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Thomas Reid

Thomas Reid (1710-1796) is a Scottish philosopher and one of the founders of the "common sense" school of philosophy. (Also included in the common sense school are such less well-known 18th century philosophers as James Beattie, George Campbell, and Dugald Stewart.) Reid is best known for his epistemology of sensation -- he believes that sensations serve to make us directly aware of real objects without the aid of any intervening medium -- and for his view of free will -- he holds that the only free actions are those that come about through a causal process originated by the agent. In the explication of both he offers perceptive and important criticisms of the philosophy of Locke, Berkeley and especially Hume. He is also well known for his criticisms of Locke's view of personal identity and Hume's view of causation. However, Reid also wrote on a wide variety of other philosophical topics including ethics, aesthetics and various topics in the philosophy of mind.

After studying at the University of Aberdeen, Reid entered the ministry in New Machar in 1737. In 1748 he published a short essay entitled "An Essay on Quantity" which concerned Hutchison's Inquiry into the Origin of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. Although this was his only published work, he was given a professorship at King's College Aberdeen in 1752. There he wrote An Inquiry Into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (published in 1764). Shortly afterward he was given a much more prestigious professorship at the University of Glasgow. He resigned from this position in 1781 in order to give himself greater time to write, and published Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man in 1785 and Essays on the Active Powers of Man in 1788.

In the Inquiry, which is primarily a work in epistemology, Reid examines each of the five senses and discusses the ways in which we achieve knowledge of the world through employing them. Much of the view developed in the Inquiry reappears in the Essays on the Intellectual Powers, which expands his epistemological picture beyond the apprehension of the world through the senses to consideration of memory, imagination, knowledge concerning kinds of things, the nature of judgment, reasoning and taste. The Essays on the Active Powers examines a collection of topics concerning ethics, the nature of agency generally, and the distinctive features of human agency.

Common Sense and Ordinary Language

Reid is a staunch defender of "common sense", or, as he sometimes puts it, the opinions of "the vulgar". In fact, in almost every arena of philosophical inquiry, Reid's positions are in various ways tied up with his overall project of defending common sense. Common sense, for Reid, are those tenets that we cannot help but believe, given that we are constructed the way we are constructed. This is not to say that nobody fails to believe the dictates of common sense. People often have beliefs that are in manifest conflict with common sense, but to have such beliefs, Reid thinks, is to be in deep conflict with one's nature as a human being. What this suggests is that Reid takes on a burden of showing, each time that he claims some particular view to be a dictate of common sense, that belief in it is dictated by human nature. In addition, much of Reid's philosophy proceeds from the assumption that the dictates of common sense could not possibly conflict with one another. Human nature could not be such as to lead us to contradictory beliefs. The collection of tenets that make up common sense are consistent with one another, and non-optional to those who are believing as a human being does.

He sees a close tie between the dictates of common sense and distinctions and positions that could be found buried in the structure of ordinary language. Ordinary language, for Reid, is the mirror of our ordinary, everyday thought. (The connection between ordinary language and common sense that Reid espouses was of great influence on much later philosophers such as G. E. Moore and J. L. Austin.) Reid does not believe, however, that every feature of ordinary language is indicative of some important tenet of common sense. Reid often suggests that the relevant features are those that can be found in "the structure of all languages", suggesting that the linguistic features of relevance are features of syntactic structure shared among languages. For example, Reid repeatedly says that it is a dictate of common sense that there is some important difference between the active and the passive, since "all languages" have a passive and active voice. The mere fact, then, that we say something in ordinary language does not imply that, for Reid, it is to be taken as a tenet of common sense. Rather, syntactic structures shared among languages often indicate, Reid thinks, features of our common sense conception of the world. When a certain tenet is implied by some feature shared by "all languages", Reid thinks it very likely that the best explanation for its being so shared is that it is a dictate of common sense.

