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We might begin by noting that a tree and rock, say, can be
distinguished in terms of their different properties. We might
then go further and insist that this also forms the basis for
ascribing individuality to them. Even two apparently very
similar objects, such as two coins of the same denomination or
so-called identical twins, will display some differences in
their properties - a scratch here, a scar there, and so on. On this
account such differences are sufficient to both distinguish and
individuate the objects. This forms the basis of the so-called
bundle view of individuality, according to which an individual is
nothing but a bundle or properties. On this view, no two
individuals can be absolutely indistinguishable, or indiscernible, in
the sense of possessing exactly the same set of
properties. This last claim has been expressed as the
However, this approach has been criticised on the grounds (among others) that we can surely conceive of two absolutely indistinguishable objects: thinking of Star Trek, we could imagine a replicator device which precisely reproduces an object, such as a coin or even a person, giving two such objects with exactly the same set of properties. Not quite, one might respond, since these two objects do not and indeed cannot exist at the same place at the same time; that is, they do not possess the same spatio-temporal properties. In terms of these properties, then, the objects can still be distinguished and hence regarded as different individuals. Clearly, then, this approach to the issue of individuality must be underpinned by the assumption that individual objects are impenetrable.
A more thorough-going criticism of this property based approach to individuality insists that it conflates epistemological issues concerning how we distinguish objects, with ontological issues concerning the metaphysical basis of individuality. Thus, it is argued, to talk of distinguishability requires at least two objects but we can imagine a universe in which there exists only one. In such a situation, it is claimed, it would be inappropriate to say that the object is distinguishable but not that it is an individual. Although we do not actually find ourselves in such situations, of course, still, it is insisted, distinguishability and individuality should be kept conceptually distinct.
If this line of argument is accepted, then the principle of individuality must be sought in something over and above the properties of an object. One candidate is the notion of substance, in which properties are taken to inhere in some way. Locke famously described substance as a something, we know not what, since to describe it we would have to talk of its properties but bare substance, by its very nature, has no properties itself.
Alternatively, the individuality of an object has been expressed in terms of its haecceity or primitive thisness (Adams 1979). As the name suggests, this is taken to be the primitive basis of individuality, which cannot be analysed further. However, it has also been identified with the notion of self-identity, understood as a relational property (Adams ibid.) and expressed more formally as a=a. Each individual is understood to be identical to itself. This may seem like a form of the property based approach we started with, but self-identity is a rather peculiar kind of property.
This is just a sketch of some of the various positions that have been adopted. There has been considerable debate over which of them applies to the everyday objects mentioned above. But at least it is generally agreed that such objects should be regarded as individuals to begin with. What about the fundamental objects posited by current physical theories, such as electrons, protons, neutrons etc.? Can these be regarded as individuals? One response is that they cannot, since they behave very differently in aggregates from classical individuals.
(1)In classical physics, (3) is given a weight of twice that of (1) or (2), corresponding to the two ways the former can be achieved by permuting the particles. This gives us four combinations or complexions in total and hence we can conclude that the probability of finding one particle in each state, for example, is 1/2. (Note that it is assumed that none of the four combinations is regarded as privileged in any way, so each is just as likely to occur.) This is an example of the well-known Maxwell-Boltzmann statistics to which, it is claimed, thermodynamics was reduced at the turn of the century.
In quantum statistical mechanics, however, there are two standard possibilities: one for which there are three possible arrangements in the above situation (both particles in one box, both particles in the other, and one in each box), giving Bose-Einstein statistics; and one for which there is only one arrangement (one particle in each box), giving Fermi-Dirac statistics. Setting aside the differences between these two kinds of quantum statistics, the important point for the present discussion is that in the quantum case, a permutation of the particles is not regarded as giving rise to a new arrangement. This result lies at the very heart of quantum physics and putting things slightly more formally, it is expressed by the so-called Indistinguishability Postulate:
If a particle permutation P is applied to any state function for an assembly of particles, then there is no way of distinguishing the resulting permuted state function from the original unpermuted one by means of any observation at any time.(The state function of quantum mechanics determines the probability of measurement results. Hence what the Indistinguishability Postulate expresses is that a particle permutation does not lead to any difference in the probabilities for measurement outcomes.)
