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Study of the social dimensions of scientific knowledge encompasses the effects of scientific research on human life and social relations, the effects of social relations and values on scientific research, and the social aspects of inquiry itself. Several factors have combined to make these questions salient to contemporary philosophy of science. These factors include the emergence of social movements, like environmentalism and feminism, critical of mainstream science; concerns about the social effects of science-based technologies; epistemological questions made salient by big science; new trends in the history of science, especially the move away from internalist historiography; anti-normative approaches in the sociology of science; turns in philosophy to naturalism and pragmatism. This entry reviews the historical background to current research in this area, features of contemporary science which invite philosophical attention, the challenge to normative philosophy from social, cultural, and feminist studies of science, and the principal philosophical models of the social character of scientific knowledge.
Philosophers who study the social character of scientific knowledge can trace their lineage at least as far as John Stuart Mill. Mill, Charles Sanders Peirce, and Karl Popper all took some type of critical interaction as central to the validation of knowledge claims.
Mill's arguments occur in his well-known political essay On Liberty, (Mill 1859) rather than in the context of his logical and methodological writings, but he makes it clear that they are to apply to any kind of knowledge or truth claim. Mill argues from the fallibility of human knowers to the necessity of unobstructed opportunity for and practice of the critical discussion of ideas. Only such critical discussion can assure us of the justifiability of the (true) beliefs we do have and can help us avoid falsity or the partiality of belief or opinion framed in the context of just one point of view. The achievement of knowledge, then, is a social or collective, not an individual, matter.
Peirce's contribution to the social epistemology of science is commonly taken to be his consensual theory of truth: "The opinion which is fated to be ultimately agreed to by all who investigate is what we mean by truth, and the object represented is the real." (Peirce 1878, 133) While often read as meaning that the truth is whatever the community of inquirers converges on in the long run, the notion in turn is interpretable as meaning more precisely either that truth (and "the real") depends on the agreement of the community of inquirers or that it is the effect of the real that it will in the end produce agreement among inquirers. Whatever the correct reading of this particular statement, Peirce elsewhere makes it clear that, in his view, truth is both attainable and beyond the reach of any individual. "We individually cannot hope to attain the ultimate philosophy which we pursue; we can only seek it for the community of philosophers." (Peirce 1868, 40). Peirce puts great stock in instigating doubt and critical interaction as means to knowledge. Thus, whether his theory of truth is consensual or realist, his view of the practices by which we attain it grants a central place to dialogue and social interaction.
Popper is often treated as a precursor of social epistemology because of his emphasis on the importance of criticism in the development of scientific knowledge. Two concepts of criticism are found in his works (Popper 1963, 1972) and these can be related to logical and practical senses of falsification. The logical sense of falsification is just the structure of a modus tollens argument, in which a hypothesis is falsified by the demonstration that one of its logical consequences is false. This is one notion of criticism, but it is a matter of formal relations between statements. The practical sense of falsification refers to the efforts of scientists to demonstrate the inadequacies of one another's theories by demonstrating observational shortcomings or conceptual inconsistencies. This is a social activity. For Popper the methodology of science is falsificationist, and science progresses through the demonstration by falsification of the untenability of theories and hypotheses. Popper's falsificationism is part of an effort to demarcate genuine science from pseudo science, and has lost its plausibility as a description of scientific methodology as the demarcation project has come under challenge from naturalist and historicist approaches in philosophy of science. While criticism does play an important role in some current approaches in social epistemology, Popper's own views are more closely approximated by evolutionary epistemology, especially that version that treats cognitive progress as the effect of selection against incorrect theories and hypotheses.
