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The term morality can be used either
Morality is an unusual word. It is not used very much, at least not without some qualification. People do sometimes talk about Christian morality, Nazi morality, or about the morality of the Greeks, but they seldom talk simply about morality all by itself. Anthropologists used to claim that morality, like law, applied only within a society. They claimed that morality referred to that code of conduct that is put forward by a society. This account seems to fit best those societies that have no written language, where often no distinctions are made among morality, etiquette, law, and religion. But even for anthropologists morality does not often mean simply code of conduct put forward by a society. Often, morality is distinguished from etiquette, law, and religion, all of which provide codes of conduct put forward by a society.
Etiquette is sometimes included as a part of morality, but it applies to behavior that is considered less serious than the kinds of actions to which morality usually applies. Law is distinguished from morality by having explicit rules, penalties, and officials who interpret the laws and apply the penalties, but there is often considerable overlap in the conduct governed by morality and that governed by law. Religion differs from morality in that it includes stories, usually about supernatural beings, that are used to explain or justify the behavior that it requires. Although there is often a considerable overlap in the conduct required by religion and that required by morality, morality provides only a guide to conduct, whereas religion always contains more than this. When morality is used simply to refer to a code of conduct put forward by a society, whether or not it is distinguished from etiquette, law, and religion, then it is being used in a completely descriptive sense.
When morality is used in this descriptive way, moralities can differ from each other in their content and in the foundation that members of the society claim their morality to have. A society might have a morality that is primarily concerned with practices not related to other persons, e.g., which days must be devoted to certain rituals, and might claim that their morality, which is concerned primarily with ritual, is based on the commands of God. Or a society might have a morality that is concerned primarily with sexual practices, and claim that their morality, which has this concern, is based on human nature. Or a society might regard morality as being concerned primarily with practices that minimize the harms that people suffer and claim that their morality, which has this concern, is based on reason. Many societies have moralities that are concerned with all of the above and that are claimed to have all three of the above foundations. But, in this sense of morality, regardless of its content, or the justification that those who accept the morality claim for it, the only universal features that all moralities have is that they are put forward by a society and they provide a guide for the behavior of the people in that society. In this sense of morality, morality might allow slavery or might allow some people with one skin color to behave in ways that those with a different skin color are not allowed to behave. In this sense of morality, it is not even essential that morality incorporate impartiality with regard to all moral agents, those people whose behavior is subject to moral judgments, or that it be universalizable in any significant way.
Although most philosophers do not use morality in this purely descriptive sense, some philosophers do. Ethical relativists are interested in these different moralities and claim that they are only kind of morality there is. [Edward Westermarck, Ethical Relativity] They deny that there is any universal normative morality. Ethical relativists are not merely, or even primarily, making a linguistic claim about the proper use of the English word, morality. However, they hold that only when the term morality is used in this descriptive sense is there something that it actually refers to, namely, a code of conduct put forward by a society. They claim that if morality is taken to refer to a universal code of conduct that would be endorsed by all rational persons, then there is no referent for the term morality. Although ethical relativists admit that many speakers of English use morality to refer to such a universal code of conduct, they claim such persons are mistaken in thinking that there is anything that is the referent of that sense of the word. Ethical relativists are primarily concerned with denying that there is any universal morality that should be used by people in all societies to guide their own conduct and to make judgments about the conduct of others.
When morality refers to the codes of conduct of different societies, the features that are essential are that morality is a code of conduct that is put forward by a society and that it is used as a guide to behavior by the members of that society. In this descriptive sense, morality can refer to codes of conduct of different societies with widely differing content, and still be used unambiguously. However, there are now other descriptive senses of morality. In the sense most closely related to the original descriptive sense, morality refers to a guide to behavior put forward by some group other than a society, for example, a religious group. When the guide to conduct put forward by a religious group conflicts with the guide to conduct put forward by a society, it is not clear whether to say that there are conflicting moralities, or that the code of the religious group conflicts with morality. People who are members of that society and also members of the religious group, might differ with regard to the guide that they accept. They are likely to regard the guide they accept as the true morality.