The argument then continues as follows: that a permutation of the particles is counted as giving a different arrangement in classical statistical mechanics implies that, although they are indistinguishable, such particles can be regarded as individuals (indeed, Boltzmann himself made this explicit in the first axiom of his Lectures on Mechanics). Since this individuality resides in something over and above the intrinsic properties of the particles in terms of which they can be regarded as indistinguishable, it has been called Transcendental Individuality by Post (1963). This notion can be cashed out in various well-known ways, as indicated in the Introduction above: in terms of some kind of underlying Lockean substance (French 1989a), for example, or in terms of primitive thisness (Teller 1995). More generally, one might approach it in modal fashion, through the doctrine of haecceitism: this asserts that two possible worlds may describe some individual in qualitatively the same way (that is, as possessing the same set of properties), yet represent that individual differently by ascribing a different haecceity or thisness in each world, or more generally, by ascribing some non-qualitative aspect to the individual. (Lewis 1986; Huggett 1999).
Conversely, it is argued, if such permutations are not counted in quantum statistics, it follows that quantal particles cannot be regarded as individuals in any of these senses (Post op. cit.). In other words, quantal objects are very different from most everyday objects in that they are non-individuals, in some sense.
This radical metaphysical conclusion can be traced back to the very earliest reflections on the foundations of quantum physics. As Weyl put it in his classic text:
... the possibility that one of the identical twins Mike and Ike is in the quantum state E1 and the other in the quantum state E2 does not include two differentiable cases which are permuted on permuting Mike and Ike; it is impossible for either of these individuals to retain his identity so that one of them will always be able to say I'm Mike and the other I'm Ike. Even in principle one cannot demand an alibi of an electron! (Weyl 1931)Recalling the discussion sketched in the Introduction, if we were to create a twin using some kind of Star trek replicator, say, then in the classical domain such a twin could insist that I'm here and she's there or, more generally, I'm in this state and she's in that one and swapping us over makes a difference. In the classical domain each (indistinguishable) twin has a metaphysical alibi grounded in their individuality. Weyl's point is that in quantum mechanics, they do not.
The particles-and-boxes picture above corresponds to the physicists' multidimensional phase space, which describes which individuals have which properties, whereas the field- theoretic representation corresponds to distribution space, which simply describes which properties are instantiated in what numbers. Huggett has pointed out that the former supports haecceitism, whereas the latter does not and, furthermore,that the empirical evidence provides no basis for choosing between these two spaces (Huggett 1999). Thus the claim that classical statistical mechanics is wedded to haecceitism also becomes suspect.
Secondly, the above argument from permutations can be considered from a radically different perspective. In the classical case the situations with one particle in each box are given a weight of 2 in the counting of possible arrangements. In the case of quantum statistics this situation is given a weight of 1. With this weighting, there are two possible statistics, however: Bose-Einstein, corresponding to a symmetric state function for the assembly of particles and Fermi-Dirac, corresponding to an anti-symmetric state function. Given the Indistinguishability Postulate, it can be shown that symmetric state functions will always remain symmetric and anti-symmetric always anti-symmetric. Thus, if the initial condition is imposed that the state of the system is either symmetric or anti-symmetric, then only one of the two possibilities -- Bose-Einstein or Fermi-Dirac -- is ever available to the system, and this explains why the weighting assigned to one particle in each state is half the classical value. This gives us an alternative way of understanding the difference between classical and quantum statistics, not in terms of the lack of individuality of the particles, but rather in terms of which states are accessible to them (French and Redhead 1988; French 1989a). In other words, the implication of the different counting in quantum statistics is not that the particles are non-individuals in some sense, but that there are different sets of states available to them, compared to the classical case. On this view, the particles can still be regarded as individuals - however their individuality is to be understood metaphysically.
Both of these perspectives raise interesting metaphysical issues. Let us consider, first, Leibniz's famous Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles in the context of the particles- as-individuals package.