Reid's attachment to common sense as found in ordinary language is easy to caricature unfairly. Reid did not hold that every position that can be deduced from a linguistic feature shared by all languages is a dictate of common sense, something that we cannot help but believe if we are to be true to our natures. He says, for instance,

A philosopher is, no doubt, entitled to examine even those distinctions that are to be found in the structure of all languages; and, if he is able to shew that there is no foundation for them in the nature of the things distinguished; if he can point out some predjudice common to mankind which has led them to distinguish things which are not really different; in that case, such a distinction may be imputed to a vulgar error, which ought to be corrected in philosophy. But when, in the first setting out, he takes it for granted without proof, that distinctions found in the structure of all languages, have no foundation in nature; this surely is too fastidious a way of treating the common sense of mankind. (Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, p.14)
However, he does hold that the burden of proof is squarely on the shoulders of those who deny something suggested by a syntactic feature shared across languages. If it is possible to find a claim in another philosopher's argument which sits uneasily with the facts about ordinary language, and the philosopher has failed to show that the claim suggested by ordinary language rests on a deep error, then, on Reid's view, we have found a sufficient reason to reject the philosopher's argument.

What this means is that Reid is not concerned to answer certain questions of justification that can seem enormously pressing to us in certain philosophical moods. He is not, for instance, interested in providing a justification for our belief in the external world by appeal to first principles of some sort. For instance, Reid feels he can refute skeptical hypotheses -- such as Descartes's hypothesis of an evil demon who makes us believe that the world is the way we take it to be when it is really vastly different -- simply by showing that such a hypothesis is no more likely to be true than the common-sensical belief that the world is much the way we perceive it to be. Since the belief in the external world is a dictate of common sense, it is, Reid thinks, as justified as it needs to be when it is shown to be on the same footing as any alternative. Justification, therefore, does not necessarily require providing positive reasons in favor of common-sensical beliefs; common sense beliefs could be adequately justified simply by undermining the force of the reasons in favor of alternatives to common sense. Common sense, as found in the structure of ordinary language, then, constrains, rather than dictates, acceptable philosophical positions.


Attacking the Way of Ideas

One of Reid's most important critical contributions is his attack on the model of the mental offered by Locke (although Locke derived it in large part from Descartes) and accepted in broad outline by Berkeley and Hume. As Reid reads Locke, all thought-like mental attitudes -- as opposed to emotions, desires, choices and the like -- whether they be thoughts concerning real objects, imaginative reveries, or even sensations, can be analyzed as "perceptions" of ideas. "Perception" here is used in a somewhat technical sense not to describe any of the the exercises of the five senses -- nor even to describe all that is going on when we are aware of external objects -- but, instead, to describe a special mental operation, a kind of mental "vision", so to speak. On the Lockean model, for instance, to think about an apple is to perceive an idea of an apple; the idea is a distinctive mental object grasped or perceived through the exercise of one's mental "eyes". It is through the perceiving of an idea -- in this technical sense of "perceive" -- that we perceive -- in a more ordinary sense of the term -- objects that correspond to those ideas; we are aware of the apple by perceiving an idea of it. Berkeley, and especially Hume, revise and expand this picture in various ways, but they maintain the overall schema: mental phenomena are perceptions of mental objects.

From within the Lockean model, there are at least three things that might be said regarding the sense in which we are aware of external objects. The Lockean might say, (1) that we are aware of external objects directly by perceiving representations of them, ideas; (2) that we infer the existence and nature of external objects by perceiving ideas of them, the nature of which we grasp directly; or, (3) that there is no distinction between external objects and ideas, and, thus, when we perceive ideas we are perceiving external objects. On the first approach, the Lockean would need to offer an explanation of what it is that is so special about ideas that makes it the case that whenever we are perceiving one we are directly aware of that which it represents. If this burden can be discharged, then it is possible to say that we are aware of external objects and remain consistent with the Lockean conception of the mental. Reid, however, thinks that the history of philosophy from the Ancients through his own time has been marked by a series of failed efforts to explain how it is that perception of something in the mind could amount, automatically, to perception of some external object. All such attempts make the mistake, he thinks, of giving unexplained and unexplainable powers to the internal mental objects: how could they possibly, all by themselves, attach our minds to objects whenever they are perceived? Since this question cannot be answered, he thinks, we are left with the second and third alternatives: either we infer the nature of external objects from the features of directly perceived ideas, or else Berkeleyan Idealism is true: external objects are ideas.

