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In contrast to Frege's highly systematic and thoroughly developed work in logic, Peirce's work remains fragmentary and extensive, rich with profound ideas but most of them left in a rough and incomplete form. Three of the Peirce's contributions to logic that are not as well-known as others are described below:
Among Peirce's other contributions to logic are: (i) quantification theory (see Peirce (1885) and Berry (1952)), (ii) propositional logic (see Berry (1952)), (iii) Boolean algebra (see Lewis (1918)), and (iv) Peirce's Remarkable Theorem (see Herzberger (1981) and Berry (1952)).
In his notes, Peirce experiments with three symbols representing truth values: V, L, and F. He associates V with 1 and T, indicating truth. He associates F with 0 and F, indicating falsehood. He associates L with 1/2 and N, indicating perhaps an intermediate or unknown value.
Peirce defines a large number of unary and binary operators on these three truth values. The semantics for the operators is indicated by truth tables. Two examples are given here. First, the bar operator (indicated here by a minus sign) is defined as follows:
x V L F -x F L V
Applied to truth the bar operator yields falsehood, applied to unknown it yields unknown and applied to falsehood it yields truth.
The Z operator is a binary operator which Peirce defines as follows:
Thus, the Z operator applied to a falsehood and anything else yields a falsehood. The Z operator applied to an unknown and anything but a falsehood yields an unknown. And the Z operator applied to a truth and some other value yields the other value.
V L F V | V L F L | L L F F | F F F
The bar operator and the Z operator provide the essentials of a truth-functionally complete strong Kleene semantics for three-valued logic. In addition to these two strong Kleene operators, Peirce defines several other forms of negation, conjunction, and disjunction. The notes also provide some basic properties of some of the operators, such as being symmetric and being associative.
Given relative terms such as friend of and enemy of (more briefly f and e), Peirce studied various operations on these terms such as the following:
A pair <a, b> stands in this relation if and only if if stands in one or both of the relations. In symbols f + e.
(union) friend of or enemy of
A pair <a, b> stands in this relation if and only if if stands in both of the relations. In symbols f . e.
(intersection) friend of and enemy of
A pair <a, b> stands in this relation if and only if there is a c such a is a friend of c and c is an enemy of b. In symbols f ; e.
(relative product) friend of an enemy of
A pair <a, b> stands in this relation if and only if a is the friend of every object c that is the enemy of b. In symbols f , e (Peirce uses a dagger rather than a comma)
(relative sum) friend of every enemy of
A pair <a, b> stands in this relation if and only if <a, b> does not stand in the friend-of relation. In symbols -f (Peirce places a bar over the relative term).
(complement) is not a friend of
A pair <a, b> stands in this relation if and only if b is a friend of a. In symbols ~f (Peirce places an upwards facing semi-circle over the relative term).
(converse) is one to whom the other is friend
Peirce presented numerous theorems involving his operations on relative terms. Examples of the numerous such laws identified by Peirce are:
Peirce's calculus of relations has been criticized for remaining unnecessarily tied to previous work on Boolean algebra and the equational paradigm in mathematics. It has been frequently claimed that real progress in logic was only realized in the work of Frege and later work of Peirce in which the equational paradigm was dropped and the powerful expressive ability of quantification theory was realized.
~(r + s) = ~r + ~s -(r ; s) = -r , -s (r . s) , t = (r , s) . (r , t)
Nevertheless, Peirce's calculus of relations has remained a topic of interest to this day as an alternative, algebraic approach to the logic of relations. It has been studied by Lowenheim, Tarski and others. Lowenheim's famous theorem was originally a result about the calculus of relations rather than quantification theory, as it is usually presented today. Some of the subsequent work on the calculus of relations is outlined in Maddux (1990).