In small homogeneous societies people do not belong to groups which put forward guides to behavior that conflict with the guide put forward by their society. There is only one guide to behavior that is accepted by all members of the society and that is the code of conduct that is put forward by the society. For such societies there is no ambiguity about which guide morality refers to. However, in those large societies where people often belong to groups that put forward guides to behavior that conflict with the guide put forward by their society, they do not always accept the guide put forward by their society. If they accept the conflicting guide of some other group to which they belong, often a religious group, rather than the guide put forward by their society, they will not regard the guide put forward by their society as a true or genuine morality.
This reveals an ambiguity in the original descriptive sense of morality that has two essential features: that morality is a code of conduct that is put forward by a society and that it is used as a guide to behavior by the members of that society. This ambiguity was not recognized because of the concentration on small homogeneous societies. Does morality refer only to those guides to conduct put forward by a society, or does it refer to guides to conduct put forward by other groups as well? There is another related ambiguity if the code of conduct put forward by a society is not used as a guide to behavior by the members of that society. Which of these essential features is most essential? The recognition that people in a society do not always accept the code of conduct that is put forward by their society presents problems for the descriptive sense of morality as the code of conduct put forward by a society and which used as a guide to behavior by the members of that society.
However, it is not useful to adopt a definition of morality as meaning the code of conduct accepted by the members of a society because in many large societies, not all members of the society accept the same code of conduct. Nor is it useful to adopt a somewhat more general definition of morality as the code of conduct accepted by the members of a group because it is not only always possible, it is often the case, that not all members of any group accept the same code. A natural outcome of these problems is to switch attention from groups to individuals. If what is important is what code of conduct people accept, and members of a group do not always accept the same code of conduct, then why be concerned with groups at all?
This consideration leads to a new descriptive sense of morality. morality is taken to mean that guide to behavior that is regarded by an individual as overriding and that he wants to be universally adopted. [See R. M. Hare, Moral Thinking] In this sense of morality, it refers to a guide to behavior accepted by an individual rather than that put forward by a society or any other group. But morality does not refer to just any guide to behavior accepted by an individual, it is that guide to behavior that the individual adopts as his overriding guide, and wants everyone else to adopt as their overriding guide as well. This sense of morality is a descriptive sense, because a person can refer to an individual's morality without endorsing it. In this sense, like the original descriptive sense, morality has no limitations on content. Whatever guide to behavior an individual regards as overriding and wants to be universally adopted is that individual's morality.
When people explicitly talk about the morality of a group other than their own or of a person other than themselves, it is usually clear that they are using morality in a descriptive sense. However, when a person simply claims that morality prohibits or requires a given action, then the term morality is genuinely ambiguous. It is not clear whether it refers to (1) a guide to behavior that is put forward by a society, either his own or some other society; (1a) a guide that is put forward by a group, either one to which he belongs or another; or (1b) a guide that a person, perhaps himself, regards as overriding and wants adopted by everyone else, or (2) is a universal guide that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. When a person uses morality to refer to a guide to conduct put forward by a group, unless it is his own group, it is usually only being used in its descriptive sense. No one referring to morality in that sense of morality need be endorsing it. When morality refers to a guide to conduct accepted by an individual, unless that individual is himself, it is usually being used in its descriptive sense. However, if the individual is referring to his own morality, he is endorsing it. Only (2) is always the normative sense of morality, but a person might hold that the morality referred to in (1), (1a), or (1b) is also the morality referred to in (2).
Some philosophers have put forward a sense of morality that seems to be a simple variation of (1b). In this sense, morality is a guide that a person, perhaps himself, regards as overriding, but need not want adopted by everyone else. In this technical philosophical sense of morality, ethical egoism, the view that one ought to take as one's own self-interest as the overriding guide to behavior, is a morality. Sidgwick regarded egoism as one of the methods of ethics and, following Plato and Aristotle, ethics is sometimes taken as referring to a guide to behavior that an individual adopts as his own guide to life. However, in any normal sense of morality, morality cannot be a guide to behavior that a person wants others not to adopt. There is a sense of morality such that it does refer to a code of conduct adopted by an individual for his own use, but which he does not claim should be adopted by anyone else. However, this is correctly referred to as morality only when the individual would be willing for everyone else to adopt that code of conduct, but does not require that they do so, nor does he judge them to be immoral if they do not adopt it.