Reid thinks that nobody who has absorbed Hume's lessons regarding causation would think that we can avoid skepticism about the external world while insisting that we infer its nature from the features of directly perceived ideas. After all, on the Lockean model, external objects are the causes of our ideas. But if Hume is right about causation, then we can only infer the nature of a particular unobserved cause of a particular observed effect when we have had repeated experience of conjunction of similar causes with similar effects. Therefore, we can infer nothing about external objects by examination of the ideas which they cause in us: we have never had any experience of the relevant causes, but only experience of the relevant effects. Thus, Reid thinks, Lockeans about the mental are committed either to outright skepticism or Berkeleyan Idealism.

While his desire to overthrow skepticism and idealism -- both of which he takes to be in violation of common sense -- is part of Reid's motivation for attacking the Lockean model of the mental, he is careful not to attack the model merely on the grounds that it is in violation of common sense. In fact, Reid offers a range of criticisms that could be accepted quite readily even by those who deny that philosophical theses ought to be constrained by common sense. He says, for instance,

When, therefore, in common language, we speak of having an idea of anything, we mean no more by that expression, but thinking of it. The vulgar allow that this expression implies a mind that thinks, an act of that mind which we call thinking, and an object about which we think. But, besides these three, the philosopher conceives that there is a fourth--to wit, the idea, which is the immediate object. The idea is in the mind itself, and can have no existence but in a mind that thinks; but the remote or mediate object may be something external, as the sun or moon; it may be something past or future; it may be something which never existed. This is the philosophical meaning of the word idea; and we may observe that this meaning of that word is built upon a philosophical opinion: for, if philosophers had not believed that there are such immediate objects of all our thoughts in the mind, they would never have used the word idea to express them. (Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, p. 20)
Reid can be taken here to be imagining a kind of conversation between "the vulgar" on the one hand and " the philosopher" on the other. The vulgar say, "When I think about an apple in front of me, for instance, the immediate object of my perception is the real apple." The philosopher responds, "No, the immediate object of your perception is a mental object, an idea of the apple." But, Reid points out, the philosopher's response, which seems to be instructing the vulgar on their mistake, is actually predicated on a prior rejection of the vulgar's conception of everyday thoughts about objects. The Lockean claim that there is a "fourth" element in every thought -- an idea -- is "built upon a philosophical opinion", that is, the model arises from rejection of the common sense view and thus can't be given as a reason to reject the "vulgar" position. What Reid is doing here is shifting the burden of proof on to those who hold the Lockean model; there is nothing inherently superior about the Lockean picture, and hence the common sense picture -- under which we are aware of real objects directly and without mediation -- is, as yet, no less well defended.

In one of Reid's more powerful arguments against the Lockean model, he points out that the Lockean model is supposed to explain the fact that our mental states manage to connect to real objects, manage to be about real objects. However, this fact about beliefs is only explained by the model if the model is less obscure than the phenomena to be explained by it. But, Reid points out, if we start by noticing that we don't understand how it is that we manage to connect our minds to objects in the world, it can't help to say that we do it by first connecting our minds to mental objects (ideas) unless we understand how it is that we manage to connect our minds to those mental objects. That is, why is mental perception, or awareness, of ideas thought to be any more intelligible than awareness of objects? If it is no more intelligible, then the Lockean model is not serving to explain what it was intended to explain. (One place in which this objection appears is at Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, p. 229.)

