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Supplement to Mohism

Influence of Social Origins on Mohist Thought

The Mohists’ social background distinguishes them from most other early Chinese thinkers, who seem to have been mainly members of privileged social groups, typically hereditary officials, government administrators, or ritual priests. Indeed, as Graham (1989) observes, their low social origins help to explain why the Mohists make no use of the paradigmatic moral contrast of Confucian ethics, that between the junzi and xiao ren, terms that in Confucian usage carried a moral connotation ("noble man" vs. "petty man") but originally referred to social rank ("princeling" or "gentleman" vs. "commoner"). It may also help to explain the Mohists’ frequent criticisms of the misguided judgments of the junzi, many of whom they probably regarded as ethically shortsighted conformists. For the Mohists, as for the Confucians, virtuous role models play an important part in moral education and practical reasoning. To the Mohists, however, the exemplary individual is typically not the junzi, but the ren ren (humane man or man of goodwill), a term with no class overtones.

A corollary of these conjectures about their social origins is that Mo Di and many of his early followers -- including both the Mozi writers and their primary audience -- may have had little formal education and would have been relatively unversed in the classical Chinese written language. This suggestion would help to explain the characteristic style of the core Mohist doctrinal essays, most of which are written in a simple, highly repetitive manner well suited to memorization and oral delivery, yet distinctive in the early Chinese literature for its ponderousness and inelegance. (An anecdote in the Hanfeizi claims that the Mohist writing style was deliberate, because Mozi feared that even in rhetoric, ornamentation tended to interfere with utility.) Parts of the text also show signs of having been composed in a colloquial dialect rather than the more terse, graceful written classical language.

The Mohists’ social origins probably played a role in motivating certain basic features of their thought, particularly their focus on finding objective ethical standards. For the Ru (Confucians), the traditional social roles and ritual etiquette of the waning Zhou dynasty provide a basis for consensus in ethical judgments. The Mohists identify far less with these traditional mores and so seek other ethical guidelines. Moreover, they think that the warfare and strife that blight their era result from errors in moral judgment. Since some of those responsible for this disorder claim to be following traditional mores, such norms are clearly not a reliable source of ethical guidance. Hence the Mohists propose to judge practices not by whether they conform to the traditional rituals of a revered lost dynasty, but by utilitarian standards, such as whether they materially benefit society.

Their social background may also help to explain why Mohist consequentialism emphasizes material welfare and social order as basic goods that serve as standards of right. On the one hand, the Mohists were plain, down-to-earth craftsmen, tradesmen, and soldiers who could be expected to value practical utility. But more importantly, the Mohists speak for those on the lower rungs of the social ladder who will be among the first to starve when the economy is mismanaged or to die pursuing the military ambitions of a capricious ruler. A theme to which Mohist texts return repeatedly is the problem of meeting the basic subsistence needs of the common people.

Social factors could also have contributed to the Mohists’ opposition to costly, extravagant funeral rituals and musical entertainment. As members of lower social strata, the Mohists probably felt no strong attachment to these elements of the traditional Zhou high culture and would have been inclined to see them as wasteful and pointless. Also, the Mohists’ conception of Tian (Heaven) as an anthropomorphic deity and their conviction that Tian, ghosts, and spirits reliably punish the wicked and reward the good may reflect folk religious beliefs that were less influential on Confucian and Daoist thinkers from higher social echelons.

As Graham (1989) points out, however, despite the likely influence of the Mohists’ social background on their thought, there is no evidence that Mohism represents the ideology of a self-conscious craft or artisan class that sought to reform the established political order. Rather, the Mohists are ambitious, capable commoners for whom the passing of the old feudal system and the development of centralized, meritocratic bureaucracies have made promotion to the officer or knight (shi) class a possibility. Like most other early Chinese thinkers -- with the notable exception of Daoist anarchists -- the Mohists advocate a centralized, hierarchical political system directed by virtuous leaders, and they aspire to positions of responsibility within such a system. Hence their doctrine of "Elevating the Worthy" advocates promotion to office of anyone with ability, including farmers and artisans.


Copyright © 2002 by
Christopher Fraser
Chinese University of Hong Kong

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First published: October 21, 2002
Content last modified: October 21, 2002