When morality is used in its universal normative sense, it need not have either of the two features that are essential to moralities referred to by the original descriptive sense: that it be a code of conduct that is put forward by a society and that it be used as a guide to behavior by the members of that society. Indeed, it is possible that morality in the normative sense has never been put forward by any particular society, by any group at all, or even by any individual who regards it as overriding. morality is thus an ambiguous term, the features that account for what it refers to in any of the descriptive senses are not the features that account for what it refers to in its normative sense. The only feature that the descriptive and normative senses of morality have in common is that they refer to guides to behavior.
Those people who claim that there is a universal morality claim that it is a code of conduct that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. They need not hold that every society has a code of conduct that has those features that they claim morality must have. They can admit that the guides to behavior of some societies lack so many of the essential features of morality that these societies do not even have a morality. They can also admit that many, perhaps most, societies have defective moralities, that although their guides to behavior have enough of the features of morality to be classified as moralities, they also lacks some essential features. Although those who hold that morality is universal do not claim that any actual society has or has ever had a guide to conduct that has all of the essential features of morality, they do not deny it either. They do claim that it is possible for any normal adult in any society to know what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. They also claim that morality applies to all of these persons, not only those now living, but also those who lived in the past. These are not empirical claims about morality, they are claims about what is essential to morality, or about what is meant by morality when it is used normatively.
On all accounts of morality, it is a code of conduct. However, on ethical or group relativist accounts or on individualistic accounts, morality has no special content or features that distinguishes it from nonmoral codes of conduct, such as law or religion. Just as a legal code of conduct can have almost any content, as long as it is capable of guiding behavior, and a religious code of conduct has no limits on content, all of the relativist and individualist accounts of morality, have no limit on the content of a moral code. However, for those, such as Hobbes, Kant, and Mill, who hold that morality is a code of conduct that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents, it has a fairly definite content. Although Kant, in accordance with the German word used to translate the English word morality, regards morality as applying to behavior that affects no one but the agent, he recognizes that it is commonly related to behavior that affects other people. Hobbes, Bentham, Mill, and most other philosophers writing in English limit morality to behavior that, directly or indirectly, affect others.
Although there are other significant differences between those philosophers who use morality to refer to a universal guide that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents, there are significant similarities. For all of these philosophers, such as Kurt Baier, Phillipa Foot, and Geoffrey Warnock, morality prohibits actions such as killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises. For some, morality also requires charitable actions, but it does not require a justification for not being charitable on every possible occasion in the same way that it requires a justification for any act of killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises. For others, morality only encourages charitable actions, and no justification is ever needed for not being charitable. Rather, being charitable is supererogatory: it is always morally good to be charitable, but it is not morally required to be charitable.
On all of the accounts of morality as a universal guide that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents, it is concerned with promoting people living together in peace and harmony, not causing harm to others, and helping them. For most philosophers, the prohibitions against causing harm, directly or indirectly, are not taken as absolute. However, unlike most kinds of actions, a justification is needed for violating the prohibitions in order to avoid acting immorally. Some philosophers who hold a strict deontology, such as Kant, hold that it is never justified to do some of these kinds of actions. Those who hold that the principle of utility provides the foundation of morality, such as Mill, hold that it is justified to violate moral rules only when the overall direct and indirect consequences would be better. However, all those who use morality in its normative sense agree that the kinds of actions that directly or indirectly harm other people are the kinds of action with which morality is concerned.
The Natural Law tradition, from the Greeks to the present day, explicitly holds that all rational persons know what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. They also hold that reason endorses acting morally. Some hold that it is irrational to act immorally, but all hold that it is never irrational to act morally. Even religious thinkers in this tradition, such as Aquinas, hold that morality is known to all those whose behavior is subject to moral judgment, whether or not they know of the revelations of Christianity. Hobbes, who is in the natural law tradition, accepts all of the standard moral virtues, but complains that the writers of moral philosophy, though they acknowledge the same virtues and vices, yet not seeing wherein consisted their goodness, nor that they come to be praised as the means of peaceable, sociable, comfortable living, place them in the mediocrity of the passions. (Leviathan, Chapter 15, paragraph 40) The differences between those philosophers who hold that there is a universal morality is primarily about the foundation of morality, not about its content.