Setting aside the historical issue of Leibniz's own attitude, supporters of the Principle have tended to retreat from the claim that it is necessary, to the view that it is at least contingently true. There is the further issue as to how the Principle should be characterised and, in particular, there is the question of what properties are to be included within the scope of those relevant to judgments of indiscernibility. Excluding the peculiar property of self-identity, three forms of the Principle can be distinguished according to the properties involved: the weakest form, PII(1), states that it is not possible for two individuals to possess all properties and relations in common; the next strongest, PII(2), excludes spatio-temporal properties from this description; and the strongest form, PII(3), includes only monadic, non-relational properties. Thus, for example, PII(3) is the claim that no two individuals can possess all the same monadic properties (a strong claim indeed, although it is one way of understanding Leibniz's own view).
In fact, PII(2) and PII(3) are clearly violated in classical physics, where distinct particles of the same kind are typically regarded as indistinguishable in the sense of possessing all intrinsic properties in common and such properties are regarded as non-relational in general and non-spatio-temporal in particular. (Of course, Leibniz himself would not have been perturbed by this result, since he took the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles to ultimately apply only to monads, which were the fundamental entities of his ontology. Physical objects such as particles were regarded by him as merely well founded phenomena.) However, PII(1) is not violated classically, since classical statistical mechanics typically assumes that such particles are impenetrable, in precisely the sense that their spatio-temporal trajectories cannot overlap. Hence they can be individuated via their spatio-temporal properties, as indicated above.
The situation appears to be very different in quantum mechanics, however. If the particles are taken to possess both their intrinsic and state-dependent properties in common, as suggested above, then there is a sense in which even the weakest form of the Principle, PII(1), fails (Cortes 1976; Teller 1983; French 1989b; for an alternative view, see van Fraassen 1985 and 1991). On this understanding, the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles is actually false. Hence it cannot be used to effectively guarantee individuation via the state-dependent properties by analogy with the classical case. If one wishes to maintain that quantum particles are individuals, then their individuality will have to be taken as conferred by Lockean substance, primitive thisness or, in general, some form of non-qualitative haecceistic difference.
Of course, if the particles are taken to be non-individuals, in some still to be articulated sense, then the issue is simply obviated and Leibniz's Principle does not apply. However, what sense can we make of the notion of non-individuality?
Alternatively, but relatedly, non-individuality can be understood in terms of a loss of self- identity. This suggestion can be found most prominently in the philosophical reflections of Born, Schrödinger, Hesse and Post (Born 1943; Schrödinger 1952; Hesse 1963; Post 1963). It is immediately and clearly problematic, however: how can we have objects that are not self-identical? Such self-identity seems bound up with the very notion of an object in the sense that it is an essential part of what it is to be an object. This intuition is summed up in the Quinean slogan, no entity without identity (Quine 1969), with all its attendant consequences regarding reference etc.
However, Barcan Marcus has offered an alternative perspective, insisting on No identity without entity. (Marcus 1993) and arguing that although ... all terms may "refer" to objects... not all objects are things, where a thing is at least that about which it is appropriate to assert the identity relation. (ibid., p. 25) Object-reference then becomes a wider notion than thing-reference. Within such a framework, we can then begin to get a formal grip on the notion of objects which are not self-identical through so-called Schrödinger logics, introduced by da Costa (da Costa and Krause 1994) These are many-sorted logics in which the expression x = y is not a well-formed formula in general; it is where x and y are one sort of term, but not for the other sort corresponding to quantum objects. A semantics for such logics can be given in terms of quasi-sets (da Costa and Krause 1997). The motivation behind such developments is the idea that collections of quantum objects cannot be considered as sets in the usual Cantorian sense of ... collections into a whole of definite, distinct objects of our intuition or of our thought. (Cantor 1955, p. 85.). Quasi-set theory incorporates two kinds of basic posits or Urelemente: m-atoms, whose intended interpretation are the quantal objects and M-atoms, which stand for the everyday objects, and which fall within the remit of classical set theory with Ur- elements. Quasi-sets are then the collections obtained by applying the usual Zermelo- Fraenkel framework plus Urelement ZFU-like axioms to a basic domain composed of m- atoms, M-atoms and aggregates of them (Krause 1992; for a comparison of qua-set theory with quasi-set theory, see Dalla Chiara, Giuntini and Krause 1998).
