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Johannes Sharpe

Johannes Sharpe (ca. 1360 - after 1415) is the most important and original author among the so called `Oxford Realists', a group of thinkers influenced by John Wyclif's logic and ontology. His semantic and metaphysical theories are the final output of the main preceding traditions of thought, since he developed the new form of realism started up by Wyclif, on the one hand, but was open to many Nominalistic criticisms of the traditional Realistic strategies, on the other.

1. Life and Works

Johannes Sharpe (Scharp, Scharpe) was from the diocese of Münster in Westphalia, where he was born presumably around 1360. He received his Bachelor of Arts from the University of Prague in 1379, but spent the greatest part of his academic life in Oxford, where he was fellow at Queen's College from 1391 to 1403, and where he became a Master of Arts and a Doctor of Theology. In 1415 he was lector ordinarius in Lüneburg (Saxony) (see Conti 1990, p. xvii). The date of his death is unknown.

He established a reputation as a philosopher and a theologian. The number of extant manuscripts of his works and their widespread distribution attest to his importance and notoriety throughout the 15th century. The following writings are attributed to him:

2. The Theory of Meaning

The basic idea of the standard Medieval Realist theories of meaning was that semantic classifications derive from ontological differences among the signified objects. So, according to this approach, the simple expressions of our language (i.e. names) are distinct from the complex expressions (i.e. sentences) by virtue of their own significata, that is by virtue of the different kinds of objects they refer to. In fact, the objects signified by complex expressions are compounds of (at least) two of the objects signified by simple expressions and a relation of identity (or non-identity, in the case of a true negative sentence), while a simple object is an item in a category (i.e. either a singular substance, or a substantial form, or an accidental form). Furthermore, every simple expression of our language is like a label that names just one object in the world, but whereas proper names and singular expressions label individuals (i.e. token-objects), general terms label common natures (i.e. type-objects), which are the main metaphysical constituents of the set of individuals that instantiate them. For instance, the general expression `man' labels and can stand for each and every man only because of its primarily signifying the universal form of manhood qua being present in each and every man as the main constitutive principle of his essence.

Sharpe rejects the standard Realist criteria for the generality (or universality, according to his terminology) of terms, and substantially accepts the inner sense of Nominalist criticisms. In his opinion, to be matched by a common nature really existing in the world is no longer the necessary and sufficient condition for being a general term. According to him, signifying universally (that is, signifying a unitary concept that in turn refers to a multiplicity of things displaying at least a similar mode of being [QsU, pp. 129-30]) is a condition for semantic universality equally as important as the previous one. He thinks that not only do terms that signify a common nature existing outside the intellect have to be viewed as common, but also those that signify universally (ibid., p. 69). Thus according to Sharpe there are six different kinds of general expressions, both spoken and written:

  1. those that universally singify a common nature really existing in the world (in re), like the term `manhood';
  2. those that universally connote a common nature really existing in the world, without directly signifying it, like the term `white' (`album'), which refers to white things and connotes the form of whiteness;
  3. those that do not refer to anything really existing in the world, but are somehow correlated with a universal concept, like the terms `void' and `chimaera';
  4. those to which no common nature really existing in the world corresponds, but rather a common transcategorial negative concept, under which a multiplicity of things can be collected, like the term `individual';
  5. equivocal terms as such, since they are connected with a multiplicity of different notions;
  6. demonstrative pronouns, like `this (one)', when used to supposit for (refer to) a common nature, even though they can signify only in a singular manner (discrete) (ibid., pp. 69-71).

The fourth kind of general terms deserves particular attention, since it is connected with Sharpe's solution to the question of the semantic and ontological status of terms of second intentions like `individual' or `singular' -- a question that was very controversial in Oxford at the end of the 14th century. The most common explanation was that proposed by Robert Alyngton, a fellow of Queen's College in the 1380s. According to Alyngton, terms like `individual' have to be considered singular expressions; more precisely they are "range-narrowed" expressions, like `this man', because they identify a singular referent as a member of a given (manifested) set of individuals. In fact, a term like `individual' presupposes a general concept (that of being), the range of which is narrowed to just a unique object among beings by an act of our intellect -- to one object that is not common. Sharpe argues that Alyngton's answer goes against linguistic usage as well as established facts. If Alyngton were right, then the following argument (which everybody will admit) would be formally incorrect:

man runs (homo currit)
and not the universal-man (et non homo communis)
therefore an individual man runs (ergo homo singularis currit),
just like this other one:
man runs (homo currit)
and not the universal-man (et non homo communis)
therefore Socrates runs (ergo Sortes currit),
since the syntagm `an individual man' (`homo singularis') would be a singular term standing precisely for only one individual, just like `Socrates' (`Sortes'). Furthermore, it is a fact that anyone can understand the sentence `an individual man runs' even without knowing who the man who is running is -- which is, on the contrary, a necessary requisite according to Alyngton's theory. Therefore, Sharpe regarded second intentions of this kind as common ones (ibid., pp. 132-33).