Reid also uses the distinction between real and apparent magnitude developed in Berkeley's New Theory of Vision to respond to one of Hume's arguments for the claim that the immediate objects of awareness are mental objects rather than real objects. (See Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, pp. 224-225.) As Reid reads him, Hume argues that since, for instance, objects get smaller in our visual field as we move away from them, and real objects don't change size merely as a result of the fact that we move away from them, we must not be directly aware of the real sizes of objects. Reid claims that Hume is equivocating on two different notions of magnitude. The apparent magnitude of the object is the size that the object appears to have when looked at from a certain place. Apparent magnitude is a relational property of objects: the apparent magnitude of an object is a function not just of intrinsic features of the object, but also of the location of a particular observer. Real magnitude, on the other hand, is an intrinsic property of objects, not dependent on the position of any observer. So, when we move away from an object, we are perceiving properties of that object: its apparent magnitude relative to the locations through which we pass. Thus, Reid concludes, the fact that the real magnitude of the object doesn't change as we move away from the object is irrelevant to the question of whether or not the immediate objects of awareness are mental items, like ideas, or qualities of objects. Just because we aren't perceiving the real magnitude of the object as we move away from it doesn't mean that we aren't perceiving a propery of the object itself. We are perceiving a property of the object itself, namely, it's apparent magnitude.

None of Reid's arguments against the "way of ideas", as the Lockean model of the mental was sometimes called, are definitive. But they all aim to shift the burden of proof back to those who subscribe to the Lockean model. Since Reid saw the Lockean model as manifestly in violation of common sense, and since he took it to be a violation of correct philosophical methodology to accept any view contrary to common sense which was no better defended than the common-sensical view, he felt that to shift the burden of proof back to the subscribers to the Lockean model was to refute the model.

Sensation, Conception and Perception

Reid supplants the Lockean model with an act-based conception of the mental. That is, states of the mind cannot be analyzed into mental act and mental object, as on the Lockean model. The mind's states are all acts, loosely conceived; the only objects involved in thought are in the world, not the mind. The three most important mental acts are labelled by Reid "sensation", "conception", and "perception".

While none of these operations is defined or analyzed by Reid with exact philosophical rigor -- in fact, Reid suggests that such analyses aren't really possible in this domain -- it is possible to make some rough remarks about what Reid has in mind. Sensations are the feelings that are the immediate mental causal consequences of the influence of objects on us. Sensations are always associated with a particular organ of sense; they are always distinctly of , for instance, touch or vision. Conceptions, on the other hand, are ways of being aware of objects. To conceive of an object is to be aware of that object as the bearer of some particular property. One might conceive of an apple as red or as hard or as both red and hard. Further, one could conceive of an object -- and thus be directly aware of that object -- as possessing a particular relational property: to conceive of an object as having a particular apparent magnitude, for instance, is to be aware of the object itself as possessing the property of appearing a certain way from a certain location. Perceptions are a species of conception. To perceive an object is to be aware of it in a particular way, as the possessor of a particular quality, and, at the same time, to be convinced that the object exists and is as you conceive it to be. Objects, then, act on our bodies and cause us to have sensations -- a feeling of coldness, a visual image of color. These sensations, in turn, lead us -- Reid sometimes says "suggest to us" -- conceptions of their causes; we become aware of the causes of our sensations as possessing various qualities. Sometimes, although not always, these conceptions are accompanied by a conviction in their accuracy, and when they are, they are called "perceptions".

To defend common sense, Reid thinks, he needs to show that we are directly aware of real objects and are, most of the time, roughly right about the nature of the objects of which we are aware. Reid does not think that anything comparable needs to be shown about sensation. That is, sensation -- the direct effect of objects on our minds -- needn't, in itself, accurately represent the world. Rather, our sensations must help us -- and much of the rest of this section is aimed at explaining how -- to place our minds in direct contact with the world. Sensations are merely tools for obtaining what Reid thinks we all believe, common-sensically, to be the case: that in having conceptions, we are aware of real objects that are roughly the way we conceive them to be.

Reid, then, is offering a form of "direct realism": the view that our minds connect to the world directly, rather than through some sort of medium (such as ideas) to which our minds connect and which itself, somehow, connects to the world. While there is debate over the precise sense in which, for Reid, we are directly aware of objects, this much seems clear: whatever the sense of "direct" is in which the subscribers to the Lockean model take us to be directly aware of ideas, it is in that sense that Reid takes us to be directly aware of real objects.