The work of Mill, Peirce, and Popper is a resource for philosophers presently exploring the social dimensions of scientific knowledge. However, the current debates are framed in the context of developments in both philosophy of science and in history and social studies of science following the collapse of the logical empiricist consensus. The philosophers of the Vienna Circle are conventionally associated with an uncritical form of positivism and with the logical empiricism that replaced American pragmatism in the 1940s and 1950s. They saw natural science, however, as a potent force for progressive social change. (Cartwright, Cat, and Chang 1996; Giere and Richardson, eds., 1996) With its grounding in observation and public forms of verification, science for them constituted a superior alternative to what they saw as metaphysical obscurantism, an obscurantism that led not only to bad thinking but to bad politics. While one development of this point of view leads to scientism, the view that any meaningful question can be answered by the methods of science; another development leads to inquiry into what social conditions promote the growth of scientific knowledge. Logical empiricism, the version of Vienna Circle philosophy that developed in the United States, focused on logical, internal aspects of scientific knowledge and discouraged philosophical inquiry into the social dimensions of science. These came into prominence again after the publication of Thomas Kuhn's Structure of Scientific Revolutions (Kuhn 1962). A new generation of sociologists of science took Kuhn's emphasis on the role of non-evidential community factors in scientific change even further than he had and argued that scientific judgment was determined by social factors, such as professional interests and political ideologies. This family of positions has provoked a counter-response among philosophers. These responses are marked by an effort to grant some social character to scientific knowledge while at the same time maintaining its epistemological legitimacy, which they take to be undermined by the new sociology. At the same time, features of the organization of scientific inquiry compel philosophers to consider their implications for the normative analysis of scientific practices.
The second half of the twentieth century saw the emergence of what has come to be known as Big Science: the organization of large numbers of scientists bringing different bodies of expertise to a common research project. The original model was the Manhattan Project, undertaken during the Second World War to develop an atomic weapon. Theoretical and experimental physicists located at various sites across the country, though principally at Los Alamos, New Mexico, worked on sub-problems of the project under the overall direction of J. Robert Oppenheimer. While academic and military research have since been to some degree separated, much experimental research in physics, especially high energy particle physics, continues to be pursued by large teams of researchers. Research in other areas of science as well, for example the work comprehended under the umbrella of the Human Genome Project, has taken on some of the properties of Big Science, requiring multiple forms of expertise. In addition, the dependence of research on central funding bodies prompts questions about the degree of independence of contemporary scientific knowledge from its social and economic context.
John Hardwig (1985) articulated one philosophical dilemma posed by such large teams of researchers. Each member or subgroup participating in such a project is required because each has a crucial bit of expertise not possessed by any other member or subgroup. This may be knowledge of a part of the instrumentation, the ability to perform a certain kind of calculation, the ability to make a certain kind of measurement or observation. The other members are not in a position to evaluate the results of other members' work, and hence, all must take one anothers' results on trust. The consequence is an experimental result, (for example, the measurement of a property such as the decay rate or spin of a given particle) the evidence for which is not fully understood by any single participant in the experiment. This leads Hardwig to ask two questions, one about the evidential status of testimony, and one about the nature of the knowing subject in these cases. With respect to the latter, Hardwig says that either the group as a whole, but no single member, knows or it is possible to know vicariously. Neither of these is palatable to him. Talking about the group or the community knowing smacks of superorganisms and transcendent entities and Hardwig shrinks from that solution. Vicarious knowledge, knowing without oneself possessing the evidence for the truth of what one knows, requires, according to Hardwig, too much of a departure from our ordinary concepts of knowledge.
The first question is, as Hardwig notes, part of a more general discussion about the epistemic value of testimony. Much of what passes for common knowledge is acquired from others. We depend on experts to tell us what is wrong with our appliances, our cars, our bodies. Indeed, much of what we later come to know depends on what we previously learned as children from our parents. We acquire knowledge of the world through the institutions of education, journalism, and scientific inquiry. Philosophers disagree about the status of beliefs acquired in this way. Here is the question: If A knows that p on the basis of evidence e, B has reason to think A trustworthy and B believes p on the basis of A's testimony that p, does B know that p? Some philosophers, like Locke and Hume, argued that only what one has observed oneself could count as a good reason for belief, and that the testimony of another is, therefore, never sufficient warrant for belief. Thus, B does not know simply on the basis of A's testimony. While this result is consistent with traditional philosophical empiricism and rationalism, which emphasized the individual's sense experience or rational apprehension as foundations of knowledge, it does have the consequence that we do not know most of what we think we know.