The alpha portion of the system of existential graphs is concerned with propositional logic. Conjunction is indicated by juxtaposing graphs next to one another. Negation is indicated by enclosing a graph within an enclosed circle or other closed figure, which Peirce calls a cut. Here (and occasionally in Peirce's writings) cuts will be indicated by matching parentheses. So
(P)is equivalent to not P, and
(P(Q))is equivalent to if P then Q. Observe that this is the same graph as
((Q)P)because order is irrelevant. Juxtaposition and enclosure are the only relevant logical operations. Peirce provides five elegant rules of inference that form a complete set. The rules are Insertion in Odd, Erasure in Even, Iteration, Deiteration, and Double Cut.
Insertion in Odd
Any graph can be added to an area enclosed within an odd number of cuts.
The following table gives some examples of this rule:
In the first case from not not B, If A then B is obtained. In the second case from If A, then if B then C, If A, then if B then both C and D is obtained. In the third case from not A, If A then B is obtained.
((B)) (A (B (C))) (A) ((B)A) (A (B (C D))) ((B)A)
Erasure in Even
Any graph can be erased that occurs within an even number of cuts.
The following table gives some examples of this rule:
In the first case from if A then B, if A then true is obtained. In the second case from If A, then if B then C, if A, then not C is obtained. In the third case from not A and B, B is obtained.
(A(B)) (A (B (C))) B(A) (A( )) (A ( (C))) B
Any graph can be recopied to any other area that occurs within all the cuts the original occurs within.
Here are some examples of Iteration:
In the first case from if A then B, if A then both A and B is obtained. In the second case from If not A then B, if not A then both B and not A is obtained. In the third case from B and not A, B and not A and B and not A is obtained.
(A(B)) ( (A) (B) ) B(A) (A(AB)) ( (A) (B(A)) ) B(A)B(A)
Any graph that could have been obtained by iteration can be erased.
Here are some examples of Deiteration:
These are just the exact converses of the examples of Iteration.
(A(AB)) ( (A) (B(A)) ) B(A)B(A) (A(B)) ( (A) (B) ) B(A)
Two cuts can be put immediately around any graph, and two cuts immediately around any graph can be erased.
Here are some examples of Double Cut:
From if A then B, if not not A, then B is obtained. From not A, not not not A is obtained. From not not B and not A, B and not A is obtained.
(A(B)) (A) ((B))(A) (((A))(B)) (((A))) B(A)
A proof of modus ponens:
P (P(Q)) premises: (i) if P then Q. (ii) P P ( (Q)) Deiteration P Q Double Cut Q Erasure in Even
A proof of if A, then if B then A:
(( )) Double Cut (A( )) Insertion in Odd (A( A )) Iteration (A( ((A)) )) Double Cut (A( (B(A)) )) Insertion in Odd
A proof of if not B then not A from if A then B:
(A(B)) premise ( ((A)) (B)) Double Cut
Finally, a proof of if A then C from if A then B and if B then C:
(A(B)) (B(C)) premises (A( B (B(C)) )) (B(C)) Iteration (A( B (B(C)) )) Erasure in Even (A( B ( (C)) )) Deiteration (A( B C )) Double Cut (A(C)) Erasure in Even
The beta portion of Peirce's system of existential graphs is equivalent to first-order logic with identity. It does not use variables to fill the argument places of predicates. Instead, the argument places are filled by drawn lines. Two or more such argument places can be identified (analogous to filling them with the same variable) by connecting them with a drawn line. These lines of identity play the role of quantifiers as well as variables. The order of interpretation of the various lines of identity and cuts of a beta graph is determined by the portions of lines of identity that are enclosed within the fewest cuts. Elements enclosed by fewest cuts are interpreted before more deeply embedded elements. Rules of inference for the beta portion are generalizations of the rules for the alpha portion. They allow lines of identity to be manipulated in various ways, such as erasing portions of lines connecting loose ends, extending loose ends, and retracting loose ends. More information about the beta portion of the system of existential graphs can be found in Roberts (1973).
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First published: December 15, 1995
Content last modified: October 17, 2002