Primary and Secondary Qualities

Intertwined with Reid's view that we can be immediately aware of objects through their relational properties -- such as their apparent magnitudes -- are Reid's views regarding the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Locke thought that our ideas of "primary qualities" -- shapes, sizes and motions -- and configurations of the primary qualities of the stuff out of which bodies are built -- texture and construction -- resemble the qualities which cause them. However, according to Locke, our ideas of a variety of other qualities -- particularly, colors, sounds, tastes and smells -- do not. Ideas of colors, sounds, tastes and smells are caused by certain complex configurations of primary qualities -- when such configurations are characterized as powers to produce ideas in us, then they are called "secondary qualities" -- that bear no resemblance whatsoever to the ideas which they cause. Reid is deeply struck by Berkeley's attack on this distinction (at, for instance, Principles of Human Knowledge, Part 1, Sections 9-15), and agrees with Berkeley that no mental state or object could possibly resemble anything that was not, itself, a mental state or object; as Berkeley puts it "An idea can be like nothing but an idea" (Principles of Human Knowledge, Part 1, Section 8). Mental states and objects have only mental properties, but only something that is, itself, a mental state or object can have a mental property; hence, nothing can resemble -- that is, share a property in common with -- a mental state or object other than another mental state or object. Berkeley took this point to show that no non-mental cause of an idea could resemble it, whether the relevant idea were an idea of a shape, say, on the one hand, or a color on the other, and, thus, there could be no distinction between primary and secondary qualities of the sort drawn by Locke.

Reid accepts, for roughly Berkeley's reasons, that sensations cannot possibly resemble their causes (with one qualification regarding visual sensations discussed below). Further, he accepts Berkeley's objections to Locke, and takes them to show that no mental events or states, whether sensations or the conceptions of objects that follow them, could possibly resemble any non-mental object. In addition, there is another reason that Reid cannot draw the distinction between primary and secondary qualities in the way that Locke did: he does not accept that the conceptions of objects which we have following the sensations which they cause in us are to be analyzed as perceptions of ideas; they are, rather, awareness of the qualities in the object that caused the sensations. For Reid, there is no immediately perceived mental object that could succeed or fail to resemble its cause; it is the qualities of objects themselves of which we are directly aware when we have conceptions of those objects. All of this would make it seem that Reid would simply side with Berkeley and deny that there is any important difference between primary qualities and qualities like colors, sounds, tastes and smells. However, he does not take Berkeley's side, but, instead, defends the distinction between primary and secondary qualities on grounds quite different from Locke's, grounds that he takes to be immune to Berkeley's criticisms of the distinction.

Reid accepts that the qualities which we ordinarily conceive objects to have -- whether shapes, sizes and motions, on the one hand, or colors, sounds, tastes and smells, on the other -- are genuinely possessed by those objects (barring illusions and disorders of various sorts, which are, incidentally, difficult for Reid to explain). However, he thinks that shapes, sizes and motions are intrinsic properties of objects while colors, sounds, tastes and smells are relational properties of objects; and, it is to be emphasized, neither (with rare exceptions discussed below) resemble the mental states which they immediately cause in us, namely sensations. Colors, sounds, tastes and smells are powers to produce certain characteristic sensations in us in normal conditions; to ascribe such a quality to an object is not to perceive any intrinsic qualities of the object, but is, rather, to perceive that the object bears a certain relation to something else: namely, ourselves. So, for instance, say that the skin of the apple in front of me has a certain molecular structure that results in its reflecting light at a certain wavelength which in turn causes in me a certain characteristic visual sensation of red. If I am speaking correctly when I say, "That apple is red", I am reporting the fact that I conceive of the apple as possessing a particular relational property: I am aware that the apple has the property of being-such-as-to-cause-in-me-sensations-of-red-in-normal-conditions. Ultimately, the apple possesses this relational property because of facts about its molecular structure that account for its reflecting light in a certain way, and facts about me that account for the fact that such wavelengths of light cause certain sensations in me. But when I am aware of the redness of the apple, I am aware of none of that; I am aware only of the fact that there is something about the apple that makes it cause in me certain sensations in normal conditions.

