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Everett's Relative-State Formulation of Quantum Mechanics

Everett's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics is an attempt to solve the measurement problem by dropping the collapse dynamics from the standard von Neumann-Dirac theory of quantum mechanics. The main problem with Everett's theory is that it is not at all clear how it is supposed to work. In particular, while it is clear that he wanted to explain why we get determinate measurement results in the context of his theory, it is unclear how he intended to do this. There have been many attempts to reconstruct Everett's no-collapse theory in order to account for the apparent determinateness of measurement outcomes. These attempts have led to such formulations of quantum mechanics as the many-worlds, many-minds, many-histories, and relative-fact theories. Each of these captures part of what Everett claimed for his theory, but each also encounters problems.


Everett formulated his relative-state interpretation of quantum mechanics while he was a graduate student in physics at Princeton University. His doctoral dissertation (1957a) was recommended for publication March 1957 and a paper reporting the results of his dissertation (1957b) was published in July of the same year. He also published an extended discussion of his relative-state interpretation in the DeWitt and Graham anthology (1973). After graduating from Princeton, Everett worked as a defense analyst. He died in 1982.

Everett's no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics was a reaction to problems that arise in the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse theory. Everett's proposal was to drop the collapse postulate from the standard theory, then deduce the empirical predictions of the standard theory as the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as physical systems described by his theory. It is, however, unclear precisely how Everett intended for this to work. Consequently, there have been many, mutually incompatible, attempts at trying to explain what he in fact had in mind. Indeed, it is probably fair to say that most no-collapse interpretations of quantum mechanics have at one time or another been attributed to Everett.

In what follows, I will describe Everett's worry about the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics and his proposal for solving the problem as it is presented in his 1957 paper. I will then very briefly describe a few approaches to interpreting Everett's theory.

The Measurement Problem

Everett presented his relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics as a way of avoiding the problems encountered by the standard von Neumann-Dirac theory. The main problem, according to Everett, was that the standard theory required observers always to be treated as external to the system described by the theory. One unfortunate consequence of this was that the standard theory could not be used to describe the universe as a whole since the universe is a system containing observers.

In order to understand what Everett was worried about, one must first understand how the standard theory works. The standard von Neumann-Dirac theory is based on the following principles (see von Neumann 1955):

1. Representation of States: The possible physical states of a system S are represented by the unit-length vectors in a Hilbert space (which for present purposes one may regard as a vector space with an inner product). The physical state at a time is then represented by a single vector in the Hilbert space.

2. Representation of Properties: For each physical property P that one might observe of a system S there is an operator P (on the vectors that represent the possible states of S) that represents the property (in a way determined by the following principle).

3. Eigenvalue-Eigenstate Link: A system S determinately has physical property P if and only if P operating on S (the vector representing S's state) yields S. We say then that S is in an eigenstate of P with eigenvalue 1. S determinately does not have property P if and only if P operating on S yields 0.

4. Dynamics: (a). If no measurement is made, then a system evolves continuously according to the linear, deterministic Schroedinger dynamics, which depends only on the energy properties of the system. (b). If a measurement is made, then the system instantaneously and randomly jumps to a state where it either determinately has or determinately does not have the property being measured (according to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link). The probability of each possible post-measurement state is determined by the system's initial state.

It is worth noting that according to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (3) a system would typically neither determinately have nor determinately not have a particular given property (a specific property might be represented by a line in the state space: in order to determinately have the property the state of a system must be parallel to the line, and in order to determinately not have the property the state of a system must be orthogonal to the line, and most state vectors are neither parallel nor orthogonal to any given line). Further, the deterministic dynamics (4a), as we will see below, does nothing to guarantee that a system would either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property when one observes the system to see whether the system has that property. This is why the collapse dynamics (4b) is needed: in the standard theory it is what guarantees that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a property whenever one observes the system to see whether or not it has the property. This is why the standard theory has two dynamical laws: a random, discontinuous one (4b) that describes what happens when a measurement is made and a deterministic, continuous one (4a) that describes what happens the rest of the time.

