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By the time Philip became chancellor in 1217, the masters of the various schools in Paris had begun to seek autonomy from the cathedral chapter and had won a number of important concessions by papal decree. In 1215, the papal legate, Robert of Courcon, drew up a number of formal statutes, codifying the de facto practices regarding matters such as the examinations for teaching licenses, accepted dress and behavior, curriculum, and discipline of students. As a result, by the time that Philip became chancellor, at least on paper, it appeared as if the power of his office had been greatly reduced, even with respect to granting the teaching license. For although the chancellor retained the power to grant these licenses, the statutes dictated that he could not turn down anyone the masters deemed fit to teach. But in reality, a long struggle ensued between the masters and the chancellor, who sought to retain his power, beginning with Philip's predecessor (Stephen of Reims) and continuing into much of Philip's own tenure. Finally, in the late 1220s and early 1230s, Philip made his peace with the masters, who had gone on strike and left Paris along with many of their students in response to a conflict with the secular authorities. No doubt recognizing that their departure imperiled the continuing prestige of Paris as a center of education, as well as his own position, Philip worked hard to convince the scholars to return to Paris and reconvene their classes. His efforts were successful, and the masters returned in 1231.
Philip's Summa de bono represents a significant innovation in medieval philosophical work. His use of the good as an organizing principle is a departure from the explicitly theological structure of other well-known texts of the time including Peter Lombard's Sentences and William of Auxerre's Summa aurea. Philip is certainly concerned with theological issues, but unlike the Sentences or the Summa aurea, Philip devotes no significant sections of his work to topics such as God's nature, the Incarnation, or the sacraments. Furthermore, whereas often William's or Lombard's examination of a philosophical issue arises in the context of a larger theological issue, this is not always the case for Philip. For example, in William's Summa aurea, the issues of human action and its freedom arise within a discussion of Adam's fall in the Garden. William raises these issues here because he recognizes that holding Adam responsible for his sin requires that Adam acted freely. Philip places his treatment of free action within an examination of human psychology. It is not until after Philip discusses the character and the powers of the human soul that he gets around to examining theological issues such as the origin and the immortality of the soul. Philip is one of the first major thinkers in the Latin West whose work reflects the influence of the recent influx of newly translated texts from Aristotle and his Arabic commentators, particularly in the area of metaphysics. This may help to explain the distinctive character of his work. Philip's use of Aristotelian metaphysics is especially interesting given that many of Aristotle's metaphysical treatises and work in natural philosophy were officially banned at Paris during the time that Philip was working on Summa de bono.
Not only do these properties transcend the categories and as a result, apply to everything classified by the categories, but they are held to be convertible with each other as well. This could mean one of two things. The transcendentals could be coextensional, so that whatever has being also has unity, truth, and goodness. This leaves open the possibility that the transcendentals are separate and distinct from one another. The second option of the convertibility thesis involves a stronger claim, namely, the idea that the transcendentals differ from one another only in concept, not in reality. Unity, truth, and goodness add nothing to a particular being over and above what is already there; everything that is a being is also one, true, and good in virtue of the very same characteristics. But to describe something as a being and to describe it as, say, good is to express two different things about it since the concept of a being and the concept of a good are two very different concepts. Thus, while being and goodness are extensionally equivalent, they are intensionally distinct.