Our conceptions of qualities such as colors are to be contrasted with our conceptions of primary qualities or configurations of primary qualities, such as hardness. Say I'm holding the apple in my hand while I'm looking at it. I'm having, then, two importantly different sensations: a visual sensation of red, and a tactile sensation of hardness. For Reid, neither sensation resembles anything in the object; both give rise to conceptions of the object as possessing certain properties. The visual sensation gives rise to a conception of the object as possessing a particular relational property: its power to produce certain sensations in me in normal conditions; the tactile sensation gives rise to a conception of the apple as possessing a particular intrinsic property: the complex configuration of primary qualities that is hardness.

So, there is a difference between primary and secondary qualities for Reid, although he draws the distinction in an importantly different way from the way in which it was drawn by Locke. For both Locke and Reid, we are aware of objects as they are intrinsically only when our awareness is caused by the primary qualities of objects. But for Reid, and not for Locke, we are genuinely aware of objects as they are when our awareness results from the secondary qualities of objects; but we are aware of those objects only as they are relative to us, and not as they are in themselves.

Sensation, Natural Signs and Suggestion

The immediate effect that objects have on us is to cause sensations. Further, we become aware of the qualities of objects following the sensations that those objects cause. However, for Reid, the conceptions of objects that follow from our sensations are not derived from our sensations; our sensations, after all, generally do not bear any kind of resemblance to the qualities which cause them. That is, according to Reid, we don't conceive of objects as possessing particular qualities by, say, representing our sensations, or drawing conclusions about the world through some sort of scrutiny of our sensations. Rather, our sensations give rise to our conceptions of objects by a process that he calls "suggestion": the qualities of objects are "suggested" by our sensations and so when we have sensations we come to be aware of those objects as possessing those qualities. But what is suggestion supposed to be?

Suggestion is a pseudo-linguistic notion, for Reid. Signs suggest conceptions of that which they signify. The word "pigs", for instance, leads those who are familiar with the word to think of certain pinkish barnyard animals. However, we don't come to think of such creatures on encountering the word "pigs" by somehow scrutinizing the word and thereby locating, in the world, some object that has some peculiar fitness to the word. After all, the word "pigs" is utterly arbitrary. While there are probably reasons why it came to signify what it signifies, there is no similarity between pigs and the word "pigs": pigs have four legs, for instance, not four letters.

Reid draws a distinction between natural and artificial signs. Artificial signs signify what they signify as a result of some sort of compact or tacit agreement between people: "pigs" signify pigs, according to Reid, only because people have agreed to use a particular sound and a particular configuration of letters to signify pigs. Natural signs, on the other hand, signify what they signify for other reasons entirely. For instance, blushing signifies embarassment only because of the fact that blushing and embarassment are customarily found together. The connection between them, just like the connection between the word "pigs" and pigs, is utterly arbitrary: were it the case that, when embarassed, people stamped their left feet, then the stamping of the left foot would signify embarassment. (In fact, the distinction between natural and artificial signs has a long history. It can be found in, at least, Locke, Hobbes, Gassendi and the Port Royal Logic.)

We discover that blushing is a sign of embarassment through experience in ourselves and others of the co-occurrence of the two states: it is because of our acquaintance with human nature and with the conjunction of blushing and embarassment that we think of embarassment when we encounter blushing. However, some natural signs lead us to think of what they signify without any experience whatsoever. Reid describes this category of natural signs in unhesitatingly mystical terms. He says that there is a category of natural signs

which, though we never before had any notion or conception of the things signified, do suggest it, or conjure it up, as it were, by a natural kind of magic, and at once give us a conception, and create a belief of it. (Inquiry, ch. 5, section 3, p. 60)
Reid has an example in mind of a natural sign which works "magically" in this way: the sensation of hardness. This tactile sensation leads us immediately to conceive of that which caused it as being hard, as having a certain resistive construction. (Reid assumes, perhaps wrongly, that the quality of hardness is a non-relational quality.) But we are aware of this quality, in the object which caused the sensation, automatically, "as it were, by a natural kind of magic". We cannot hope to understand why it is that we think of this special kind of construction after having the right kind of tactile sensation, but must "conclude, that this connection is the effect of our constitution, and ought to be considered as an original principle of human nature" (Inquiry, ch. 5, section 3, p. 61). In fact, this is the defining feature of the kind of natural signs of which the tactile sensation of hardness is an instance: these are signs that lead us to conceive of what they signify simply because we are built in such a way as to have such conceptions on encountering such signs; such a tendency is an inescapable feature of our constitution.