A number of philosophers have recently offered alternative analyses focusing on one or another element in the problem. Some argue that testimony by a qualified expert is itself evidential, (Schmitt 1988), others that the expert's evidence constitutes good reason for, but is not itself evidential for the recipient of testimony (Hardwig 1985, 1988), others that what is transmitted in testimony is knowledge and not just propositional content and thus the question of the kind of reason a recipient of testimony has is not to the point (Welbourne 1981).
However this dispute is resolved, questions of trust and authority arise in a particularly pointed way in the sciences, and Hardwig's dilemma for the physics experiment is also a specific version of a more general phenomenon. A popular conception of science, fed partly by Popper's falsificationism, is that it is epistemically reliable because the results of experiments and studies are checked by independent repetition. In practice, however, only some results are so checked and many are simply accepted on trust. Thus, just as in the non-scientific world information is accepted on trust, so in science, knowledge grows by depending on the testimony of others. What are the implications of accepting this fact for our conceptions of the reliability of scientific knowledge?
David Hull, in his (1988) argues that because the overall structure of reward and punishment in the sciences is a powerful incentive not to cheat, further epistemological analysis of the sciences is unnecessary. But some celebrated recent episodes, such as the purported production of "cold fusion" were characterized by the failure of replication attempts to produce the same phenomenon. And, while the advocates of cold fusion were convinced that their experiments had produced the phenomenon, there have also been cases of outright fraud. Thus, even if the structure of reward and punishment is an incentive not to cheat, it does not guarantee the veridicality of every research report.
The reward individual scientists seek is credit. That is, they seek recognition, to have their work cited as important and as necessary to further scientific progress. The scientific community seeks true theories or adequate models. Credit, or recognition, accrues to individuals to the extent they are perceived as having contributed to that community goal. Without strong community policing structures, there is a strong incentive to cheat, to try to obtain credit without necessarily having done the work. Communities and individuals are then faced with the question: when is it appropriate to trust and when not?
Both Alvin Goldman (Goldman and Cox 1994) and Philip Kitcher (1993) treat this as a question to be answered by means of decision theoretic models. The decision theoretic approach to problems of trust and authority treats both credit and truth as utilities. The challenge then is to devise formulas that show that actions designed to maximize credit also maximize truth. Kitcher, in particular, develops formulas intended to show that even in situations peopled by non-epistemically motivated individuals (that is, individuals motivated more by a desire for credit than by a desire for truth), the reward structure of the community can be organized in such a way as to foster scientific progress. Kitcher also applies this approach to problems in the division of cognitive labor, i.e. to the questions whether (and when) to pursue research that calls a community consensus into question or to pursue research that extends the models and theories upon which a community agrees.
Steve Fuller and Joseph Rouse are both concerned with political dimensions of cognitive authority. Rouse in his (1987) integrated analytic and continental philosophy of science and technology to develop what might be called a critical pragmatism. This perspective facilitated an analysis of the transformative impact of science on human life and social relations. Fuller (1988) partially accepts the empirical sociologists' claim that traditional normative accounts of scientific knowledge fail to get a purchase on actual scientific practices, but takes this as a challenge to relocate the normative concerns of philosophers. These should include the distribution and circulation of knowledge claims. The task of social epistemology of science is regulation of the production of knowledge by regulating the rhetorical, technological, and administrative means of its communication.
Kuhn's critique of logical empiricism included a strong naturalism. Scientific rationality was to be understood by studying actual episodes in the history of science, not by formal analyses developed from a priori concepts of knowledge and reason (Kuhn 1962, 1977). Sociologists and sociologically inclined historians of science took this as a mandate for the examination of the full spectrum of scientists' practices without any prior prejudice as to which were epistemically legitimate and which not. That very distinction came under suspicion from the new social scholars, often labeled "social constructivists." They urged that understanding the production of scientific knowledge required looking at all the factors causally relevant to the acceptance of a scientific idea, not just at those the researcher thinks should be relevant.