But what does it take for an interaction to count as a measurement? Unless we know this, the standard theory is at best incomplete, since we do not know when each dynamical law obtains. Moreover, and this is what worried Everett, if we suppose that observers and their measuring devices are constructed from simpler systems that each obey the deterministic dynamics, then the composite systems, the observers and their measuring devices, must evolve in a continuous deterministic way, and nothing like the random, discontinuous evolution described by rule 4b can ever occur. That is, if observers and their measuring devices are understood as being constructed of simpler systems each behaving as quantum mechanics requires (each obeying 4a), then the standard theory is logically inconsistent since it says that together the systems must obey 4b. In order to preserve the consistency of the theory, Everett concluded that the standard theory cannot be used to describe systems that contain observers--it can only be used to describe systems where all observers are external to the described system. This restriction on the applicability of the theory was unacceptable. Everett wanted a theory that could be applied to any physical system whatsoever, one that described observers and their measuring devices the same way that it described every other physical system.

Everett's Proposal

In order to solve the standard theory's measurement problem Everett proposed dropping the collapse dynamics (4b) and taking the resulting theory as providing a complete and accurate description of all physical systems whatsoever. He then intended to deduce the statistical predictions of quantum mechanics (the predictions that depend on rule 4b in the standard theory) as the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as ordinary physical systems within the new theory.

This is what Everett says: "We shall be able to introduce into [the relative-state theory] systems which represent observers. Such systems can be conceived as automatically functioning machines (servomechanisms) possessing recording devices (memory) and which are capable of responding to their environment. The behavior of these observers shall always be treated within the framework of wave mechanics. Furthermore, we shall deduce the probabilistic assertions of Process 1 [rule 4b] as subjective appearances to such observers, thus placing the theory in correspondence with experience. We are then led to the novel situation in which the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic. While this point of view thus shall ultimately justify our use of the statistical assertions of the orthodox view, it enables us to do so in a logically consistent manner, allowing for the existence of other observers." (1973, 9)

Everett's goal then was to show that the memory records of an observer as described by his no-collapse theory would match those predicted by the standard theory with the collapse dynamics. The main problem in understanding what Everett had in mind is in figuring out how this correspondence between the predictions of the two theories was supposed to work.

Suppose that J is a good observer who measures the x-spin of a spin-1/2 system S (spin is a property of fundamental particles and other quantum-mechanical systems; if one specifies a particular axis (like x or z), then a spin-1/2 system will be found, on measurement, to be either "spin up" or "spin down" with respect to the particular axis). For Everett, being a good x-spin observer means that J has the following two dispositions (the arrows below represent the time-evolution described by the deterministic dynamics 4a):

That is, if J measures a system that is determinately x-spin up, then J will determinately record "spin up"; and if J measures a system that is determinately x-spin down, then J will determinately record "spin down" (and we assume for simplicity that the object system is not undisturbed).

Now consider what happens when J observes the x-spin of a system that begins in a superposition of x-spin eigenstates:

The initial state of the composite system then is:
Given J's two dispositions and the fact that the deterministic dynamics is linear, the state of the composite system after J's x-spin measurement will be:
Let's call this state E for Everett. Note that on the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link E is not a state where J determinately records "spin up" neither is it a state where J determinately records "spin down". So in what sense is J's record supposed to agree with the empirical prediction made by the standard theory (which predicts that J will either end up with the determinate record "spin up" or the determinate record "spin down", with probabilities equal to a-squared and b-squared respectively)?

Everett confesses that such a post-measurement state is puzzling: "As a result of the interaction the state of the measuring apparatus is no longer capable of independent definition. It can be defined only relative to the state of the object system. In other words, there exists only a correlation between the states of the two systems. It seems as if nothing can ever be settled by such a measurement." (1957b, 318)

And he describes the problem he faces: "This indefinite behavior seems to be quite at variance with our observations, since physical objects always appear to us to have definite positions. Can we reconcile this feature of wave mechanical theory built purely on [rule 4a] with experience, or must the theory be abandoned as untenable? In order to answer this question we consider the problem of observation itself within the framework of the theory." (1957b, 318)