These developments supply the beginnings of a categorial framework for quantum non- individuality which can be extended into the foundations of Quantum Field Theory, where it has been argued, one has non-individual quanta (Teller 1995). A form of quasi-set theory may offer one way of formally capturing this notion (French and Krause 1999).
Faced with this situation, the anti-realist may conclude so much for metaphysics and insist that all that theories can tell us is how the world could be (van Fraassen 1991). A possible alternative would be for realism to retreat from a metaphysics of objects entirely and develop an ontology of structure compatible with the physics (Ladyman 1998). An early attempt to do this in the quantum context can be seen in the work of Cassirer who noted the implications for our notion of individual objects and concluded that particles were describable only as "points of intersection" of certain relations (1937, p. 180) However, the neo-Kantian elements in Cassirer's structuralist approach may lead one to wonder whether this suggestion actually takes us too far from realism.
Alternatively, it has been argued that the underdetermination can in fact be broken because the package of particles-as-non-individuals meshes better with quantum field theory (QFT) where, it is claimed, talk of individuals is avoided from the word go (Post, op. cit.; Redhead and Teller 1991 and 1992; Teller 1995). The central argument for such a claim focuses on the above view that particles may be seen as individuals subject to restrictions on the sets of states they may occupy. The states that are inaccessible to the particles of a particular kind can be seen as corresponding to just so much surplus structure. In particular, if the view of particles as individuals is adopted, then it is entirely mysterious as to why a particular sub-set of these inaccessible, surplus states, namely those that are non-symmetric, are not actually realised. Applying the general methodological principle that a theory which does not contain such surplus structure is to be preferred over one that does, Redhead and Teller conclude that we have grounds for preferring the non-individuals approach and the afore-mentioned mystery simply does not arise.
This line of argument has been criticised by Huggett on the grounds that the apparent mystery is a mere fabrication: the inaccessible non-symmetric states can be ruled out as simply not physically possible (Huggett 1995). The surplus structure, then, is a consequence of the representation chosen and has no further metaphysical significance. At issue here is the claim that a theory should tell us why a state of affairs is not possible. Consider the possible state of affairs in which a cold cup of tea spontaneously starts to boil. Statistical mechanics can explain why we never observe such a possibility, whereas the quantum-particles-as-individuals view cannot explain why we never observe non- symmetric states (Teller 1998).
However, the analogy is problematic. Statistical mechanics does not say that the above situation never occurs but only that the probability of its occurrence is extremely low. The question then reduces to that of why is this probability so low? The answer to that is typically given in terms of the very low number of states corresponding to the tea boiling compared to the vast number of states for which it remains cold. Why, then, this disparity in the number of accessible states? Or, equivalently, why do we find ourselves in situations in which entropy increases? One answer takes us back to the initial conditions of the big bang. Perhaps a similar line can be taken in the case of quantum statistics. Why do we never observe non-symmetric states? Because that is the way the universe is and we should not expect quantum mechanics alone to have to explain why certain initial conditions obtain and not others. Here we recall that the symmetry of the Hamiltonian ensures that if a particle is in a state of a particular symmetry to begin with, it will remain in states of that symmetry. Hence, if non-symmetric states do not feature in the initial conditions which held at the beginning of the universe, they will remain forever inaccessible to the particles. The issue then turns on different views of the significance of the above surplus structure. (A detailed critique of the presuppositions of the Redhead and Teller argument can also be found in Balousek, forthcoming.)
Furthermore, even if we accept the methodological principle of the less surplus structure the better, it is not clear that QFT understood in terms of non-individual quanta offers a significant advantage in this respect. Indeed, it has been argued that the formalism of QFT is compatible with the alternative package of metaphysically individual particles. van Fraassen has pressed this claim (1991), drawing on de Muynck's construction of state spaces for quantum field theory which involve labelled particles (1975). However, Butterfield has suggested that the existence of states that are superpositions of particle number, within QFT, undermines the equivalence (1993). Nevertheless, Huggett insists, in this case the undermining is empirical, rather than methodological (Huggett 1995). When the number is constant, it is the states for arbitrary numbers of particles which are so much surplus structure and now, if the methodological argument is applied, it is the individuals package which is to be preferred.