A wide range of approaches in social and cultural studies of science has come under the umbrella label of "social constructivism." Both terms in the label are understood differently in different programs of research. While constructivists agree in holding that those factors treated as evidential, or as rationally justifying acceptance, should not be privileged at the expense of other causally relevant factors, they differ in their view of which factors are causal or worth examination. Macro-analytic approaches, such as those associated with the so-called Strong Programme in the Sociology of Scientific Knowledge, treat social relations as an external, independent variable and scientific judgment and content as a dependent variable. Micro-analyses or laboratory studies, on the other hand, abjure the implied separation of social context and scientific practice and focus on the social relations within scientific research programs and communities and on those that bind research-productive and research-receptive communities together.
Researchers also differ in the degree to which they treat the social and the cognitive dimensions of inquiry as independent or interactive. The researchers associated with the macro-analytic Strong Programme in the Sociology of Scientific Knowledge (Barry Barnes, David Bloor, Harry Collins, Donald MacKenzie, Andrew Pickering, Steve Shapin) were particularly interested in the role of large scale social phenomena, whether widely held social/political ideologies or group professional interests, on the settlement of scientific controversies. Some landmark studies in this genre include Andrew Pickering's (1984) study of competing professional interests in the interpretation of high energy particle physics experiments, and Steven Shapin and Simon Shaffer's (1985) study of the controversy between Robert Boyle and Thomas Hobbes about the proper interpretation of experiments with vacuum pumps.
The micro-sociological or laboratory studies approach features ethnographic study of particular research groups, tracing the myriad activities and interactions that eventuate in the production and acceptance of a scientific fact or datum. Karin Knorr Cetina's (1981) reports her year-long study of a plant science laboratory at UC Berkeley. Bruno Latour and Steven Woolgar's (1986) study of Roger Guillemin's neuroendocrinology laboratory at the Salk Institute is another classic in this genre. These scholars argued in subsequent work that their form of study showed that philosophical analyses of rationality, of evidence, of truth and knowledge, were irrelevant to understanding scientific knowledge. Sharon Traweek's (1988) comparative study of the cultures of Japanese and North American high energy physics communities pointed to the parallels between cosmology and social organization without making such extravagant and provocative epistemological claims. The efforts of philosophers of science to articulate norms of scientific reasoning and judgment were, to all these scholars, misdirected, because actual scientists relied on quite different kinds of considerations in the practice of science.
Until recently, apart from a few anomalous figures like Caroline Herschel, Barbara Mcclintock, and Marie Curie, the sciences were a male preserve. Feminist scholars have asked what bearing the masculinity of the scientific profession has had on the content of science and on conceptions of scientific knowledge and practice. Drawing on work by feminist scientists, exposing and critiquing gender biased science, and on theories of gender, feminist historians and philosophers of science have offered a variety of models of scientific knowledge and reasoning intended to accommodate the critique of accepted science and the concomitant proposal and advocacy of alternatives. Evelyn Keller (1985) proposed a psycho-dynamic model of knowledge and objectivity, arguing that a certain psychological profile, facilitated by typical patterns of masculine psychological development, associated knowledge and objectivity with domination. The association of knowledge and control continues to be a topic of concern for feminist thinkers as it is also for environmentally concerned critics of the sciences. Other feminists turned to Marxist models of social relations and developed versions of standpoint theory, which holds that the beliefs held by a group reflect the social interests of that group. As a consequence, the scientific theories accepted in a context marked by divisions of power such as gender will reflect the interests of those in power. Alternative theoretical perspectives can be expected from those systematically excluded from power. (Rose 1983; Haraway 1978).
Still other feminists have argued that some standard philosophical approaches to the sciences can be used to express feminist concerns. Nelson (1990) adopts Quine's holism and naturalism to analyze debates in recent biology. Elizabeth Potter (2001) adapts Mary Hesse's network theory of scientific inference to analyse gendered aspects of 17th century physics. Helen Longino (1990) develops a contextual empiricism to analyze research in human evolution and in neuroendocrinology. In addition to the direct role played by gender bias, scholars have attended to the ways shared values in the context of reception can confer an a priori implausibility on certain ideas. Keller (1983) argued that this was the fate of Barbara McClintock's unorthodox proposals of genetic transposition. Stephen Kellert (1993) makes a similar suggestion regarding the resistance to so-called chaos theory.