Philip adopts the second notion of convertibility. The various transcendentals do not differ in reality, only in concept. The concept of being is fundamental in that the concepts of the other transcendentals presuppose it. However, the concepts of all of the other transcendentals add a certain basic notion to the notion of being in order to differentiate them from being. This basic notion is the notion of being that is undivided. Because this is a purely negative notion, it picks out no additional property in reality. The addition of indivision alone yields the concept of unity. To derive the concepts of the true and the good, one adds further the notion of the appropriate cause. The concept of truth involves the idea of the formal cause, that is, the cause in virtue of which matter is enformed, and a thing becomes what it is. Things are true, that is, genuine instances of the kind of thing they are to the extent that they instantiate the form of things of that kind. Thus, the concept of truth is the concept of being that is undivided from a formal cause. Goodness, on the other hand, has to do with being that is undivided from a final cause, that is, a cause that has to do with goals or ends, especially those goals that have been brought to fulfillment. Everything has a particular nature, that is, properties that make that thing a thing of that type. But things can exemplify those properties to a greater or lesser extent. Philip claims that everything has as its goal its own perfection, which means that things move toward exemplifying their specifying characteristics to the greatest extent possible. To the extent that a thing does so, that thing will be good. But that thing will also have being to the same extent. Thus, goodness and being in a given thing coincide in reality, and a thing's goodness adds nothing over and above the thing's being. But of course, goodness and being involve two different concepts. Thus, being and goodness have the same extension while differing intensionally.
It has been argued (by Pouillion and others) that Philip's discussion of the transcendentals in Summa de bono represents the earliest formal treatise on the transcendentals in the history of Western philosophy. About ten years earlier, William of Auxerre also discussed the relationship between being and goodness; he raises the issue of whether being and being good are the same. But in resolving this issue, William never considers the central issue of the transcendentals, the idea that they are extensionally equivalent while intensionally different. It appears that Philip is the first to do so. MacDonald argues that Philip's greater familiarity with the metaphysical works of Aristotle and the Arabic commentators accounts for the startling innovations of his work on the transcendentals. It is likely that Philip encountered the fundamental notion of extensional equivalence and intensional difference in the work of the Arabic commentators of Aristotle; both Avicenna and Averroes argue that unity and being have the same extension while differing conceptually. Philip extends this idea to include not only being and unity, but also the true and the good. Philip's work in turn sets the stage for the development of this topic throughout the thirteenth century, influencing the work of such notable thinkers as Alexander of Hales, Albert the Great, and Thomas Aquinas.
Although Philip denies that the practical intellect and the will are separate powers, he argues for a distinction among the various apprehensive powers. Thus, he sees a genuine distinction between the speculative intellect, the practical intellect, imagination, and the sensory apprehensive powers. This is because what is apprehended by each of these powers is different in nature. Philip denies that any such distinction is present among motive powers. Insofar as the appetite is moved by a sensory apprehension, we call it the sensory appetite. Insofar as the appetite is moved by the judgment of intellect, we call it the will. However, in reality, there is only one motive power to account for both of these sorts of desires, according to Philip. Philip's position on the inseparability of practical intellect and will does not appear to have convinced his thirteenth-century contemporaries or near-contemporaries. Albert the Great in Summa de homine (circa 1245) addresses the arguments given by Philip for his position although as was the custom of the time with respect to one's contemporaries or near-contemporaries, he does not refer to Philip by name. Albert rejects Philip's position, but the fact that Albert examines the issue at all indicates something about the esteem given to Philip's work.
An important part of thirteenth-century psychology was the development of a theory of free action. This was especially important both for theology and for ethics. Medieval thinkers, beginning with Augustine, recognized that moral responsibility requires freedom and so the possibility of that freedom needed to be explained. Along those same lines, they argued that unless human beings are able to act freely, God is not justified in punishing sins. Furthermore, human freedom plays a major role in theodicy; for example, Augustine argues that God is not responsible for the evil found in the world because that evil is perpetuated by the free choices of human beings. Thus, given this background and these commitments, it was common for medieval philosophers to examine the topic of freedom somewhere in their writings. In the first half of the thirteenth century, it was customary to examine these issues in the context of a treatise on what became known as liberum arbitrium. In medieval theories of action in the early part of the thirteenth century, "liberum arbitrium" is a technical term. It is a placeholder for whatever it is that enables human beings to act freely. The term originates in the work of Augustine who wrote a treatise entitled De libero arbitrio. The starting point for thirteenth-century treatises on liberum arbitrium was a definition taken from Peter Lombard's Sentences: "liberum arbitrium is a faculty of reason and will, by which good is chosen with the assistance of grace, or evil, when grace is not there to assist. And it is called liberum with respect to the will, which can be turned toward either [good or bad], while [it is called] arbitrium with respect to reason, as it has to do with that power or faculty to which the discerning between good and evil belongs." Although Lombard's main discussion of liberum arbitrium is found in book two, distinction twenty-five of his Sententiae in IV libris distinctae, this definition is found in the twenty-fourth distinction of book two, chapter three. This definition was commonly but mistakenly attributed to Augustine by commentators in the thirteenth century. Lombard himself does not reveal his source. References to Augustine dominate his discussion of liberum arbitrium which might account for the association of the definition with Augustine.