Neither Kant nor Mill regarded themselves as inventing or creating a new morality. Rather both of them, like Hobbes, regarded themselves as providing a justification for the morality that is accepted by all. Mill explicitly says:
The intuitive, no less than what may be termed the inductive school of ethics, insists on the necessity of general laws. They both accept that the morality of an individual action is not a question of direct perception, but of the application of a law to an individual case. They recognize also, to a great extent, the same moral laws; but differ as to their evidence, and the source from which they derive their authority. (Utilitarianism, Chapter 1, paragraph 3)
According to Mill, Utilitarianism provides the foundation for morality. It explains and justifies the moral rules that are accepted by all. Kant also regards himself as performing the same task, explaining and justifying a universal moral consciousness.
Some contemporary consequentialists claim that morality requires doing that act that would result in the best overall consequences. Others claim that morality requires following that rule that would result in the best overall consequences if everyone followed or accepted it. Since different consequentialists differ in their views about what consequences count as best, consequentialism does not provide a guide to conduct such that everyone knows what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. Of course, consequentialists think that there is a correct answer to the question about what counts as the best consequences, but they may not realize the importance of the fact that until that correct answer is found no one knows the kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. Most consequentialists also hold that morality is universal, that it applies to all normal adult human beings. However, since not all normal adult human beings agree on what counts as the best consequences, morality no longer has an essential feature, namely, that all those who are subject to moral judgment know what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. Some consequentialists are not concerned with this normative sense of morality, but only with that guide to conduct that results in the best overall consequences. Others claim that morality does not have as an essential feature that all those subject to it know all of the kinds of actions it prohibits, etc. For them it is sufficient for morality to be that guide to behavior that leads to the best overall consequences.
In trying to provide a definition of the traditional normative sense of morality, I find it useful to regard morality as a public system. I use the phrase, public system to refer to a guide to conduct such that (1) all persons to whom it applies, all those whose behavior is to be guided and judged by that system, know what behavior the system prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows; and (2) it is not irrational for any of these persons to accept being guided and judged by that system. The paradigm examples of public systems are card games such as bridge or poker, or athletic games such as baseball, football, and basketball. Although a game is a public system, it applies only to those playing the game. Although, occasionally, someone may participate in a game without knowing its point or all of the rules that apply to those playing the game, the standard case is that all do know the point of the game as well as all of the relevant rules. If a person does not care enough about the game to abide by the rules, she can usually quit. Morality is the one public system that no rational person can quit. This is the point that Kant, without completely realizing it, captured by saying that morality is categorical. Morality applies to people simply by virtue of their being rational persons.
Since the normative sense of morality refers to a universal guide to behavior that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents, it is important to provide at least a brief account of what is meant by rational person. In this context, rational person is synonymous with moral agent and refers to those persons to whom morality applies. This includes all normal adults with sufficient knowledge and intelligence to understand what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows, and with sufficient volitional ability to use morality as a guide for their behavior. Such persons must also seek to avoid any harm to themselves unless they believe that their action will result in someone, themselves or others, avoiding a comparable harm, or gaining a compensating good. People lacking these characteristics are not subject to moral judgment. If they lack them only temporarily, they might be excused from moral judgments in those cases.
The following definition of morality incorporates all of the essential features of morality as a guide to behavior that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. Morality is an informal public system applying to all rational persons, governing behavior thataffects others, and has the lessening of evil or harm as its goal. In order to show that this definition incorporates all of the essential features of morality, I shall explain how the various parts of the definition incorporate these features.