Then he describes his solution to the determinate-experience problem: "Let one regard an observer as a subsystem of the composite system: observer + object-system. It is then an inescapable consequence that after the interaction has taken place there will not, generally, exist a single observer state. There will, however, be a superposition of the composite system states, each element of which contains a definite observer state and a definite relative object-system state. Furthermore, as we shall see, each of these relative object system states will be, approximately, the eigenstates of the observation corresponding to the value obtained by the observer which is described by the same element of the superposition. Thus, each element of the resulting superposition describes an observer who perceived a definite and generally different result, and to whom it appears that the object-system state has been transformed into the corresponding eigenstate. In this sense the usual assertions of [the collapse dynamics (4b)] appear to hold on a subjective level to each observer described by an element of the superposition. We shall also see that correlation plays an important role in preserving consistency when several observers are present and allowed to interact with one another (to ‘consult’ one another) as well as with other object-systems." (1973, 10)

Everett presents a principle of the fundamental relativity of states: one can say that in state E, J recorded "x-spin up" relative to S being in the x-spin up state and that J recorded "x-spin down" relative to S being in the x-spin down state. But note that this principle alone does not allow Everett to deduce anything like the experiences predicted by the standard collapse theory. The standard theory predicts that on measurement the quantum-mechanical state of the composite system will collapse to either:

when a measurement is made, and that there is thus a single, simple matter of fact about which measurement result J recorded. On Everett's account it is unclear whether J ends up recording one result or the other or somehow both or perhaps neither.

The problem is that there is a gap in Everett's exposition between what he sets out to explain (why observers have precisely the same experiences as predicted by the standard theory) and what he ultimately ends up saying. Since it is unclear exactly how he intends for his theory to explain an observer's (apparently?) determinate measurement records, it is also unclear how he intends to explain why one should expect one's determinate measurement records to exhibit the standard quantum statistics. This gap in Everett's exposition has led to the many mutually incompatible reconstructions of his theory--each can be taken as presenting a different way of explaining how one's records can be determinate (or at least appear to be determinate) in a post-measurement state like E.

The Bare Theory

Albert and Loewer's bare theory (Albert and Loewer 1988 and Albert 1992) is arguably the wildest interpretation of Everett's theory around. On this reading, one supposes that Everett intended to drop the collapse dynamics but to keep the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link.

So how does the bare theory account for J's determinate experience? The short answer is that it doesn't. Rather, on the bare theory, one tries to explain why J would falsely believe that he has an ordinary determinate measurement record. The trick is to ask the observer not what result he got, but rather whether he got some specific determinate result. If the post-measurement state was:

then J would report "I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down." And he would make precisely the same report if he ended up in the post-measurement state:
So, by the linearity of the dynamics, J would falsely report "I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down" when in the state E:
Thus, one might argue, it would seem to J that he got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even when he did not (that is, he did not determinately get "spin up" and did not determinately get "spin down").

The idea is to try to account for all of J's beliefs about his determinate experiences by appealing to such illusions. Rather than predicting the experiences that we believe that we have, a proponent of the bare theory tells us that we do not have many determinate beliefs at all and then tries to explain why we nonetheless determinately believe that we do.

While one can tell several suggestive stories about the sort of illusions that an observer would experience, there are at least two serious problems with the bare theory. One problem is that the bare theory is not empirically coherent: that is, if the bare theory were true, it would be impossible to ever have empirical evidence for accepting it as true. Another is that if the bare theory were true, one would most likely fail to have any determinate beliefs at all (since on the deterministic dynamics one would almost never expect that the global state was an eigenstate of any particular observer being sentient), which is presumably not the sort of prediction one looks for in a successful physical theory (for more details on how experience is supposed to work in the bare theory and some the problems it encounters see Bub, Clifton, and Monton 1998 and Barrett 1994 and 1998).

Many Worlds

DeWitt's many-worlds interpretation is easily the most popular reading of Everett. On this theory there is one world corresponding to each term in the expansion of E when written in the preferred basis (there are always many ways one might write the quantum-mechanical state of a system as the sum of vectors in the Hilbert space; in choosing a preferred basis, one chooses a single set of vectors that can be used to represent a state and thus one chooses a single preferred way of representing a state as the sum of vectors in the Hilbert space). The theory's preferred basis is chosen so that each term in the expansion of E describes a world where there is a determinate measurement record. Given the preferred basis (surreptitiously) chosen above, E describes two worlds: one where J (or perhaps better J1) determinately records the measurement result "spin up" and another where J (or J2) determinately records "spin down".