When does one's conception of an object as having a particular quality amount to a perception, a conception accompanied by a conviction of its accuracy? The answer is: when one comes to have that conception because one has encountered a natural sign which leads one to the conception, and that natural sign leads one to the conception merely because of one's constitution. Conviction in the accuracy of a conception is bestowed on the conception, Reid thinks, just when the relevant conception comes about because of our nature or constitution. When we conceive of an object in a particular way merely because it is in our nature to conceive of the object that way, then the conception is non-optional, unavoidable, and is thus one that we cannot help but trust; the conception of an object which one has when one encounters a natural sign which signifies merely because of one's constition is given with one's consititution; we can no more reject it than we can give up our own humanity. Perceptions, then, are dictates of common sense: to be aware of an object in perception is to have a belief which you cannot give up given your constitution.

So, for Reid, in the standard case, a quality of an object impinges on our bodies causing a sensation that has no resemblance whatsoever to the quality. This sensation, in turn, leads us to conceive of the object as having the quality -- and thus to be directly aware of the object as possessing the quality -- merely because we are wired in such a way as to have such a conception after having the sensation; that is what it is for the sensation to "suggest" the conception of the quality. And, further, since the conception comes to be had as a result of our natures as human beings, we cannot help but trust it, and thus we are convinced of its accuracy and can be said to be perceiving the object. However, there are non-standard cases, for there are sensations that do bear a resemblance to -- or, at least, are the rational result of-the qualities which cause them. In particular, certain aspects of visual sensation are like this.

Reid is very impressed by results in geometric optics and holds that while there is no similarity between sensations of color and the quality in objects which cause those sensations, there is a non-arbitrary connection between visual sensations of shape and size and the qualities of objects which cause those sensations. One could rationally determine the shape and size of an object given nothing but a particular visual sensation -- even understood just as a particular impression on the retina -- and the laws of geometric optics, together with a few other pieces of information (such as the distance from oneself to the object). Or, conversely, even a blind person could construct the features of the retinal impression of the shape and size of an object when equipped with information about the actual size and shape of the object, the location of the observer, and the laws of geometrical optics. (This point is controversial. Keith Lehrer presents an alternative interpretation under which Reid holds that not even visual sensations resemble their causes. See Lehrer, Thomas Reid, 1989.) But, visual sensations of shape and size are natural signs not of the actual, but rather of the apparent shape and size of objects: when we encounter a visual sensation, we are immediately aware (that is, aware because of our natures) of the object as having a particular apparent shape and size (and a particular color). Since the actual shape and size are deducible from the apparent shape and size, together with some further pieces of information, we often conceive of the actual shape and size immediately after conceiving of the apparent shape and size. In fact, this movement of the mind from the conception -- that is, perception -- of apparent shape and size to the conception of actual shape and size is so quick, and so hard to notice, Reid thinks, that it is much like, although not in fact, perception. It is not perception, strictly speaking, since it doesn't come to pass merely because of our natures -- and therefore the route through which we come to have the conception doesn't necessarily deliver to us a conviction in the conception's accuracy -- but, rather, in some cases, the conception of actual size and shape comes about through a process of reasoning. He calls such conceptions, in keeping with Berkeley's terminology, "acquired perception".

