, then species have different patterns. Species are individuals, but they are different types of individuals. Species of asexual organisms and species of sexual organisms have different structures. Both types of species contain organisms that are genealogically connected to a common ancestor. But the organisms in a sexual species are also connected by interbreeding. Thus species of sexual organisms form causally integrated entities: within a given generation, their members exchange genetic material through sexual reproduction. Species of asexual organisms do not form causally integrated entities: their organisms are merely connected to a common ancestor.
There are other suggestions for the common and unique pattern of species. Many observe that the organisms of a species often look the same or that the organisms of a species share a cluster of reoccurring properties. To the extent that this is true, it is also true of genera and some other higher taxa. The members of some genera tend to look the same and have a cluster of stable properties. Another suggestion for the pattern that distinguishes species is their ability to evolve as a unit — species are the units of evolution, other types of taxa are not. But again, many higher taxa have such unity as well (Mishler and Donoghue 1982).
The above survey of candidate unifying features is far from exhaustive. But the result is clear enough. Species vary in their unifying processes and ontological structure. Furthermore, many features that biologists and philosophers highlight as unique to species occur in many higher taxa as well. Given this survey, what position should we adopt concerning the nature of species? There are several options. According to one option we should keep looking for the unifying feature of species. This is the option favored by some monists (for example, Sober 1984). Contemporary biology may not have discovered the unifying feature of species, but that does not mean that biology will not find such a feature in the future. To give up the search for the unifying nature of species would be too hasty.
Another option starts with the assumption that the search for the unifying feature of species has gone on long enough. Biologists have looked long and hard for the correct definition of "species." The result of that search is not that we do not know what species are. The result is that the organic world contains different types of species. The conclusion drawn by some pluralists (Kitcher 1984, Dupré 1993) is that the term "species" should be given a disjunctive definition. Species are either interbreeding lineages, or ecological lineages, or phylogenetic units, or? .
A third option, like the previous one, assumes that biologists have looked long enough for the unifying feature of species. In that search, biology has learned that there are different types of lineages called "species." But proponents (Ereshefsky 1998) of this option do not opt for a disjunctive definition of "species." According to this option, we should doubt the very existence of the category species. Those lineages we call "species" vary in their patterns and processes. Furthermore, the distinction between species and other types of taxa is riddled with vagueness. Consequently, we should doubt whether the term "species" refers to a real category in nature.
To better understand this third option it is useful to see more precisely what is being doubted. Biologists make a distinction between the species category and species taxa. Species taxa are the individual lineages we call "species." Homo sapiens and Canis familaris are species taxa. The species category is a more inclusive entity. The species category is the class of all species taxa. The third option does not call into question the existence of Homo sapiens or Canis familaris or any other lineage that we call "species." The third option just calls into question the existence of the categorical rank of species.
Darwin may have had this third option in mind when he wrote his friend Joseph Hooker:
It is really laughable to see what different ideas are prominent in various naturalists' minds, when they speak of "species"; in some, resemblance is everything and descent of little weight — in some, resemblance seems to go for nothing, and Creation the reigning idea — in some, sterility an unfailing test, with others it is not worth a farthing. It all comes, I believe, from trying to define the indefinable (December 24, 1856; in F. Darwin 1887, vol. 2, 88.).
Darwin considers the term "species" indefinable. He could mean a couple of things by this. Perhaps Darwin meant that the term "species" is an indefinable primitive term in evolutionary theory though he still believed in the existence of the species category. Or perhaps Darwin doubted the existence of the species category altogether. According to Beatty (1985), Darwin doubted the existence of the species category. There is also evidence that he doubted the existence of the other Linnaean categories (Ereshefsky 2001). Still, Darwin believed in the existence of those lineages we call "species.' He just doubted whether the species category and the other Linnaean categories — the grid we place on the tree of life — exists in nature.
This encyclopedia entry started with the observation that at an intuitive level the nature of species seems fairly obvious. But a review of the technical literature reveals that our theoretical understanding of species is far from settled. The debate over the nature of species involves a number of issues. One issue is their ontological status: are species natural kinds or individuals or both? A second issue concerns pluralism: should we adopt species monism or species pluralism? A third issue, and perhaps the most fundamental issue, is whether the term "species" refers to a real category in nature.
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First published: July 4, 2002
Content last modified: July 4, 2002