DeWitt and Graham describe their reading of Everett as follows: "[Everett's interpretation of quantum mechanics] denies the existence of a separate classical realm and asserts that it makes sense to talk about a state vector for the whole universe. This state vector never collapses and hence reality as a whole is rigorously deterministic. This reality, which is described jointly by the dynamical variables and the state vector, is not the reality we customarily think of, but is a reality composed of many worlds. By virtue of the temporal development of the dynamical variables the state vector decomposes naturally into orthogonal vectors, reflecting a continual splitting of the universe into a multitude of mutually unobservable but equally real worlds, in each of which every good measurement has yielded a definite result and in most of which the familiar statistical quantum laws hold." (1973, v)

DeWitt admits that this constant splitting of worlds whenever the states of systems become correlated is counterintuitive: "I still recall vividly the shock I experienced on first encountering this multiworld concept. The idea of 10100 slightly imperfect copies of oneself all constantly spitting into further copies, which ultimately become unrecognizable, is not easy to reconcile with common sense. Here is schizophrenia with a vengeance." (1973, 161)

But while the theory is counterintuitive, it does (unlike the bare theory) explain why observers end up recording determinate measurement results. In the state described by E there are two observers each occupying a different world and each with a perfectly determinate measurement record. There are, however, other problems with the many-worlds theory.

A standard complaint is that the theory is ontologically extravagant. One would presumably only ever need one physical world, our world, to account for our experience. The idea behind postulating the actual existence of a different physical world corresponding to each term in the quantum-mechanical state is that is allows one to explain our determinate experiences while taking the deterministically-evolving quantum-mechanical state to be in some sense a complete and accurate description of the physical facts. But again one might wonder whether the sort of completeness one gets warrants the vast ontology of worlds.

Perhaps more serious, in order to explain our determinate measurement records, the theory requires one to choose a preferred basis so that observers have determinate records (or better, determinate experiences) in each term of the quantum-mechanical state as expressed in this basis. The problem is that not just any old preferred basis will do this--indeed, we presumably do not know what basis would make our experiences and beliefs determinate in every world. Indeed, the right preferred basis would presumably depend on such things as our physiology and experimental practice, so even if we did know which one to choose, this choice of a fundamental part of our most basic physical theory (the part that tells us when worlds split) would have to be contingent on accidents of biology and practice. We tend to think that our physical laws are independent of such accidental features of the world.

Another problem concerns the statistical predictions of the theory. The standard collapse theory predicts that J will get the result "spin up" with probability a-squared and "spin down" with probability b-squared in the above experiment. But the many-worlds theory cannot, as it stands, make any statistical predictions concerning an observer's future experiences. Indeed, the question "What is the probability that J will record the result ‘spin up’?" is strictly nonsense since one cannot identify which of the two future observers is J. The upshot is that one cannot capture the standard probabilistic predictions of quantum mechanics. And the moral is that if one does not have transtemporal identity of observers in a theory, then one cannot assign probabilities to their future experiences.

Many Minds

Everett said that on his formulation of quantum mechanics "the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic" (1973, 9). Albert and Loewer (1988) have captured this feature in their many-minds theory by distinguishing between the time-evolution of an observer's physical state, which is continuous and causal, and the evolution of an observer's mental state, which is discontinuous and probabilistic.

Perhaps the oddest thing about this theory is that in order to get the observer's mental state in some way to supervene on his physical state, Albert and Loewer associate with each observer a continuous infinity of minds. The physical state always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but each mind evolves randomly (with probabilities determined by the particular mind's current mental state and the evolution of the global quantum-mechanical state). On the mental dynamics that they describe, one would expect a-squared of J's minds to end up associated with the result "spin up" (the first term of E) and b-squared of J's minds to end up associated with the result "spin down" (the second term of E). The mental dynamics is also stipulated to be memory preserving.

An advantage of this theory over the many-worlds theory is that there is no physically preferred basis. To be sure, one must choose a preferred basis in order to specify the mental dynamics completely (something that Albert and Loewer never completely specify), but as Albert and Loewer point out, this choice has absolutely nothing to do with any physical facts; rather, it can be thought of as part of the description of the relationship between physical and mental states. Another advantage of the many-minds theory is that, unlike the many-worlds theory, it really does make the usual probabilistic predictions for the future experiences of a particular mind (this, of course, requires that one take the minds to have transtemporal identities, which Albert and Loewer do as part of their unabashed commitment to a strong mind-body dualism).