In this way, Sharpe admits that the Nominalist explanation of the universality of signs holds in the particular context of second intentions, implicitly rejecting Alyngton's reduction of epistemology to ontology, since according to Sharpe's account the former has its own range and rules partially independent of those of the latter. Furthermore, he restores the semantic rank that intuitively would be assigned to the `individual'-like terms (something Alyngton was unable to do). On the other hand, his defence of Realism on the problem of universals is partially invalidated by the acceptance, although restricted, of the Nominalist principle of the autonomy of thought in relation to the world. In fact, it is evident that from a semantic and/or epistemological point of view he can no longer justify the extra-mental reality of universals.

Like Burley's system, Sharpe's semantic system too lists a third kind of expression between simple and complex expressions: concrete accidental terms (like `white' or `father'), whose significata are neither simple nor complex objects but something in between. He affirms that concrete accidental terms do not signify simple objects but aggregates composed of a substance and an accidental form. Such aggregates are lacking in numerical unity, and hence do not fall into any of the ten categories, because they are not properly beings (entia). For that reason concrete accidental terms, although simple expressions from a merely grammatical point of view, are not names. The two metaphysical components of such aggregates (i.e. substance and accidental form) are related to the concrete accidental term as follows: although the concrete accidental term connotes the accidental form, this latter is not its direct significatum, so that the concrete accidental term can supposit for the substance only. In other words, the concrete accidental terms label substances by means of the accidental forms from which they draw their names, so that they name substances only qua bearers (subiecta) of a form. This fact accounts for the difference between general names in the category of substance (like `man') and concrete accidental terms. General names in the category of substance are concrete terms as well, but the form they primarily signify is really identical with the substances they label. Therefore, in this case, the name itself of the form can be used as a name of the substance. This obviously implies a slight difference in meaning between abstract and concrete substantial terms, like `manhood' and `man'. While `manhood' is not the name of the form considered in its totality, but rather the name only of the essential principle of the form, that is, of the intensional content carried by the term `man', this latter term signifies the substantial form considered as a constitutive element of the reality (esse) of a certain set of individual substances that instantiate it. As a consequence, according to Sharpe, `man is manhood' (`homo est humanitas') is a well formed and true sentence, since both subject and predicate signify the same entity, but `white is whiteness' (`album est albedo') is not, since `white' does not directly signify the accidental form, but only the substrate in which it inheres, as bearer of that form, and therefore `white' cannot stand for such a form in any sentence (ibid., pp. 71-73).

3. Universals and Predication

The core of Sharpe's metaphysics lies in his theory of universals. He is a Realist, since he defends the extra-mental existence of universals (ibid., p. 68), but his approach to the whole matter can be defined as "analytical," since he seems to believe that (i) any ontology has to be built up in relation to the resolution of semantic problems, (ii) any philosophical explanation of reality has to be preceded by a semantic explanation of the function of our language, and (iii) that there is not a close correspondence between elements and structures of language and elements and structures of the world. So Sharpe distinguishes two main kinds of universals: universal forms, like manhood, really present in a multiplicity of things, and universal signs, both mental and extra-mental, by means of which we refer to real universals and/or signify something in a universal manner (ibid., p. 50; see also p. 68). On the other hand, the theoretical framework of this division is an analysis of the various meanings of the term `universal'. According to Sharpe, they are six, since we can count the following entities universal:

  1. causes that have a multiplicity of effects;
  2. the ideas in God;
  3. the universal quantifier (syncategorema universaliter distributivum);
  4. universal propositions, both affirmative and negative;
  5. universal forms, or real universals; and
  6. universal signs (ibid., pp. 49-50).

The being of real universals coincides with the being of their own individuals, so that real universals can be said to be everlasting, because of the continuous succession of their individuals, and really identical with them. On the other side, universals and individuals are formally different from each other, as they have distinct constitutive formal principles, and therefore different properties (ibid., pp. 91-92). The most important among universal signs are mental universals, which are both the acts of intellection through which our mind grasps the nature of universal forms and the concepts through which it connects general names with the things to which they refer (ibid., pp. 68-69). As a consequence, his position on the problem of universals can be summed up as follows:

  1. Universals exist in a twofold way, as common natures in re and as concepts in our mind.
  2. Real universals are naturally apt to be present in many things as their main metaphysical components.
  3. Mental universals are partially caused in our mind by the common natures existing outside.
  4. Real universals have no being outside the being of their individuals.

Sharpe's theory of universals is obviously modeled on the canons of the moderate Realism. Nevertheless an important difference divides his position from the most common moderate Realist ones (exemplified by Aquinas' doctrine): whereas according to St. Thomas universals exist in potentia outside the mind, and in actu only in the mind, according to Sharpe's account they exist in actu outside the mind, since their being is the same as the being of individuals, which is actual. For Sharpe a universal is in actu if and only if there is at least one individual in which it is present. Therefore our mind does not give actuality to universals, but only a separate mode of existence.