Philosophers in the early thirteenth century faced the task of how to understand this definition. Although it is obvious from Lombard's formulation that both intellect and will have something to do with liberum arbitrium, their exact relationship is unclear. The phrase "liberum arbitrium" itself contributes to the uncertainty. The first part of the phrase, "liberum," is uncontroversial; it simply means "free." Difficulties arise with respect to the notion of "arbitrium." This notion has both cognitive and appetitive connotations, for it can have meanings as diverse as "judgment," "decision," "wish," or "inclination." It can also refer to a power or ability to make judgments or decisions or to the very agent who makes these judgments or decisions. Thus, the term covers a lot of territory, territory that has to do with both cognitive and appetitive capabilities. Accordingly, it is natural to connect liberum arbitrium with both intellect and will. In writing treatises on liberum arbitrium, thirteenth-century philosophers sought to sort out the connections between intellect and will on the one hand and the production and freedom of human action on the other. Some of these philosophers argued that free action results from the interaction of intellect and will, while others argued that although the intellect is an important precondition for an action's being free, the will is the true instrument that brings about a free action. Still others argued that liberum arbitrium is a separate faculty altogether although it is closely linked with and interacts with the intellect and will in the production of a free action. The practice of writing treatises on liberum arbitrium began to die off toward the later decades of the thirteenth century when philosophers started examining the topic of voluntas libera (free will) instead.
In his treatise on liberum arbitrium in Summa de bono, Philip adopts John Damascene's basic description of action. According to Damascene, an eighth-century patristic, a number of different stages come together in the production of an action. These stages include desiring, considering the various courses of action which will satisfy one's desires, deliberating over those courses of action, judging which one is to be performed, willing and choosing a particular alternative, and initiating the action. Since each of these activities are activities of the will and of the intellect, it follows that actions result from the activities of the will and the intellect. Damascene also claims that each of these stages are performed freely. Because each stage is performed freely, the resulting action is also free.
Philip modifies this position. He thinks that only the final activity of the intellect is performed freely, that is, the final judgment about what course of action to take. This is because Philip thinks that with respect to the previous activities of the intellect, activities such as identifying possible courses of action and deliberating over them, the intellect suffers from certain constraints. These constraints have to do with the structure of the world around us which in turn structures our beliefs. Beliefs play a role in our deliberations over what to do; thus the constraints placed upon beliefs in turn constrain the intellect in its activities. But according to Philip, the intellect retains some freedom for the final judgment about what to do is made freely. Thus, the intellect need not judge that a particular course of action be performed; it could have judged differently. In Philip's view, the will does not suffer from such constraints. The will is an appetite for the good so that whatever it wills, it wills a good. But a thing's being a good is merely a necessary condition, not a sufficient one. A thing's being good does not compel the will's act. Moreover, no judgment of the intellect constrains the will's choice; the will is free either to will the alternative put forth by the intellect or to reject it and will something else. It is because of this capacity of the will that Philip sees the will as the primary source of freedom in a human being. For in the final analysis, it is the will rather than the judgment of the intellect that determines the action the agent performs. Because the will wills freely, the agent performs the action freely. Thus, while both intellect and will have important roles to play in the production of a free action, freedom is primarily a function of the will. Philip's theory of action helps to set the stage for the prominent voluntarist movement that rose later in the thirteenth century with thinkers such as Peter John Olivi and John Duns Scotus.
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First published: March 20, 1999
Content last modified: March 20, 1999