The main problems with the many-minds theory concern its commitment to a strong mind-body dualism and the question of whether the sort of mental supervenience one gets is worth the trouble of postulating a continuous infinity of minds associated with each observer. Concerning the latter, one might well conclude that a single-mind theory would be preferable (see Barrett 1995).

Many Histories

Gell-Mann and Hartle (1990) understand Everett's theory as one that describes many, mutually decohering histories. The main difference between this approach and the many-worlds interpretation is that, instead of stipulating a preferred basis, here one relies on the physical interactions between a physical system and its environment (the way in which the quantum-mechanical states become correlated) to effectively choose what physical quantity is determinate at each time for each system.

One problem concerns whether and in what sense environmental interactions can select a physically preferred basis for the entire universe, which is what we presumably need in order to make sense of Everett's formulation. After all, in order to be involved in environmental interactions a system must have an environment, and the universe, by definition, has no environment. Another problem is that it is unclear that the environment-selected determinate quantity at a time is a quantity that would explain our determinate measurement records and experience. Proponents who argue for this approach often appeal to biological or evolutionary arguments to justify the assumption that sentient beings must record their beliefs in terms of the environment-selected (or decohering) physical properties (see Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990 and Zurek 1991 for this sort of argument). The short story is that it is not yet clear how the account of our determinate experience is suppose to work when one relies on decoherence to select a preferred basis (see Dowker and Kent 1996 for an extended discussion of some of the problems one encounters in such an approach).

If one allows oneself the luxury of stipulating a preferred basis (a basis where every observer's measurement records are determinate), one can construct a many-histories theory from Albert and Loewer's many-minds theory. One might, for example, take the trajectory of each of an observer's minds to describe the history of a possible physical world. One might then stipulate a measure over the set of all possible histories (trajectories) that would represent the prior probability of each history being ours. Note that since such worlds (and everything in them) would have transtemporal identities, unlike the many-worlds theory, there would be no special problem here in talking about probabilities concerning one's future experience--the quantum probabilities in such a theory might naturally be interpreted as epistemic probabilities.

Relative Facts

Perhaps the approach closest to the spirit of Everett's relative-state formulation would be simply to deny that there are typically any absolute matters of fact about the properties of physical systems or the records, experiences, and beliefs of observers (see Saunders 1995 and Mermin 1997). In the experiment above, J does not end up believing that his result was "spin up", and he does not end up believing that his result was "spin down"; rather, on this sort of theory all facts would be relative. Not relative to a particular world, mind, or history, but relative to each other: here J believes that his result was "spin up" relative to S being x-spin up and J believes that his result was "spin down" relative to S being x-spin down. But, one might ask, what is the state of S then? Well, S is x-spin up relative to J believing that his result was "spin up", etc. Again, on this sort of theory there are typically no absolute matters of fact about the properties of individual physical systems.

So how do we account for our determinate experience? On this approach, one simply denies that there is any simple matter of fact concerning what an observer's experience is. Which means, of course, that insofar as one believes that there really is a simple matter of fact about what one's experiences is, the relative-fact theory provides no account of one's experience. Similarly, one cannot make sense of the usual statistical predictions of quantum mechanics insofar as one takes these to be predictions concerning the probability that a particular measurement outcome will in fact occur. Again, there are typically no such simple facts in such a theory.

It has been argued that since there is no simple matter of fact concerning whether a particular event does or does not occur, quantum mechanics (in fact?) concerns only the probabilistic correlations between events. It seems to me, however, that any coherent talk about the probabilistic correlations between events presupposes that there are determinate matters of fact concerning what events occur (otherwise what are the probabilities probabilities of?).


Such are some of the ways of understanding Everett's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics. It will probably never be entirely clear precisely what Everett himself had in mind, but his goal of trying to make sense of quantum mechanics without the collapse postulate was heroic. And even in light of the problems one faces, puzzling over how one might reconstruct Everett's theory continues to hold promise.


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Jeffrey A. Barrett

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First published: June 3, 1998
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