To say that morality is a public system incorporates the essential feature that everyone who is subject to moral judgment knows what kinds of actions it prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. It also guarantees that it is never irrational to act morally. That morality applies to all rational persons makes clear that the sense of morality being defined is that guide to conduct that applies to all rational persons. It would take considerably more space than is appropriate here to show that defining morality as a public system that applies to all rational persons also results in morality being a universal guide to behavior that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. I should make clear that the claim that all rational persons would put forward this system only follows if limitations are put on the beliefs that rational persons can use and if they are attempting to reach agreement with similarly limited rational persons.
To say that morality is an informal system means that it has no authoritative judges and no decision procedure that provides unique answers to all moral questions. When it is important that disagreements be settled, societies use political and legal systems to supplement morality. These formal systems have the means to provide unique answers, but they do not provide a moral answer to the question. Rather, the question, being regarded as morally unresolvable, is transferred to the political or legal system. An important example of such a moral question is whether, and if so under what conditions, to allow abortion. There is continuing disagreement about this moral question, even though the legal and political system in the United States has provided fairly clear guidelines about the conditions under which abortion is allowed. Despite this important and controversial issue, morality, like all informal public systems, presupposes overwhelming agreement on most moral questions. No one thinks it is morally justified to cheat, deceive, injure, or kill simply in order to gain sufficient money to take a fantastic vacation. In the vast majority of moral situations, given agreement on the facts, no one disagrees, but for this very reason, these situations are never discussed. Thus, the overwhelming agreement on most moral matters is often overlooked.
The claim that morality governs behavior that affects others is somewhat controversial. Some have claimed that morality governs behavior that affects only the agent herself. Examples of behavior that supposedly affects only oneself, often include taking recreational drugs, masturbation, and developing one's talents. The German word for morality does include behavior that affects only the agent herself, and Kant may provide an accurate account of the German concept of morality. This concept of morality is more closely tied to its religious origin. However, the English concept of morality is more completely secular and almost all who distinguish morality from religion regard morality as governing only that behavior that directly or indirectly affects others. It is likely that regarding self-affecting behavior as governed by morality is a holdover from the time when morality was not clearly distinguished from religion. This religious holdover might also affect the claim that some sexual practices such as homosexuality are immoral, but those who distinguish morality from religion do not regard homosexuality, per se, as a moral matter. Almost all American colleges and universities prohibit discrimination against homosexuals, which strongly suggests that they agree that only behavior that adversely affects others counts as immoral.
The final characteristic of morality -- that it has the lessening of evil or harm as its goal -- is also somewhat controversial. The Utilitarians talk about producing the greatest good as the goal of morality. However they include the lessening of harm as essential to producing the greatest good and almost all of their examples involve the avoiding or preventing of harm. The paradigm cases of moral precepts involve rules which prohibit causing harm directly or indirectly, such as rules prohibiting killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises. Even those precepts that require or encourage positive action, such as helping the needy, are almost always related to preventing or relieving harms. An examination of the paradigm examples of moral precepts make it clear that all of them involve the lessening of harms. It would be possible to include these paradigm examples of moral precepts in the definition of morality. This addition would make explicit that the normative sense of morality refers to that guide to behavior that we all regard as morality, but it not necessary to do so, because the proposed definition is sufficient to guarantee that these paradigm moral precepts will be part of the moral system.
Dictionary definitions of referring terms are usually just descriptions of the essential features of the referents of those terms. Insofar as all the referents of a term share the features that account for why that term refers to those referents, the term is not regarded as ambiguous. morality is an ambiguous term. Unlike the descriptive definitions of morality discussed earlier, which do not have any implications about how a person should behave, this normative definition of morality does have such implications. Hence it is not surprising that it is controversial. Agreeing to this definition commits a person to regarding some behavior as immoral, perhaps even behavior that he is tempted to perform. Although this definition allows as meaningful the question, Why should I be moral?, it guarantees that there is an answer that shows that it is not irrational to be moral, even though it may not show that it is irrational to be immoral. This definition also explains why we want others to act morally and why others want us to act morally. It thus does what definitions of referring terms are supposed to do: it clarifies this term's relationship to other terms with which it is related, and explains why we use the word in the way that we do.
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First published: April 17, 2002
Content last modified: April 17, 2002