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Notes to Reichenbach's Common Cause Principle

2. One might wish to
understand the probabilistic relations stated in this principle as a
definition of what a common cause is. However, this is not a
plausible idea. For, consider a case in which A_{1} is a
common cause of A_{2} and A_{3}, while A_{2}
in its turn causes A_{4}, and A_{3} in its turn
causes A_{5}, where A_{4} and A_{5} are
simultaneous. In this case A_{4} and A_{5} will
typically be uncorrelated conditional upon A_{2} (assuming
that A_{2} is the only cause of A_{4}). Moreover, an
occurrence of A_{2} will typically make an occurrence of
A_{4} more likely, and, typically, it will make an occurrence
of A_{5} more likely. Thus A_{2} would count as a
common cause of A_{4} and A_{5} if the above
probabilistic relations were a definition of what it is to be a
common cause. But by assumption A_{2} is not a cause of
A_{5}, and thus not a common cause of A_{4} and
A_{5}. Thus the probabilistic relations that are used to
state Reichenbach's principle of the common cause should not be
regarded as a definition of what a common cause is.

3. Q_{k} is an
indirect cause of Q_{p} exactly when there is a chain of
direct causes starting at Q_{k} and ending at Q_{p}.
Q_{p} is an effect of Q_{k} iff Q_{k} is a
cause of Q_{p} iff Q_{k} is a direct or indirect
cause of Q_{p}.

4. Let me explain how
this follows from the Markov condition using terminology and theorems
from Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines 1993, chapter 3. Let us call a
quantity Q_{c} a ‘forking path common cause’ of quantities
Q_{a} and Q_{b} if and only if there exists a path
that always goes causally downstream from Q_{c} to
Q_{a}, a path that always goes causally downstream from
Q_{c} to Q_{b}, and these paths do not have any
vertices other than Q_{c} in common. Let us now
conditionalize on all the forking path common causes of Q_{a}
and Q_{b}. Claim: Every path from Q_{a} to
Q_{b} will then be inactive. (Paths here are assumed not to
contain any vertex more than once.) Let me indicate how to prove this
claim.

If such a path P starts at Q_{a} going causally downstream,
then it will at some point have to switch to going causally upstream,
since Q_{a} is not a cause of Q_{b}. It will thus
contain a collider. This collider will be inactive since we are not
conditionalizing on it nor on any quantity that is a descendent of
it, since we are conditionalizing only on quantities that are
causally upstream from Q_{a}. (I am assuming that the graphs
are not cyclical.) Thus such a path P will be inactive. Now consider
any path P from Q_{a} to Q_{b} that starts at
Q_{a} going causally upstream. There must be some point
Q_{c} at which point P first starts going causally downstream
(since Q_{b} is not a cause of Q_{a}). There are two
possibilities: P keeps going causally downstream all the way until it
reaches Q_{b}, or it reaches a collider Q_{d} where P
switches back to going causally upstream again. In the first case,
Q_{c} is a common cause of Q_{a} and
Q_{b}. So we have conditionalized on it, so P is inactive. In
the second case, Q_{d} is a collider. There are then 2
subcases: Q_{d} does not lie causally upstream from a forking
path common cause of Q_{a} and Q_{b}, or it does. If
Q_{d} does not lie causally upstream from a common cause,
then it does not lie upstream from a quantity that is conditionalized
upon, so the collider is inactive, so P is inactive. If Q_{d}
does lie causally upstream from a forking path common cause of
Q_{a} and Q_{b}, then there must be a downstream path
P from Q_{d} to Q_{b}. There
are now 2 sub-subcases to consider.

Sub-subcase i: P has no vertices in common with
the part of path P that lies between Q_{a} and
Q_{c}. In that case, Q_{c} is a forking path common
cause of Q_{a} and Q_{b}: to go downstream from
Q_{c} to Q_{a}, follow the part of P that lies
between Q_{c} and Q_{a};to go downstream from
Q_{c} to Q_{b} (without intersecting the path to
Q_{a}), first take the part of P that lies between
Q_{c} and Q_{d}, and then follow P to Q_{b}. So in this case we have
conditionalized upon Q_{c} on P, so P is inactive.

Sub-subcase ii: every downstream path P from
Q_{d} to Q_{b} intersects somewhere with the part of
P that lies between Q_{a} and Q_{c}. Take some such
P, and consider the furthest point Q_{e}
downstream along P at which
P intersects with P between Q_{a} and
Q_{c}. Such a Q_{e} must be a forking path common
cause of Q_{a} and Q_{b}: follow P to get to
Q_{a}, follow P to get to
Q_{b}. Thus we have conditionalized upon Q_{e} which
lies on P. Thus P is inactive.

Thus any path P from Q_{a} to Q_{b} must be inactive
once we have conditionalized upon all forking path common
causes. Thus Q_{a} and Q_{b} are independent
conditional upon a subset of all common causes of Q_{a} and
Q_{b}.

5. The law of conditional independence is not violated by this type of case.

6.
Let me sketch a proof. Any probability distribution that is allowed
by the independence condition can be generated as follows. Assign
some probability distribution over all the determinants outside S. By
assumption this must be a probability distribution that is jointly
independent, i.e. a product of distributions for each such
determinant. Now first look at the set S_{1} of quantities in
S that have no direct causes in S. The probability distribution over
these quantities will be determined by the distribution of their
determinants outside S, and hence be a jointly independent
distribution. Now look at the set S_{2} of quantities all of
whose direct causes in S are in S_{1}. The probability
distribution over any quantity S_{2} is obtained by
multiplying the probability distributions of its direct causes in
S_{1} with the probability distribution of its determinant
outside S. (At least, this is so if all distinct values of direct
causes of Q in S and determinants of Q outside S, determine distinct
values of Q. This may not be so, but this does not affect the
independence claims that I am making here.) And let us continue in
this way with S_{3}, .... until we have a distribution over
all quantities in S. The only correlations in the joint distribution
over quantities in S that will now occur will be between causes and
their effects, and between the effects of a common cause. For
consider any quantities Q_{1} and Q_{2} that are not
so related. They will have no ‘ultimate inputs’ (the determinants
outside S that determine the values of these quantities) in common,
so the sets of ‘ultimate inputs’ for Q_{1} and ‘ultimate
inputs’ for Q_{2} are independent, which entails that
Q_{1} and Q_{2} are themselves independent. Moreover,
the correlations between any two quantities Q_{1} and
Q_{2} that are not related as cause and effect will disappear
when one conditionalizes upon the direct causes of one of them, say
Q_{1}. For the only remaining input into Q_{1} is
independent of anything other than effects of Q_{1}. So
Q_{1} is independent of anything other than effects of
Q_{1} conditional upon the direct causes of
Q_{1}. Hence, the causal Markov condition holds.

Frank Arntzenius

*First published: September 23, 1999 *

*Content last modified: September 23, 1999 *