The exploration of these concerns in the context of quantum field theory has only just begun (see also Auyang 1995) and a collection of historical and philosophical reflections on relevant issues can be found in Cao (1999).
A further approach to this underdetermination is to reject both packages and seek a third way. Thus Lavine has suggested that quantum particles can be regarded as the smallest possible amounts of stuff and, crucially, that a multi-particle state represents a further amount of stuff such that it does not contain proper parts (1991). Such a view, he claims, avoids the metaphysically problematic aspects of both the individuals and non-individuals packages. Of course, there are then the issues of the metaphysics and logic of stuff, but, he insists, these are familiar and not peculiar to quantum mechanics. One such issue concerns the nature of stuff: is it our familiar primitive substance? Substance as a fundamental metaphysical primitive faces acute difficulties and it has been suggested that it should be dropped in favour of an analysis of individual objects in terms of tropes, where a trope is an individual instance of a property or a relation. If this notion is broadened to include an individual whose existence depends on that of another individual which is not a part of it then, it is claimed, this notion may be flexible enough to accommodate quantum physics (Simons 1998). Another issue concerns the manner in which stuff combines: how do we go from the amounts of stuff represented by two independent photons, to the amount represented by a joint two-photon state? The analogies Lavine gives are well known: drops of water, money in the bank, bumps on a rope (Teller 1983; Hesse 1963). Of course, these may also be appropriated by the non-individual objects view but, more significantly, they are suggestive of a field-theoretic approach in which the stuff in question is the quantum field.
Here we return to issues concerning the metaphysics of quantum field theory and it is worth pointing out that underdetermination may arise here too. In classical physics we are faced with a choice between the view of field quantities as properties of space-time points and the view of the field as a kind of substance or stuff. In the case of quantum field theory, the field quantities are not well-defined at space-time points (because of difficulties in defining exact locational states in quantum field theory). Instead they are regarded as smeared over space-time regions (see Teller 1999). This does not remove the possibility of underdetermination, of course, as it now arises between the understanding of the quantum field in terms of properties of space-time regions and the understanding of the field in terms of substance. However, further issues then arise with regard to the nature of space-time itself. Conceiving of a field in terms of a set of properties meshes comfortably with the approach that takes space-time to be a kind of substance or stuff. This approach faces well known difficulties in the context of modern physics (see, for example, Earman 1989). Unfortunately, the above properties based account of a field is incompatible with the alternative approach to space-time, which takes it to be merely a system of relations (such as contiguity) between physical bodies: if the field quantities are properties of space-time regions and the latter are understood, ultimately, to be reducible to relations between physical objects, where the latter are conceived of in field-theoretic terms, then a circularity appears to arise. If General Relativity is understood as supporting this relationist account of space-time, then we appear to have a significant incompatibility between these two fundamental theories of modern physics (Rovelli 1999). Perhaps, as Stachel has suggested, this incompatibility can be traced back to the sharp, metaphysical distinction between things and relations between things (Stachel 1999). A broadly structural realist approach might offer a way around this incompatibility by regarding both space-time and the quantum field in structural terms (see Auyang 1995).
Such an approach can also be articulated within the particles picture. Returning to the more developed views of both Weyl and Wigner, particles can be understood as ontologically constituted, in group theoretical terms, as sets of invariants, such as rest mass, charge or spin, for example (Castellani 1998a). From this perspective, both the individuality and non-individuality packages get off on the wrong feet, as it were, by taking it that there is something - transcendental individuality - that is present in the one case and lost in the other. The suggestion that particles might be seen as aspects of world structure again fits nicely with structural realism. However, in the absence of further metaphysical explication of the notion of structure itself, it is not yet clear whether or not such an approach collapses into another form of the well known conception of objects as bundles of properties, mentioned in the Introduction.
Excellent overviews of the above and related issues can be found in Huggett (1997) and Castellani (1998b).
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First published: February 15, 2000
Content last modified: February 15, 2000