What the feminist and empirical sociological analyses have in common is the view that the social organization of the scientific community has a bearing on the knowledge produced by that community. There are deep differences, however, in their views as to what features of that social organization are deemed relevant and how they are expressed in the theories and models accepted by a given community. The gender relations focused on by feminists went unrecognized by sociologists pursuing macro- or microsociological research programs. The feminist scientists and scholars further differ from the scholars in empirical social and cultural studies of science in their call for alternative theories and approaches in the sciences. These calls imply that philosophical concerns with truth and justification are not only legitimate but useful tools in advancing feminist transformative goals for the sciences. As can be seen in their varying treatments of objectivity, however, philosophical concepts are often reworked in order to be made applicable to the content or episodes of interest (Cf. Haraway 1988, Harding 1993, Keller 1985, Longino 1990, Nelson 1990)
Since 1980, interest in developing philosophical accounts of scientific knowledge that incorporate the social dimensions of scientific practice has been on the increase. Some philosophers see attention to the social as a straightforward extension of already developed approaches in epistemology. Others, inclined toward some form of naturalism, have taken the work in empirical social studies of science discussed above seriously. They have, however, diverged quite considerably in their treatment of the social. Some, understand the social as biasing or distorting, and hence see the social as opposed to or competing with the cognitive or epistemic. They see the sociologists' disdain for normative philosophical concerns as part of a general debunking of science that demands a response. They attempt either to rebut the claims of the sociologists or to reconcile the demonstration of the role of interests in science with its ultimate rationality. Others treat the social as instead constitutive of rationality. This division parallels to some degree the division between macro-analyses and micro-analyses in the sociology of science described above.
Philosophers who treat the social as biasing or distorting tend to focus on the constructivists' view that there are no universal principles of rationality or principles of evidence that can be used to identify in any context-independent way which factors are evidential and which not. They can be divided into roughly two camps: defenders of rationality and reconciliationists who seek to disarm the sociologists' analyses by incorporating them into a broader rational framework.
Philosophers concerned to defend the rationality of science against sociological misrepresentations include Larry Laudan (1984) James Brown (1989, 1994), Alvin Goldman (1987, 1995) and Susan Haack (1996). The details of these philosophers' approaches differ, but they agree in holding that scientists are persuaded by what they regard as the best evidence or argument, the evidence most indicative of the truth by their lights, and in holding that arguments and evidence are the appropriate focus of attention for understanding the production of scientific knowledge. When evidential considerations have not trumped non-evidential considerations, we have an instance of bad science. They read the sociologists as arguing that a principled distinction between evidential and nonevidential considerations cannot be drawn and devote their efforts to refuting those arguments. The social character of science is understood as a matter of the aggregation of individuals, not their interactions, and public knowledge as simply the additive outcome of many individuals making sound epistemic judgments. Individual rationality and individual knowledge are thus the proper focus of philosophers of science. Exhibiting principles of rationality applicable to individual reasoning is sufficient to demonstrate the rationality of science, at least in its ideal form.
Reconciliationists include Ronald Giere, Mary Hesse, and Philip Kitcher. Giere (1988) models scientific judgment using decision theory. This permits incorporating scientists' interests as one of the parameters of the decision matrix. Mary Hesse (1980) employs a network model of scientific inference that resembles W.V.O. Quine's web of belief in that its constituents are heterogeneous in character, but all subject to revision in relation to changes elsewhere in the network. She understands the social factors as coherence conditions operating in tandem with logical constraints to determine the relative plausibility of beliefs in the network.