Our acquired perceptions needn't be, although they sometimes are, acquired through reasoning from those rare sensations -- namely, visual sensations -- that bear a rational relationship to certain qualities of objects -- namely the real size and shape of objects. We sometimes acquire a perception of an object as having a certain quality simply by correlating data from more than one sense. So, for instance, the real size and shape of objects are immediately suggested by our tactile sensations; such sensations are natural signs of those sizes and shapes and signify only because of our constitutions. However, since we often encounter certain visual sensations -- which are natural signs only of the apparent size and shape of objects -- together with tactile sensations, we come to infer that a body that is merely seen would give rise to a certain tactile sensation were it touched, a tactile sensation that is itself a natural sign of the real size and shape of the object. Thus we come to conceive of the object as possessing a particular actual size or shape merely on seeing it despite the fact that our visual sensations are not natural signs of actual size or shape. Since such deliverances of conceptions do not come only from our nature, they do not, in general, bring with them a conviction of their accuracy. Even if we are convinced of their accuracy, such a conviction is not guaranteed by the history of their occurrence, as is the case in direct perception, but comes from some other source.

In summary, then, on Reid's view our minds come to be connected to the world in something like the way that we come to grasp objects through a language designed for the purpose. However, when we come to be aware of objects through our senses, we do so by utilizing something like a language embedded in our constitutions: our sensations function like a language that nature has constructed, and that nature has constructed us to understand, for the purpose of signifying real objects. So while it is in a sense only a metaphor to say that, for Reid, we know about the world because the world speaks to us, it is a metaphor that illuminates the facts as he sees them.

Responding to External World Skepticism

We are now in a position to understand the force of Reid's most important response to any argument purporting to show that the external world either might not exist, or might not be anything like the way we take it to be. In one canonical statement of his position, Reid says,
The sceptic asks me, Why do you believe the existence of the external object which you perceive? This belief, sir, is none of my manufacture; it came from the mint of Nature; it bears her image and superscription; and, if it is not right, the fault is not mine: I even took it upon trust, and without suspicion. Reason, says the sceptic, is the only judge of truth, and you ought to throw off every opinion and every belief that is not grounded on reason. Why, sir, should I believe the faculty of reason more than that of perception? -- they came both out of the same shop, and were made by the same artist; and if he puts one piece of false ware into my hands, what should hinder him from putting another? (Inquiry, ch. 6, section 20, pp. 168-169)
The mistake that the skeptic makes, according to Reid, is to deny the truth of something that is demanded by our constitutions. To perceive an object as possessing a particular property is to have a conception of the object which was, itself, delivered by one's nature. What makes us convinced of the accuracy of the conceptions of objects involved in perception is that they arise from our constitutions. But, asks Reid here, why do we find skeptical arguments so compelling? Why do we accept that skeptical conclusions follows from, for instance, Descartes's hypothesis of the evil demon? Ultimately, we think that such arguments lead to their conclusions because we accept certain logical principles -- such as the law of non-contradiction, or modus ponens -- which appear to us to be self-evident. But to say that such principles are self-evident is just to say that we cannot help but accept them; it is to say only that we are compelled to believe them. But the irresistibility of a belief is a very good indicator, Reid thinks, that we hold that belief merely because of the way we are built, merely because of our constitution. But then the skeptic has merely placed the skeptical conclusion on the same footing as the common sense belief about the external world: both rest on something that we are compelled to believe by our constitutions. However, in order to overthrow common sense, the skeptic must place the skeptical conclusion, rather, on a firmer footing than the common sense conclusion. Thus, the skeptic gives us no reason whatsoever to reject common sense beliefs about the external world.

Reid, therefore, takes himself to have defended common sense through construction of an epistemological model that serves as an alternative to the Lockean view and, he thinks, thereby manages to avoid denial of our conception of ourselves as creatures capable of knowing about a non-mental world directly through our senses, a denial which he takes the work of Berkeley and Hume to show to be the inevitable result of acceptance of the Lockean picture.


Major Works

All are included in The Works of Thomas Reid, D.D..


Secondary Sources

Books and Collections of Articles: Selected Articles:

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Berkeley, George | causation: the metaphysics of | Hume, David | Locke, John | ordinary language | primary and secondary qualities | realism | Scottish Philosophy: in the 18th Century | skepticism

Copyright © 2000 by
Gideon Yaffe
University of Southern California

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First published: August 28, 2000
Content last modified: August 28, 2000