The description of the relationship between universals and individuals in terms of real identity and formal distinction entails (i) that not all that is predicated of individuals can be directly (formaliter) attributed to their universals and vice versa, but (ii) that all that is predicated of individuals has to be in some way or another attributed to universals and vice versa. Therefore a redefinition of the standard kinds of predication was required. Like Alyngton and Penbygull, Sharpe modifies Wyclif's theory of predication. Thus he divides real predication, which is a real relation between two entities of the world, into formal predication (praedicatio formalis) and predication by essence (praedicatio essentialis vel secundum essentiam). Predication by essence shows a partial identity between the subject thing and the predicate thing, which share some metaphysical component parts, and does not require (or even excludes) that the form connoted by the predicate term be directly present in the essence signified by the subject term. Formal predication, on the contrary, requires such a direct presence (ibid., pp. 90-91).

Unlike Alyngton and Penbygull, Sharpe does not divide formal predication into formal essential predication and formal accidental predication, and, as is evident from his formulations, offers two different readings of the distinction between formal predication and predication by essence. According to Alyngton and Penbygull, predication by essence is more general than formal predication; as a consequence, in their theories formal predication is a sub-type of predication by essence. Besides this interpretation, Sharpe admits another one, according to which the two kinds of predication at issue are complementary although not mutually exclusive. This is the case if predication by essence excludes that the form connoted by the predicate term be directly present in the essence signified by the subject term (ibid., p. 91).

4. Psychology and Theory of Knowledge

The sources of Sharpe's psychological and epistemological theories are St. Thomas, Duns Scotus, and Ockham, altough this latter is chiefly a polemical source, as Kennedy 1969 pointed out (pp. 253 and 270).

Like Aquinas, Sharpe

  1. maintains that the intellectual soul is the immediate form of the human body, so that the whole being of the latter totally depends on the former, although souls are individuated by bodies (In De anima, fols. 217v-218r), and
  2. claims that each man has his own intellect, arguing against Averroes' thesis of the unicity and separate character of the passive intellect for the whole human species (ibid., fols. 210r-212v).
Like Duns Scotus, Sharpe thinks there is not a real distinction between the soul and its intellective faculties (i.e. the active intellect, the passive intellect, and the will) or among the intellective faculties themselves, but only a formal distinction. On the other hand, the soul's corporeal powers (potentiae incorporatae), which depend on bodily organs for their operations, are really distinct from the soul and from each other (ibid., fol. 236v). In this context, Sharpe defines two different kinds of formal distinction. According to the first description, which is very close to that proposed by Scotus in his Ordinatio,

two entities x and y are formally distinct iff (a) both of them are constitutive elements of the same reality, but (b) neither of them can exist by itself, and (c) neither is part of the definite description of the other.
This is the distinction that holds among the intellective faculties of the soul. The second kind of formal distinction holds between the essence of the soul and its intellective faculties and between a species and its individuals. Sharpe draws the definition of this second kind of formal distinction from Wyclif's Tractatus de universalibus. It can be formalized as follows:
two entities x and y are formally distinct iff (a) there is at least one z such that z is predicated of x and not of y, or vice versa, but (b) x and y are really identical, since one is directly predicated of the other (ibid., fol. 236r-v).

Like Aquinas and Duns Scotus, and against Ockham, Sharpe affirms that intelligible species are required for intellection (ibid., fol. 244r). The main arguments he uses in favor of this thesis are the following:

  1. Our mind's objects of intellection are the universal essences or common natures. But they cannot be present themselves to the mind. Therefore some sign of them, that is, the intelligible species, has to be directly present in the intellect.
  2. A universal principle of intellection is necessary in order to understand a universal object, like a common nature. The phantasm is particular, since it is the mental representation of a singular object. Therefore a universal species, abstracted from the phantasm, is required.
  3. If there were no species, nothing would be retained by the intellect after an act of intellection. Therefore we could not understand each other, or understand more easily the second time, since there would be no objects for our memory (ibid., fols. 239v-240v).
Finally, like Duns Scotus and Ockham, and against St. Thomas, Sharpe states that our intellect can know perfectly even individual material things (ibid., fol. 253r). What is more, it can know immaterial beings as well, since the most general and proper object of our intellect is being in all its amplitude (ibid., fol. 253v). Sharpe here distinguishes perfect knowledge from complete knowledge. For a perfect knowledge of something it is sufficient that our intellect is able to single the object at issue among any other by a proper concept. For a complete knowledge of something it is necessary that our intellect is able to list all the properties, both substantial and accidental, of the object at issue. It is therefore evident that we can have a perfect knowledge of something without completely knowing it, as is the case with individual material things and immaterial beings (ibid., fol. 254r-v).


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Alyngton, Robert | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Duns Scotus, John | Penbygull, William | universals: the medieval problem of | Wyclif, John

Copyright © 2001 by
Alessandro D. Conti

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First published: September 24, 2001
Content last modified: September 24, 2001