The most elaborate reconciliationist position is that developed in Philip Kitcher's (1993). In addition to modeling relations of authority and the division of cognitive labor as described above, he offers what he terms a compromise between extreme rationalists and sociological debunkers. The compromise model appeals to a principle of rationality, which Kitcher calls the External Standard. It is deemed external because it is proposed as holding independently of any particular historical, cultural or social context. Thus, not only is it is external, but it is also universal. The principle applies to change of belief (or shift from one practice to another, in Kitcher's broader locution), not to belief. It treats a shift (in practice or belief) as rational if and only "the process through which the shift was made has a success ratio at least as high as that of any other process used by human beings (ever) ..." (Kitcher 1993, 303). Kitcher's compromise proposes that scientific ideas develop over time and benefit from the contributions of many differently motivated researchers. This is the concession to the sociologically oriented scholars. In the end, however, those theories that get accepted are those that satisfy Kitcher's External Standard. Kitcher thus joins Goldman, Haack, and Laudan in the view that it is possible to articulate a priori conditions of rationality or of epistemic warrant that operate independently of, or, perhaps one might say, orthogonally to, the social relations of science.
A third set of models is integrationist in character. Nelson (1990) uses Quine's arguments against the independently foundational status of observation statements as the basis for what she calls a feminist empiricism. According to Nelson, no principled distinction can be made between the theories, observations, or values of a community. What counts as evidence, in her view, is fixed by the entire complex of a community's theories, value commitments, and observations. There is neither knowledge nor evidence apart from such a shared complex. The community is the primary knower on this view and individual knowledge is dependent on the knowledge and values of the community.
Miriam Solomon's social empiricism is focused on scientific rationality (Solomon 1992, 1994a, 1994b). It, too, involves denying a universal principled distinction among the causes of belief. Solomon draws on contemporary cognitive science literature to argue that biases are simply any factors that influence belief. They are not necessarily distorting, and can be productive of insight and rational belief. Salience and availability (of data, of measurement technologies) are biases as much as social ideologies. The distinctive feature of Solomon's social empiricism is her contrast between individual and community rationality. The theory or belief that it is rational to accept is that which has the greatest amount of empirical success. Individuals can persist in beliefs that are less rational than others on this view, if the totality of available evidence (or empirical data) is not available to them. What matters to science, however, is that community judgments be rational. A community is rational when the theories it accepts are those with all or the most empirical successes. Thus, the community can be rational even when its members are irrational. Indeed, individual irrationality can contribute to community rationality in that individuals committed to a theory that accounts for their data keep that data in the range of phenomena any theory accepted by the entire community must eventually explain. In order that the totality of relevant constraints on theory acceptance remain available to the entire community, biases must be appropriately distributed. Thus Solomon proposes appropriate distribution of biases as a normative condition on the structure of scientific communities.
Finally, in Longino's critical contextual empiricism, the cognitive processes that eventuate in scientific knowledge are themselves social (Longino 1990). Longino's starting point is a version of the underdetermination argument: the semantic gap between statements describing data and statements expressing hypotheses or theories to be confirmed or disconfirmed by that data means that evidential relations cannot be formally specified and that data cannot support one theory or hypothesis to the exclusion of all alternatives. Instead, such relations are mediated by background assumptions. Eventually, in the chain of justification, one reaches assumptions for which no evidence is available. If these are the context in which evidential relations are constituted, questions arise concerning how the acceptance of such assumptions can be legitimated. According to Longino, the only check against the arbitrary dominance of subjective (metaphysical, political, aesthetic) preference in such cases is critical interaction among the members of the scientific community or among members of different communities. Longino takes the underdetermination argument to express in logical terms the point made by the sociologically oriented researchers: the individuals participating in the production of scientific knowledge are historically, geographically, and socially situated and their observations and reasoning reflect their situations. This fact does not undermine the normative enterprise of philosophy, but requires its expansion to include within its scope the social interactions within and between scientific communities. What counts as knowledge is determined by such interactions. Longino claims that scientific communities do institutionalize some critical practices (for example, peer review), but argues that such practices and institutions must satisfy conditions of effectiveness in order to qualify as objective.
Philosophical study of the social dimensions of scientific knowledge has been intensifying in the decades since 1970. Scholars continue to investigate the myriad social relations within scientific communities and between them and their social, economic, and institutional contexts. Philosophers have been focused on what might be termed narrowly epistemic concerns in their response to this work. As these stabilize, we can expect that this branch of philosophy of science will expand to include attention to the ethical and political questions its analyses make salient.
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First published: April 12, 2002
Content last modified: April 12, 2002