#### Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Russell's Paradox

## Notes

1. Exactly when the
discovery of the paradox took place is not completely clear. Russell
initially states that he came across the paradox "in June 1901" (see
Russell 1944, p. 13). Later he reports that the discovery took place
"in the spring of 1901" (see Russell 1959, p. 58). Later still he
reports that he came across the paradox, not in June, but in May of
that year (see Russell 1967/1968/1969, volume 3 (1969), p. 221).

2. See Frege 1903, p. 127.

3. It is worth noting that
even prior to Russell's discovery this principle had not been
universally accepted. Georg Cantor, for example, rejected it in
favour of what was, in effect, a distinction between sets and
classes, recognizing that some properties (such as the property of
being an ordinal) produced collections that were too big to be sets,
and that an assumption to the contrary would result in an
inconsistent theory. (For further details see Menzel 1984,
Moore 1982, and Hallett 1984.)

4. One exception is paraconsistent set theory. Paraconsistent set theory
retains an unrestricted comprehension axiom but abandons classical
logic, substituting a paraconsistent logic in its place. See the
entries on
paraconsistent logic and
inconsistent mathematics
in this Encyclopedia.

Copyright © 1995, 2002 by

A. D. Irvine

*andrew.irvine@ubc.ca*
*First published: December 8, 1995 *

*Content last modified: June 29, 2002 *